Notes to The Concept of Religion

1. This is a list of the “world” religions represented at the World Columbian Exhibition in Chicago in 1893. Like the concept religion, the idea that some religions constitute a subcategory of “world” religions is today heavily criticized (e.g., Masuzawa 2005).

2. Herbert’s view that monotheism was culturally universal was not idiosyncratic. Martin Luther, for example, held that there is “universal knowledge of God among all the heathen, that is, that the whole world talks about the Godhead”, treating this as the plain sense of Romans 1:19 (Luther 1526 [1973: 53]).

3. The fourth part of Geertz’s definition, in his own words, asks metaphorically how it is that a religion “clothes its conceptions with an aura of factuality”. In the extended discussion, he answers that

it is in ritual—that is, consecrated behavior—that this conviction that religious conceptions are veridical and that religious directives are sound is somehow generated. (1973: 112)

A great portion of Geertz’s essay discusses public ritual (1973: 112–3) and cultural performance (1973: 113–8), but it may be that failing to put those terms in the definition itself contributed to Asad’s influential but inaccurate claim that Geertz, like Tylor, adopts a conception of religion as simply a matter of private belief (Asad 1993: ch. 1; cf. Lincoln 2006: 1; Vásquez 2011, 221).

4. Lincoln calls his definition “polythetic” (2006: 5), but since any form of life that is a religion will have all four of these elements, this is not a polythetic definition in the usual sense. In other words, an approach that is “multifactorial” may still be monothetic, if the multiple factors are all required.

5. Peter Berger (1974) influentially but incorrectly reads Geertz’s definition as lacking a substantive element. For more on “mixed” (Saler 1993: 80) or double-sided monothetic definitions, see Schilbrack (2013).

6. The burgeoning field of cognitive science of religion has largely assumed a monothetic definition that is Cartesian (focusing on religious ideas or “representations”) and Tylorean (using “invisible”, “superhuman”, or “counterintuitive” beings as the delimiting feature). Armin Geertz (2016) provides an overview and, like Ann Taves (2009), a dissent, proposing a much richer, “holistic” definition of religion as a package of cognitive, affective, and conative elements that can be disassembled and studied for their separate contributions to social behavior.

7. Kant defines religion as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands” (AA VI: 153, 1793 [1934: 142]). Note that William James is not in the Kantian cohort, and he regretted that titling his most famous work The Will to Believe (1912 [1979]) suggested that he was.

8. Spiro’s discussion is nuanced: he argues that Theravada Buddhism is not a religion but Theravada Buddhists are religious since they typically do interact with culturally postulated superhuman beings that are not taught as part of canonical Buddhism (1966: 93–4). Spiro explicitly rejects Tillich’s and Durkheim’s functionalist criteria of “ultimate concern” and experience of “the sacred” (1966: 95–6).

9. “Polythetic” classifications were developed among biologists and “family resemblance” classifications by philosophers, but this entry follows Saler (1993: 170) in treating these two vocabularies as convergent. A polythetic approach to classification explains the generation of prototypes studied by psychologists and so, with Ferro-Luzzi (1989), one could also call this a “polythetic-prototype approach”.

10. If one of the religion-making characteristics is that the form of life is a discrete community, not identical with membership in the society as a whole, this would explain why Christianity, Islam, and Buddhism are today considered prototypical religions and “the religion of Java” or “ancient Roman religion” are not. The latter would be clearly religions, though they would lack a feature that contemporary English speakers prototypically associate with the concept.

11. It is worth noting that that Wittgenstein does not argue that the various referents of a polythetic concept have no common feature; they may. He argues, rather, that they do not have a common feature that alone justifies the use of the term, “that makes us use the same word for all” (PI §65). Thus, even if each thing that is called a religion shares the feature of “being a set of social practices” or even “being a set of social practices related to what people deem sacred”, this common feature may not have determined why they were added to the category.

12. Alston’s properties set consists of belief in supernatural beings; a distinction between sacred and profane objects; ritual acts; a moral code; religious feelings; prayer or other forms of communication with the gods; a world view; an organization of life based on the world view; and a social group bound together by the above (1967: 141–2). Alston also suggests that qualifying as a religion depends not only on the number of characteristics possessed, but also on the degree to which those characteristics are possessed (in the case of degreed characteristics). Therefore, something that possesses three characteristics to a high degree might qualify as a religion, while something that possesses four characteristics to a low degree might not.

13. This entry has deliberately focused on “approaches” rather than definitions, because, as Wittgenstein shows, concepts can be intelligible and useful even when one cannot define them. Mikel Burley puts this point well:

By expounding the notion of there being family resemblances between the various uses of a word or concept, Wittgenstein invites us to free ourselves from the grip of the assumption that a necessary condition of the meaningfulness of terms such as “religion” and “religious” is that there must be something common to all instances of the phenomena to which the terms are applied. So too are we thereby freed from the demand, whether explicit or implicit, that we “must define our terms” before we can engage in any fruitful dialogue about religious beliefs and practices. (2019: 46)

14. Monothetic approaches propose necessary and sufficient conditions for attribution of a concept, and so they are typically associated with ahistorical essences and clear boundaries. It is possible, however, that one might recognize that necessary and sufficient conditions have fuzzy boundaries, and that they shift over time. For these reasons, one need not abandon a monothetic approach to include borderline cases or historical change.

15. The original bounded polythetic approach led to one prototypical kind, five “clear” kinds, and ten “borderline” kinds. The anchored polythetic approach would also recognize one prototypical kind, but only four “clear” and six “borderline” kinds.

16. Though religion has been used to sort cultures by their resemblance to Christian forms of life, there are Christians today who want to avoid putting their practices in the same category with others and who therefore deny that Christianity is a religion. William James comments on the resistance people often feel to being described with generic concepts (1902 [1985: 51]).

17. For example, J. Z. Smith says that the conquistadors were wrong to think that the indigenous people of the Andes had no religion (1998: 269). He also speaks of the “discovery” of religion in Africa, Australia, and elsewhere. “The impact of this discovery is hard to overestimate” (quoted in Lehrich 2021: 95).

18. In his original critique of religion, Asad explicitly rejects nominalism (1993: 15) and he has since protested against nonrealist interpretations of his work (see Asad 2001, Asad & Martin 2014).

19. This label is misleading if it implies that the reflexive study of the concept implies non-realism. Presumably, the critical study of religion will include both a critical non-realism and a critical realism.

20. Claims like these are now extremely common:

one dramatic result of the “discovery” of the New World was the invention of “religion” (Lehrich 2021: 146)


Religion as a description of human behavior was created through colonialism and its governments, its sciences, and its theologies. (Lofton 2012: 384)

Harrison claims that the first use of religion as a genus is in the Renaissance (1990: 14).

21. Nongbri also notes that the first use of religio in a classification system with the singular forms indicating a genus and the plural forms indicating various species was in antiquity (2013: 45). Several other pre-modern examples of religio used as a genus are offered in Riesebrodt 2007 [2010] and Casadio 2016.

Copyright © 2022 by
Kevin Schilbrack <>

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