Supplement to Coercion

Applications for theories of coercion

Theories of coercion can have significant implications in a number of different particular ranges of application, falling roughly into two categories: domestic and international. These categories may also be regarded as the sub-legal and super-legal uses of coercion. This section gives a brief discussion of the questions in these areas, and what these areas add to thought about coercion.

A. Domestic coercion

Questions of coercion arise in numerous different judicial contexts, including judgments of responsibility and/or culpability for torts and crimes. We may, for instance, want to know whether an illegal action has been performed voluntarily, or whether one has been coerced by another party into performing it. Many uses of coercion are also criminal, and so judgments about coercion may come into deciding whether, for instance, a rape (see, e.g., Anderson 2016, Ferzan 2018, Dougherty 2021, and Liberto 2021), extortion (see, e.g., Green 2005), or blackmailing (see, e.g., Berman 1998, Shaw 2012, and Galoob 2016) has occurred. Contracts, marriages, waivers of responsibility, and evaluations of varying sorts are considered void if made because of coercion. Confessions, “guilty” pleas, and testimony are to be discounted if given under coercion.

Outside of specifically judicial contexts, questions about coercion may arise, either with respect to shaping public policy, or for the sake of measuring social progress. For instance, we may want to know whether and under what circumstances workers are coerced into working, either in particular jobs, or in general. It may also be of interest to know whether sexual harassment in workplaces or schools is coercive, for purposes of justifying a legal response to it (see, e.g., Rocha 2011). Those who offer medical treatment or design medical and other human-subject-based experiments need to be able to determine whether their patients and/or subjects participate freely or under coercion (see, e.g., Wertheimer and Miller 2008; Prinsen and van Delden 2009; Millum and Garnett 2019; Pugh 2020, ch. 4). More generally, market economic transactions are thought to add to overall welfare (economic efficiency), but only if they are performed freely, which includes their not being coerced. The possibility of relying on ballots, survey data and other communications will also depend on whether such responses are given free from coercion.

These questions are raised almost exclusively in contexts where there is already in place a functioning legal authority possessing coercive enforcement powers. The existence of such an ordering force has a significant effect on the ability of other agents in society to use and to detect specific uses of coercion, as well as other, non-coercive means of getting people to do things. When a generalized mechanism for ensuring compliance with law is in place, other entities − legal, corporate, and informal − can establish rules governing the use of various sanctions, disabilities, and rewards, and expect these to have certain effects. (For helpful discussion here, see Lucas 1966, 61.) For instance, merchants and customers engage in commerce, exchanging goods, because they are prevented from simply taking those goods by force, fraud, theft, etc. Sometimes the interactions between agents in a sub-legal context will overstep the boundaries between the voluntary and coercive, and thus render the actions of one party non-voluntary. But all such judgments here are made within a background context of laws that govern quite generally how persons may behave towards one another. And the coercive enforcement of those laws makes possible meaningful distinctions between coerced and uncoerced activity in all of the other parts of social life governed by the rule of law.

B. International coercion

Compared to the domestic context, the international context is usually a much less clearly or justly ordered place. Although it is possible to identify and analyze uses of coercion here, there are difficulties in some of the main sorts of cases that both enrich and complicate thought about coercion. Several factors contribute to these difficulties, including the typically much greater power of the agents involved; the much weaker epistemic position they typically occupy vis-à-vis the motives, abilities, and intentions of other actors; the complexity and (sometimes) irrationality of the actors involved; and the lack of any central coercive authority to provide the basis for predictable, just, and enforceable rules for the conduct of such large, powerful agents. Given these difficulties, it can be hard to say much that is useful about international coercion. However a few specific topics are worth discussing briefly to show the issues that arise here.

