Notes to Cognitive Disability and Moral Status

1. Perhaps the starkest illustration of this contrast is the “Animal Rule” of the U.S. Federal Drug Administration, which permits drug approval based on efficacy testing on animals rather than humans, “when human efficacy studies are not ethical or feasible” (21 CFR 314.600). Since animals studies have greater evidentiary value for humans the greater the relevant similarities between the animals studied and human beings, this rule effectively makes those similarities—including cognitive ones—a basis for exposing nonhuman animals to, rather than protecting them from, harmful research (Walker and King 2011).

2. We take the term “radical” from Jeff McMahan (2009), to avoid the use of terms such as “severe” and “profound”, which derive from psychometric classification. We do not, however, use McMahan’s label, “radical cognitive limitation,” to refer to “human beings whose overall psychological capacities or potential are comparable to or lower than those characteristic of the higher orders of nonhuman animals… .” (240). As McMahan acknowledges, the appropriateness and intelligibility of the comparison are disputed by some philosophers and disability scholars, and we do not want to adopt a tendentious label when one of our objectives is to assess that very claim. In some contexts, we will use the term “impairment” rather than “disability” in recognition of a generation of disability scholarship emphasizing the role of the social environment in making both physical and mental disabilities disabling (see the entry on disability: definitions, models, experience).

3. Another approach, suggested by Hugh McLachlan (2016), would deny that there is any single attribute necessary for full moral status. Drawing on Wittgenstein’s (1958) notion of “family resemblances,” this approach would claim that individuals with full moral status are linked by overlapping shared attributes, but that no single (non-disjunctive) property is shared by all and only individuals with full moral status. While this approach offers an attractive flexibility to the determination of full moral status, it raises difficult questions about what resemblances suffice for family membership and why they do. It also leaves open the possibility that some or many humans will lack sufficient resemblances of any kind.

4. In outlining individually-based accounts of full moral status, we will focus on single-attribute accounts. Multi-attribute accounts like Warren’s (1997) are potentially more inclusive in recognizing more than one sufficient condition for moral status. But, as several of Warren’s critics have argued (Gunnarsson 2008; Hacker-Wright 2007), to treat an additional attribute, biological humanity, as a sufficient condition along with self-consciousness and practical agency, may just reframe the central question: why should human beings have moral status just by virtue of their species-membership, while non-humans must possess specific mental or moral attributes?

5. DeGrazia (2008), however, argues that an account of moral status based on cognitive and other psychological attributes can accommodate degrees as readily as an account based on interests.

6. If, per Kain(2009), Kant himself held that all human beings had full moral status, this suggests either that he was overly generous in his attribution of the capacity for autonomy or that he grounded moral status differently. In contrast to most contemporary Kantian accounts, then, Kant may not have understood moral status as fully symmetrical, in the sense of imposing reciprocal obligations.

7. Kant himself could be regarded as establishing a criterion for membership in a moral community: the “kingdom of ends.” But that criterion—the possession of a rational will – does not appear to be based on, or justified in terms of, the requirements for establishing interpersonal relationships or living in a community of moral equals (although the content of the categorical imperative may be understood in terms of the latter)—even if its satisfaction enables us to establish such relationships or communities.

8. Similarly, Russell DiSilvestro (2010) argues that all human beings have the “second-order capacity”—the capacity to acquire the capacity—for the cognitive capacities that ground full moral status. Even the most radically impaired human beings have that capacity if some future technology could endow them with the relevant first-order capacity. In contrast, most non-human animals lack that capacity, since the application of such future technology would alter their identity—the beings that acquired the capacity to think would not be them. This position rests on the claim that natural-kind membership is a condition of identity—a claim that may be no less controversial than the claim about second-order capacity it is offered to support.

9. The alignment of individual/group accounts and thin/thick concepts is only partial. Not only do some group-based accounts rely on the “thin” biological concept of species members, but some intrinsic attributes, like Kant’s “good will,” are regarded as inherently moral.

10. One critic of individually-based accounts does not fit into either group of alternative accounts. Edwards (1997) questions the individualism of individually-based accounts rather than their focus on specific attributes. He argues that individualism about selves promotes an excessive emphasis on independence, denigrating the moral status of individuals with a wide range of disabilities.

11. Moreover, as Christopher Grau (2015) observes, McMahan himself recognizes that such reference groups as classmates or colleagues may be relevant to judgments of misfortune. It is not clear why all human beings should not comprise another relevant reference class. Even if they are, however, the question remains of why those unfortunate in falling below species norms for morally relevant attributes should enjoy the moral status associated with those attributes (see 4.1, 5.2).

12. Such kinship might be attenuated by exo-gestation, especially if it was combined with genetic engineering and mass production. But those prospects raise the question of what is required to be human, which is beyond the scope of this entry.

13. A similar view, relying on human connections broader than personal relationships, has been proposed by Eva Kittay (2005), who argues that moral status arises from a social matrix, understood in the following terms:

By a social relationship, I mean a place in a matrix of relationships embedded in social practices through which the relations acquire meanings. It is by virtue of the meanings that relationships acquire in social practices that duties are delineated, ways we enter and exit relationships are determined, emotional responses are deemed attractive, and so forth. A social relationship in this sense need not be dependant on ongoing interpersonal relationships between conscious individuals. (111)

On this approach, it is not the mere biological fact of species membership that obliges third-parties to treat the severely-disabled children and siblings of other human beings with respect. Those third-parties are caught up in the same matrix of social relationships, which also determines their duties to others. Kittay does not explain, however, how such a matrix is bounded, or how it gives rise to specific duties.

14. Although some humanists may assume that humanity is coextensive with membership in Homo sapiens, that assumption is not necessary to their position. Contrary to Julian Savulescu (2009), they would not regard it as a tragedy if it were found that half the human population “is not carbon based but silicon based, even though they look, behave, and experience the same.” For most humanists, that discovery would merely confirm that “humanity” was not a strictly biological concept, but a linguistic or cultural one, based in part on affinities in appearance, behavior, and experience. The concept of humanity, and the classification of an individual as human, can only be understood in terms of a network of social practices or “forms of life.” Even if it did turn out that being a Homo sapiens was necessary and sufficient for being a human being, the moral status of human beings would not be grounded in their biology.

Copyright © 2017 by
David Wasserman <>
Adrienne Asch
Jeffrey Blustein <>
Daniel Putnam <>

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