Supplement to Color

Color Science – Some Complexities

In this section, we will take note of some introductory points about color science. At the end of the section, there are some references that should be of help to the student of color.

In 1988, C.L. Hardin published a book that was a landmark in the philosophy of color. The book was entitled Color for Philosophers, and was significant in bringing to the attention of philosophers the enormous amount of progress that has been made in color science, particularly in the realm of color vision. Until then, many philosophers writing on color, had made do with a small number of well-worn examples. Since then, the philosophy of color has, in general, been much more well-informed. Hardin’s book, upgraded in 1993, is still a good introduction to the subject, but more recently, Hardin has published another article, “More Color Science for Philosophers” (2014), that describes considerable progress that has been made since (and the difficulties that remain).

Color science is a flourishing field of science, with a long history that goes back to Newton (and Descartes and Boyle), and includes such famous figures as Young, Maxwell, Helmholtz, and Hering. While there has been widespread doubt about the existence of color as a physical reality, this has not stopped the growth of an enormous amount of research into color: into the mechanisms underlying color vision, into ways of specifying the ways colors appear, and into constructing systems to order colors. While much of this research has been directed at human color vision, there has been a growing amount addressing animal color vision. In other words, no one doubts that there is such a thing as color vision.

One line of research focuses on the chemistry and physics of color. This includes the study of how the material properties of physical bodies alter the composition of the light they transmit or reflect or emit or scatter, and of the character, and composition, of the light involved. These causes, as Nassau points out, are many and varied. He refers to an “informal classification [that] … has some 14 category of causes” (Nassau 1983: 3). Much of the research in color science, however, is devoted, directly or indirectly, to color perception, and to studying the complex physiological and neurological mechanisms underlying color vision.

One important area of study has to deal with the construction of color spaces, which are spaces for ordering the colors systematically. There are different spaces constructed for different purposes (see Kuehni 2003, 2010). One type of color space is dealt with in the field of colorimetry, which is a branch of color science concerned with “measuring” color, which means specifying numerically the color of visual stimulus (either a light or an object). We do this, in the simplest case, by specifying the mixture of three reference lights that match the stimulus (i.e., appear the same), under specific viewing conditions, and illumination.

Central types of color space are psychological color systems, i.e., of ways of ordering, in a systematic fashion, the range of colors—colors as perceived—in a three-dimensional coordinate system, within which each possible perceived color can be represented as a single point with a unique position. It is important to note that there are different systems that have been constructed. For one thing, different dimensions are used, depending on the way in which color appears. Colors as properties of surfaces, in general, have a different mode of appearance from colors as properties of volumes such as wine, and yet again from that for film color or aperture color (the color of an object or light source viewed through an aperture in a reduction screen). These different modes of appearance suit different dimensions of color. For aperture or film colors, and light sources, the dimensions are hue, saturation and brightness; for surfaces, the dimensions are hue, chroma and value (lightness)—Munsell—and hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness—Swedish Natural Color System (NCS).

A wide range of psychological phenomena related to color perception has been studied. Many concern the conditions of perception, e.g., the field in which color-constancy, simultaneous contrast, the effects of various backgrounds on color perceptions, and so on, are examined, and competing explanations debated. One striking phenomenon is the existence of certain surface colors—contrast colors—. Contrast colors are colors whose appearance depends essentially on contrast effects. They include many of the common everyday colors: brown, olive, pure white, pure black (for discussion, see Cohen 2009: 23). Another important discovery has been the extent of the variation there is, among normal color perceivers, in the perception of specific shades of color. Some reference should also be made to the growing literature on color constancy, a topic which, for many of us, is very puzzling. For an excellent recent survey, see W. Wright, 2013. See also Matthen 2010 and D.H. Brown 2014.

One of the most vigorous areas of research, especially more recently, is the study of color vision, i.e., of the mechanisms involved in the perception of color. Helmholtz and Hering were pioneers in the physiology of this area, the former contributing to the Trichromatic theory, and the latter to the development of the Opponent Process Theory. Originally these theories were seen as rivals, but much of the research in the second part of the twentieth century has pointed to them explaining complementary parts of the visual processes.

According to the Trichromatic theory, there are in the retinas of the eyes (for normal perceivers) three types of cones, which contain different visual pigments, maximally sensitive, respectively, to different wavelength of light: long, medium and short. The cones are commonly referred to as the L, M and S cones, respectively. The stimulation of these pigments does not correspond in any simple way to the experiences of color. The Opponent-Process theory postulates computational mechanisms in the visual system to explain how the outputs of these cones lead to the experiences. According to this theory, the outputs of the three cone-types are transformed into two opponent chromatic signals and one non-opponent achromatic signal. It is thought that there are pairs of opponent information channels, where the activity in one channel inhibits activity in an opponent channel. The pairs of channels are supposed to be linked to “red/green responses”, and to “blue/yellow responses” respectively. Letting the cone outputs for the long, medium and short wave cones be L, M and S, the red-green signal is \(L - M\), the yellow-blue signal is (\(L + M) -S\), and the achromatic signal is \(L + M\). Concentrating on the two chromatic signals, if \(L - M > 0\) then the red-green signal produces a “red response”, and a “green response”, if \(L - M < 0\). Similarly, the yellow-blue signal produces a “yellow response”, if \((L + M) - S > 0\), and a “blue response” if \((L + M) - S < 0\). With such a theory, we seem to have a natural explanation for how we have say experiences of unique red, unique green, unique blue, unique yellow. (To have the color of unique red is to have a color that has no blue or yellow component.) It also explains why we have experiences of bluish-reds, and yellowish-reds, but not greenish-reds.

It should be borne in mind that the theory described above has the status of a simplified model. Finding solid neurophysiological evidence confirming the theory is proving difficult. For accounts of the complexities, see Abramov 1997 and MacLeod 2010. Some experimental data go against the model. As Hardin points out, certain color-blind dichromats, with only two functioning cones, and supposedly bereft of experiences of red and green, nevertheless seem to have some such experiences (Hardin 2008: 145–146; for an even more dissenting view, see Jameson 2010).

One of the areas of vision science that is of particular current interest is that concerned, broadly, with what might be termed the function of color vision. There are a number of authors that bring out the philosophical implications of this research, e.g., Akins & Hahn 2014, Chirimuuta & Kingdom 2015. They argue that both the philosophy of color and much recent vision science have been guided by certain simplistic views about the function of color vision. They also bring out well the extent to which much recent work in color vision is controversial. Akins and Hahn ask the question: What is the function of human color vision? To this they reply:

For most vision researchers, both philosophers and scientists, the answer is obvious, nay, a tautology: colour vision is for seeing the colours, whether or not colour is genuine property of the external world. (Akins & Hahn 2014: 126)

In their article, they want to deny the assumption that human cortical color vision is “for” seeing the colors. Instead, our “color” system is better understood as two chromatic contrast systems, each of which encodes additional information about the retinal image and which, individually, increase our capacity for wavelength discrimination. (See Mausfeld 2010, for even more trenchant criticism of orthodox approaches.)

Further Reading

For an introductory accessible overview of color vision, the reader is referred to Palmer 1999, chapter 3. For a more philosophically-oriented work, see Hardin 1988, 2014; Byrne & Hilbert 1997b; Cohen & Matthen 2010. The articles by Chirimuuta & Kingdom (2015) and Akins & Hahn (2014), have copious references to recent research in vision science.

Copyright © 2018 by
Barry Maund <>

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