B.1 Threats based in nuclear and other mass-casualty weapons (MCWs)

Although less prominent as a topic now than it was before the collapse of the Soviet Union, a large and useful philosophical literature has developed around the questions of the justice and efficacy of various strategies for avoiding both nuclear war as well as subjection to nuclear blackmail/extortion. The questions here are tremendously difficult to address sensibly, in part because the stakes of the policies and decisions at issue are so high and novel that they are almost beyond comprehension. Although nuclear threats appear superficially to be similar in structure to ordinary coercive threats, several facts set them apart. For one thing, the morality and rationality of such threats are significantly more complicated than in most ordinary cases of coercion. As Gregory Kavka puts it, there’s a “paradox of deterrence” which holds that it is potentially morally proper to threaten to use MCWs even though it is arguably immoral to actually use them for any reason (including in executing that threat) (Kavka 1978). This violates a plausible principle that holds that it is wrongful to intend to do what it would be wrongful to do (the “wrongful intentions principle”). Moreover, even though it may be morally proper to threaten such use, Kavka argues that no rational, morally motivated person could form the proper intention needed to make a credible threat of such use. Subsequent writers have argued over whether in fact these paradoxes hold as Kavka suggests. (See, e.g., Dworkin 1985; Wasserstrom 1985; Kroon 1996.) The moral issues in deterring nuclear war and the use of MCWs more generally are of central importance, and depend little if at all on our understanding the nature or ethics of coercion, per se (Hardin 1986). But, looking in the other direction, issues around deterrent threats involving MCWs do tell us some things about the nature of coercion.

There is a general and acknowledged difficulty in explaining how coercion by threat is possible: if the coercee defies the demand backed by the threat, it is typically irrational, because futile, for the coercer to go ahead and execute his threat. In some cases, this problem is solved by the fact that the coercer gains reputational benefits by executing the threat, or the coercer enjoys a sufficient advantage in power that executing the threat may be a relatively trivial matter for him. But coercion is a different and much more complicated matter when executing a threat is much more costly to the coercer than is the mere making of the threat. The threat of massive retaliation in response to a nuclear attack is a paradigmatic example of a kind of threat that would be irrational to execute after the associated demand is defied — if, for instance, one has already been the victim of one’s opponent’s first-strike. For this reason, the ability to make such a threat credibly requires more than a simple intention and ability to execute the threat, but rather a whole system that effectively removes decision from the process (by, say, building redundancy and automation into it). So, it would appear that nuclear deterrence cannot be an ordinary species of coercion, since the coercer cannot remain at liberty with respect to whether or not it will execute the threat. (For the difference this makes, see DeRose 1992.)

Nuclear deterrence thus pushes to the forefront consideration of two facts that recent philosophy of coercion tends to obscure: one, the deep connection between the credibility of one’s threats and the demonstrable ability and willingness to execute them; and two, the dynamic or strategic nature of coercive interactions. If execution of a threat would be irrational, then the coercer must use some technique to precommit to its execution, or else demonstrate irrationality (or something like it) so as to make the threat credible (see Schelling 1956). The dynamic aspect of coercion comes out in the fact that the rationality and morality of one actor’s choices depends on what the other actor (would) choose to do in response to them; and consequently the rationality/morality of the latter actor’s choices may depend on that of the former actor’s choices. While it is difficult to see through to a satisfactory account of such matters, it is important to keep these difficulties in mind in theorizing about how coercion works.

B.2 Terrorism

Terrorism is often associated with coercion, but of the reasons to doubt the justifiability of terrorism, its coerciveness is perhaps one of the lesser ones. Much more important is the fact that terrorism typically, though not always, targets innocents and non-combatants. So most philosophical effort on terrorism has gone towards arguing about whether such targeting of innocents is ever morally acceptable, and if so, under what conditions.

