Notes to Compositionality

1. There are some authors who call the following weaker thesis the principle of compositionality: The meaning of a complex expression is determined by the meaning of its structure and the meanings of its constituents. For example, Davis (2003) claims that the ambiguity of ‘aardvark lover’—it can mean either ‘someone who loves aardvarks’ or ‘aardvark that is a lover’ is neither lexical nor structural, but due to two different conventions associated with the single structure NV-er. (For an alternative take on ‘aardvark lover’ that complies with (C), see Szabó 2008.) Since it is not clear that structure itself is the sort of thing that can represent (and hence can have meaning) I assume that compositionality should be interpreted as (C). The difference becomes important if proponents of the weaker principle also allow that syntactic rules may have context-dependent meanings. Here is an illustration. For the sake of argument assume that meaning is truth-conditional content, that ‘every man’ has a single syntactic structure, that ‘every’ and ‘man’ each have a single determinate truth-conditional content, and that the truth-conditional content of ‘every man’ includes some contextual restriction on the domain of quantification. Given (C), we have a violation of compositionality; cf. Stanley and Szabó (2000). Pelletier (2003) claims that the four assumptions are compatible with compositionality because the syntactic rule which combines the quantifier and the noun may be associated with a context-sensitive semantic rule. Pelletier is right only if we assume the weaker construal of compositionality. For a precise formulation of the weaker compositionality principle, see Pagin and Pelletier (2007). In section 1.3 I will introduce a weaker compositionality principle, (C\(_{\textit{coll}}\)), that is a generalization of the weak principle.

2. Here are a few hard questions we may not be able to settle right away. Would all the chatty words that appear on many US traffic signs but not on their European equivalents count as constituents? Is the size of the traffic sign a constituent? (Note that the minimum size of the No-Left-Turn sign in the US is \(24\times 24\) inches.) What exactly does it mean to compose a shape and a color pattern? What should we say about the fact that the meaning of one traffic sign can supplement the meaning of another? In spelling out the meanings of traffic signs should we include indexicals—e.g., ‘No left turn here’? Should we include the understood restrictions—e.g., ‘If you are driving a vehicle, make no left turn here’?

3. I think the answer is negative. Consider the following minimal pair:

[road sign: a red circle with an upper left to lower right diagonal over a black arrow that goes up and then to the left; background is a white square] [road sign: a black arrow that goes up and then to the left; background is a yellow diamond]

The meaning of the first is something like ‘No left turn!’; the meaning of the second is roughly ‘Left turn; recommended speed 30mph or less’. (If you didn’t know that the second sign means this you can check the Manual of Traffic Signs.) Since on the basis of a large number of other signs we can be fairly sure that the shape and color pattern of these two signs indicates nothing beyond the fact that the first is a regulatory sign prohibiting something and the second is a warning sign recommending something, there is a problem for compositionality here. Whatever we take the contribution of the left arrow to be, it is hard to accept that the meanings of both these traffic signs are determined compositionally. (As always, there are all sorts of maneuvers that could save compositionality. They involve fiddling with what the meaningful constituents of these signs might be or with what exactly they might mean. I conjecture that all these moves would burden the syntax and/or the semantics of traffic signs with implausible features.) [Sign images are from the Manual of Traffic Signs, by Richard C. Moeur.]

4. This is not a substantive claim as long as we keep in mind the difference between linguistic understanding and utterance understanding. The claim that understanding an utterance amounts to nothing more than understanding the meaning of the expression uttered (perhaps relative to the context of utterance) is not only substantive but also false. (You cannot understand an ironical remark without recognizing the irony, but this is not required for understanding the expression uttered.)

5. On any conception of reference, a sentence like ‘He is asleep’ refers only relative to a context of utterance. Thus, (C\(_{\textit{ref}}\)) must be relativized to, if L contains such a sentence.

6. More precisely, into one that is compositional given the usual weak understanding of determination in (C). See section 1.4. for more detail about this matter.

7. The original meaning is uniformly recoverable in principle. There is no constraint here on how complex a calculation might be required to determine the value \(\mu(s)(s)\).

8. This assumes at least some level of autonomy for syntax. But it is overwhelmingly plausible that even if syntax is not fully independent of semantics, we cannot explain all syntactic regularities semantically.

9. Thus the proposal is that compositionality is a contingent linguistic universal. It has the same status as the syntactic hypothesis that in natural languages all branching in a phrase structure tree is binary or the semantic hypothesis that in natural languages all quantificational determiners are conservative. If true, such empirical hypotheses call out for deeper explanations.

10. As stated, (C\(_{\textit{occ}}\)) is oversimplified: it evaluates each constituent of a complex expression within the same context. A more adequate formulation would allow for context-shift within larger expressions. To formulate such a principle adequately one must take a stand on what contexts are—a question I am bypassing here.

