Notes to Étienne Bonnot de Condillac

1. Condillac’s argument for the immateriality of the soul is a version of an argument that Kant dubbed “the Achilles of all rationalist inferences in the pure doctrine of the soul.” Versions can be found in the works of a number of other early modern philosophers, including Mendelssohn and Bayle, and it was often invoked by those attacking Locke’s notorious suggestion that God could have endowed matter with the capacity of thought. As Condillac presented it, the argument proceeds by establishing that thought could not be attributed to an extended being, and so must be the property of an unextended and hence immaterial substance. To establish this point Condillac observed that any extended being is composed of parts that exist outside of one another and that therefore can be separated from one another. Consequently, any extended substance is actually a composite of many independently existing substances. Were thought attributed to such a being, it would either have to be attributed to these substances individually (in which case each substance would have its own copy of the thought) or collectively (in which case the one thought would be divided up among the substances). But neither option is elligible. Condillac did not bother to give an explicit reason for rejecting the first. Presumably he supposed that it is too extravagant, insofar as it needlessly multiplies the number of substances that are supposed to have the thought, and that it conceeds the case, insofar as it allows that thought can only occur in an indivisible substance. He did, however, give explicit reasons for rejecting the second possibility: Thoughts may themselves be taken to be either simple or compound. Simple thoughts can, ipso facto not be divided into parts and so cannot be parceled out among a number of substances. Compound thoughts can be divided into their simple components, but were these components parceled out to a number of substances, each substance would only know the component alotted to it, and none would know the whole that they add up to. The fact that we do know the whole of a compound thought thus suggests that this thought is grasped by something that is itself simple and indivisible, and hence immaterial.

This argument was subjected to devastating criticism by Hume in Book I, Part iv, Section 5 of his Treatise, and Condillac’s ignorance of Hume’s objections (which were so serious and so directly opposed to Condillac’s argument that he could hardly have ignored them had he been aware of their existence) strongly suggests that he had no knowledge of Hume’s Treatise.

For Condillac’s views on the immateriality of the soul, see Section 9 below.

2. The one positive suggestion Condillac had to make about how the mind might acquire information about distance outwards was undeveloped and offered only incidentally, in the process of replying to an objection. He suggested that we might acquire information about distance outwards from the number of intervening objects lying along the ground between ourselves and a distant object (Essay §10). This is hardly a satisfactory alternative. Either it begs the question, by presupposing that the intervening objects are seen one behind the other (as opposed to one above the other), or it gives up the point, by allowing that we do not immediately see depth but instead infer it from features of what is actually only a two-dimensional display, in which objects along the ground are seen at increasingly smaller distances below the horizon, and so only as above and below one another.

Copyright © 2017 by
Lorne Falkenstein
Giovanni Grandi <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free