Supplement to Common Knowledge

Rubinstein’s Proof

[Note: See Definition 3.2 for the notation used in this proof.]

Let \(T_2\) denote the number of messages that Joanna’s e-mail system sends, and \(T_1\) denote the number of messages that Lizzi’s e-mail system sends. We might suppose that \(T_i\) appears on each agent’s computer screen. If \(T_1 = 0\), then Lizzi sends no message, that is, \(\omega_1\) has occurred, in which case Lizzi’s unique best response is to choose \(A\). If \(T_2 = 0\), then Joanna did not receive a message. She knows that in this case, either \(\omega_1\) has occurred and Lizzi did not send her a message, which occurs with probability .51, or \(\omega_2\) has occurred and Lizzi sent her a message which did not arrive, which occurs with probability \(.49\varepsilon\). If \(\omega_1\) has occurred, then Lizzi is sure to choose \(A\), so Joanna knows that whatever Lizzi might do at \(\omega_2\),

\[\begin{align} E(u_2 (A) \mid T_2 =0) &\ge \frac{2(.51) + 0(.49)\varepsilon}{.51 + .49\varepsilon} \\ &\gt \frac{-4(.51) + 2(.49)\varepsilon}{.51 + .49\varepsilon} \\ &\ge E(u_2(B) \mid T_2 =0) \end{align}\]

so Joanna is strictly better off choosing A no matter what Lizzi does at either state of the world.

Suppose next that for all \(T_i \lt t\), each agents’ unique best response given her expectations regarding the other agent is \(A\), so that the unique Nash equilibrium of the game is \((A,A)\). Assume that \(T_1 = t\). Lizzi is uncertain whether \(T_2 = t\), which is the case if Joanna received Lizzi’s \(t\)th automatic confirmation and Joanna’s \(t\)th confirmation was lost, or if \(T_2 = t - 1\), which is the case if Lizzi’s \(t\)th confirmation was lost. Then

\[\begin{align} \mu_1 (T_2 = t-1 \mid T_1 = t) &= z \\ &= \frac{\varepsilon}{\varepsilon + (1-\varepsilon)\varepsilon} \\ &\gt \frac{1}{2}. \end{align}\]

Thus[1] it is more likely that Lizzi’s last confirmation did not arrive than that Joanna did receive this message. By the inductive assumption, Lizzi assesses that Joanna will choose \(A\) if \(T_2 = t-1\). So

\[\begin{align} E(u_1 (B) \mid T_1 = t) &\le -4z + 2(1-z) \\ &= -6z + 2 \\ &\lt -3 + 2 \\ &= -1, \end{align}\]


\[ E(u_1 (A) \mid T_1 = t) = 0 \]

since Lizzi knows that \(\omega_2\) is the case. So Lizzi’s unique best action is \(A\). Similarly, one can show that \(A\) is Joanna’s best reply if \(T_2 = t\). So by induction, \((A,A)\) is the unique Nash equilibrium of the game for every \(t \ge 0\).

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