11. Recanati (2012) distinguishes between the content and the occasion meaning of an expression. The former is supposed to be derived from the standing meaning via a mandatory process he calls saturation, while the latter is supposed to be arrived at employing the full array of contextual processes, including optional modulation as well. (For the distinction between saturation and modulation, see Recanati 2004.) He also suggests that the content of complex expressions is not compositionally determined, although it is determined by its structure and the occasion meanings of its constituents.

12. Higginbotham (1985, 2007) argues that questions of grammaticality must be kept separate from questions of meaningfulness. If so, we might say that despite its ungrammaticality ‘John is probable to leave’ means (roughly) the same as ‘John is likely to leave’.

13.The translation in the standard English edition is misleading; the translation here is mine.

14. The second restriction is debatable. I tend to think that ‘Vanda ordered a palacsinta’ is a meaningful sentence even though ‘ordered’ is not a word of Hungarian and ‘palacsinta’ is not a word of English, and consequently, the sentence is neither in English nor in Hungarian. The reason I think this sentence is meaningful is that any bi-lingual speaker of English and Hungarian would know what it means—the same as the English sentence ‘Vanda ordered a crêpe’ or the Hungarian sentence ‘Vanda egy palacsintát rendelt’.

15. It is a bit hard to define in full generality what it is for an expression to be a constituent of another. (This problem does not arise if we require the syntactic algebra to be a term algebra.) Let us say that \(e\) is a 1-constituent of \(e'\) just in case it is in the domain of some syntactic operation whose value is \(e'\). Let us say that \(e\) is an \(n+1\)-constituent of \(e'\) just in case it is in the domain of some syntactic operation whose value is an \(n\)-constituent of \(e'\). Finally, let us say that \(e\) is a constituent of \(e'\) just in case there is a natural number \(n\) such that \(e\) is an \(n\)-constituent of \(e'.\) Assuming that every expression can be generated from simple ones through a finite number of applications of the syntactic operations, this will do. \((e\) is simple iff it is not the value of any syntactic operation.) For an alternative abstract characterization of constituency, see Hodges (2012: 251–2).

16. Note that Frege’s conclusion appears to be the building principle. Whether Frege believed in compositionality is a matter of much debate among scholars. One problem is that in the published writings we find appeals to a substitutivity principle about reference, but no analogous principle about sense. Another problem is that in the Grundlagen (1884) Frege announces his famous context principle, which on certain interpretations contradicts certain interpretations of compositionality; cf. section 1.6.4 above. Finally, it is not even clear whether Fregean senses can be properly construed as linguistic meanings. For more on Frege and compositionality, see Janssen (2001) and Pelletier (2001). They also provide good bibliographies.

17. An example from Platts (1979): ‘The horse behind Pegasus is bald’, ‘The horse behind the horse behind Pegasus is bald’, ‘The horse behind the horse behind the horse behind Pegasus is bald’, …. Martin (1994: 7) appeals to numerals in trying to illustrate the same point. This I find less convincing. One can indeed say that English contains the sentences ‘I have one kumquat’, ‘I have two kumquats’, ‘I have three kumquats’, … but I don’t think we could continue this series ad infinitum without recourse to elaborate mathematical notation. And the mathematical notion is arguably not part of English.

18. The Algebraic notation is the standard system for describing chess games. Its essentials go back to the Arabs of the 9th century. The example and the discussion is a slightly modified version of Szabó 2000a: 77–78.

19. The core idea is from Lewis (1975)—sometimes subordinate clauses restrict the domain of quantifiers. This idea has been generalized in Kratzer 1986.

20. Cf. For some of the main moves in the debate see Barker (1997), von Fintel (1998), Higginbotham (2003), von Fintel and Iatridou (2002 in Other Internet Resources), and Guerts (2004, also in Other Internet Resources).

21. Cf. Szabó 2000c. To defend compositionality along these lines it is by no means necessary to postulate a variable in the logical form of the sentence; cf. Szabó 2010

22. The explanation may follow the path of Salmon (1986). For a more recent proposal, see Båve (2008).

23. For example, one could take the clausal complement of ‘believes’ to be an interpreted logical form—something which includes phonological information about the words employed in the clause; cf. Higginbotham (1986), Segal (1989), Larson and Ludlow (1993). Such theories violate compositionality because they maintain that the semantic value of a that-clause includes phonological information even though the semantic values of their constituents and their mode of combination do not. The fact that simple recursive semantic theories can violate compositionality should raise extra concerns about the strength of arguments from productivity and systematicity.

Copyright © 2017 by
Zoltán Gendler Szabó <>

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