If thinking about the coerciveness of terrorism helps at all, it is perhaps by bringing out some ways in which terrorism differs from more standard forms of coercion, and why these differences may make it more problematic, rather than less. (For discussion of these matters, see Waldron 2004). Terrorism aims at affecting the psychological workings of one or more people (often, a large part of society), though not necessarily in the way that coercion by threat does. There are differences of the aim, means, and powers involved. The aim of terrorism is often less specific than the aim of coercion. While those who use terror tactics may have a specific policy change or end result in mind, sometimes the end is, at least initially, simply to create chaos, fear, and panic on the part of those terrorized. It may also be to provoke a retaliatory response, or to enact revenge on or to make a statement about the worth of one’s enemy. When terrorism is used instrumentally, with a change in action desired, terror tactics often differ from ordinary coercion in that those targeted by the harms or violence are typically distinct from those whose action the terror user hopes ultimately to influence. Terrorism works by generating a sort of psychological response among those who are targets or potential targets of the attacks, typically with the aim of putting pressure on their political leaders or representatives to quell the chaos or anxiety of the affected public. As for the power involved, terrorism might be a tactic of an agent who possesses overwhelming power, but frequently those who engage in terror tactics lack the sort of power that is needed to genuinely overpower the resistance of their target (in contrast to the way that police, say, can overpower the resistance of virtually any criminals they manage to arrest). If not for such weakness, they could simply impose their will on their targets instead of using terrorism.

In fact, the comparative weakness of some who use terror means that they frequently need to engage in repeated acts of violence in order to establish their credibility with respect to any subsequent demands and threats they might make. It is unlikely that a group will be able to gain acquiescence to its demands by threatening to use terror tactics if it has not already engaged in such activity. But while the use of terror often betrays a relative weakness, those who use it also often rely on stealth, geographic dispersion, and choices of soft targets, making their attacks both very difficult to prevent (at least in ways that are consistent with significant openness in one’s own society), as well as very difficult to retaliate against.

B.3 Coercion in international relations between rich and poor

Although relations between those with unequal economic power are often said to be coercive, this claim can be argued for more persuasively in some situations than in others. The claim may be accurate in referring to many interactions between agents from the richer, developed world and agents from the poorer, less developed world. But in addition to the fact of disparities in wealth, even if they are alterable, something further is required to show that these relations are indeed coercive. After all, many interactions between rich and poor have at least the veneer of being freely agreed upon economic exchanges. Sometimes, the coerciveness of these relationships resides not so much in the economic exchanges themselves as in the way these exchanges are premised on and supported by more traditional forms of coercion.

Thomas Pogge’s work can be mined for suggestions as to how we might recognize coercion in the relations between richer and poorer parts of the world. (See Pogge 2002, esp. chs. 4 and 8.) Three general suggestions emerge. First, Pogge holds that the historical uses of power, both economic and military, by developed nations, have given rise to a global institutional framework which imposes and enables the unjust exploitation of poorer peoples by the world’s more powerful actors. Here, we can look to paradigmatic types of coercion, such as war and invasion, coupled with economic leverage created by control over institutions such as the World Bank and International Monetary Fund, to see how this framework has been created and maintained. Colonialism and military interventionism, past and present, have continuing impacts on which countries have the power to dictate terms of trade and international relations to others. This “institutional order,” which is “implicated in the reproduction of radical inequality,” owes its existence to “the developed countries [who], thanks to their vastly superior military and economic strength, control these rules and therefore share responsibility for their foreseeable effects” (Pogge 2002, 199–200).

A second way coercion is active in creating global poverty and inequality is in the repressive means used by some autocrats to maintain power over their own poor subjects in underdeveloped countries. These autocrats benefit from the recognition of wealthier countries as the arbiters of what happens to the natural resources in the territories they govern. By suppressing the inhabitants of these territories and keeping them pliant, rulers are able to trade and sign agreements on their behalf with the governments and corporations of the rich nations. These transactions frequently denude poorer countries of valuable resources and dispossess people of their land and rights, while the autocrats rake in profits and commissions from these exchanges. They can then use this wealth to purchase the weapons and armies needed to maintain power. Richer countries and institutions play a crucial role in this process by both recognizing these rulers as legitimate bargaining authorities on behalf of their peoples, and also by seeking to enforce the bargains that these autocrats strike against subsequent governments and against the people themselves. As Pogge points out, when a multinational corporation buys the rights to something in one of these autocratically governed countries, “the purchaser acquires not merely possession, but all the rights and liberties of ownership which are … protected and enforced by all other states’ courts and police forces” (Pogge 2002, 113).

A third respect in which global poverty may be seen as coercive is by comparing the actual conditions of the world’s poorest residents to a minimal moral baseline needed to make acceptable any institution of coercively enforced property rights. According to this moral baseline, any institution is coercive if it leaves some destitute because of their uncompensated exclusion from the world’s natural resources. This follows, as Locke seems to suggest, from the fact that no one would rationally and voluntarily agree to a bargain such as that (Pogge 2002, 202). “[T]he affluent states are therefore violating a negative duty of justice when they, in collaboration with the ruling elites of the poor countries, coercively exclude the poor from a proportional resource share” (Pogge 2002, 203).

The interest in linking the persistence of global poverty to coercion is suggested in the preceding quotation. Pogge argues that such poverty is not merely a natural fact, but is something that the wealthier parties in the world, who reap rewards from their domination of the poorer parts of the world, have a negative duty to redress. That is, by showing that these arrangements are not just unfair but are unfairly and coercively imposed by one party against another, Pogge believes that a stronger case can be made for the richer countries and institutions to alter the institutional structure of global economic relations. These grounds even justify paying compensation to the worst off for their involuntary exclusion from the natural resources that underlie the prosperity of the rest of the world.

One can also point to the conditions in some countries where a decent life is unsustainable as presenting a form of coercion that may impact laws governing migration and refugees. Diana Tietjens Meyers argues that in countries where there are insufficient decent, life-sustaining work opportunities, the resulting poverty should be regarded as a form of coercion. She compares its impact on vital human interests to that of the techniques of authoritarian rulers who attack the livelihoods and property of their enemies to drive them into exile. “[I]f loss of your livelihood due to deliberate expropriation or deprivation of opportunity is coercive, lack of a livelihood due to [an economy with a large deficit of decent work] sustained by the global economic and geopolitical order may be coercive as well” (Meyers 2014, 79). Meyers proceeds from this conclusion to argue for an expansion to the definition of those who count as refugees in international law, and their entitlement to treatment as refugees by countries such as the U.S.

Just as Blake and Nagel argue that state coercive institutions generate obligations of distributive justice in the domestic context, Nicole Hassoun, Laura Valentini, and Amy Eckert trace out the implications of regarding international institutions and relations as coercive. Starting from the view that international institutions coerce those in poor countries subject to them, Hassoun argues the legitimacy of such institutions depends on whether those who are subject to their coercive intervention in poorer countries have the capacity to consent to them autonomously. She then uses this principle to ground an argument for the obligation of these institutions to ensure basic capabilities of those subject to their coercion, at least to the extent necessary to provide for their capacity to consent (Hassoun 2012 and 2015). The basic idea of her approach, she says, is that “subjects must be able to determine their actions and shape the nature of their relationship to those imposing coercive rules over them” (Hassoun 2015, 181). In this, Hassoun extends the kind of concerns motivating Nagel and Blake regarding the conditions for the legitimacy of state coercion (see section 3.4 above) to the international context. Similarly, Valentini argues that both what she calls “interactional coercion” and “systemic coercion” between the more powerful and less powerful regions of the globe require principles regulating interstate interference as well promoting global socioeconomic justice (Valentini 2011). Lastly, Eckert argues that even if we accept that obligations of distributive justice depend on the role of coercion among the parties, there are coercive institutions at the international level, such as the WTO, which act on states rather than individuals, thus grounding distributive obligations among those states (Eckert 2008). However, just as with the case of intrastate state coercion, a parallel response denies that coercion is relevant to the question of distributive justice at the international level. Kok Chor Tan, for instance, argues that any obligations arising from the coerciveness of such institutions and relations is simply redundant to already existing obligations to alleviate severe deprivation (Tan 2014).

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