Supplement to Consciousness and Intentionality

Arguments for Intentionalism

What is supposed to justify intentionalism? Without attempting to reconstruct arguments in detail, it would be useful to convey a rough sense of the types of considerations recently offered in its support. Intentionalism about the phenomenal character of sensory experience is touted partly for its lack of the alleged disadvantages of alternatives—sense-data theories, adverbialism, and naïve realist views. But if we want more positive reasons, one place to look is in the case Tye (2002) makes by appeal to the “transparency” of consciousness or experience (Harman 1990 makes a similar argument). Roughly the claim is that we find, in reflection, that any effort to withdraw attention (or awareness) from external objects and qualities seen (e.g., the colors in a tapestry), and turn it “inward”, just on the visual experience we are having, is doomed to frustration. We find attention (or awareness) inevitably going through the experience to the external qualities and objects (the colored tapestry). It is argued that the best explanation of this fact is that the phenomenal character of our visual experience consists entirely in its representational properties. We cannot train our attention on the qualities of experience, but only on external qualities, because the phenomenal character of experience is nothing but the representation of those external qualities—which we know only via an awareness of/attention to those qualities themselves.

Alex Byrne defends an intentionalist view in something of the same spirit as Tye’s. In one (2001) paper, he argues that even an ideal reflecting subject could discover differences in the phenomenal character of her visual experience only “by attending to the world (whether external or internal) as her experience represents it”—and so could find no phenomenal differences not determined by differences in representational content. He reformulates his position in a later (2009) paper, as a version of what he calls “the content view”. Holding at arm’s length what he calls the “special philosophical sense of ‘experience’”—of which he is skeptical—he argues that there is a “non-comparative” way we can talk about how things (sometimes illusorily) look to us, best explained by supposing that visual perception “constitutively involves” a belief-like propositional attitude.

Susanna Siegel (2010) also defends the view that visual experience has intentional content, and that properties of things are “represented in our visual experience”, basing her argument primarily on the idea that visual experience has correctness or accuracy conditions that are “conveyed to the subject”. Central to her case: the best explanation for our distinguishing illusion and hallucination from other cases of experience appeals to the inaccuracy of the former and the accuracy of the latter.

Both Byrne and Siegel work out their views partly in response to Charles Travis’ (2004) doubts about the idea that senses have intentional or representational content. There is, he argues, no use of “looks” that serves to fix or “index” some propositional content allegedly peculiar to a visual experience (the “looks” in “she looks like her sister” clearly does not). And visual illusions are just cases where things are possessed of a “look” (understood impersonally) that one is liable to take as indicating they are other than in fact they are—which isn’t to say in these cases one has a visual experience that they are that way. In line with such challenges, much debate about intentionalism/representationalism has focused on: whether visual experience has propositional content proper to it; whether a satisfactory account of illusion and hallucination hangs on saying it does; and how we should distinguish different uses of the term “looks” (as, e.g., “phenomenal”, “comparative”, “epistemic”)—discussions harking back to Chisholm 1957 and Jackson 1977.

Susanna Schellenberg, like Byrne and Siegel, frames her (2011, 2018) defense of intentionalism in terms of the notions of representation and content, and responds to Travis-style concerns about the character of experience determining a specific set of accuracy conditions—a specific way the world has to be if it is to be as represented in experience. The proper treatment of illusion and hallucination also figure importantly in her argument. But one distinctive feature of Schellenberg’s view is her mix of intentionalism about experience with a version of relationalism—a view sometimes maintained in affirming a “naïve realism” supposed to stand against intentionalism. According to Schellenberg, one can (and should) maintain that visual experience (whether illusory, hallucinatory, or veridical) has representational content, even if the content of accurate experiences is ordinarily also partly constituted by mind-independent objects seen: what might be common to the veridical and hallucinatory cases is what would remain when the object is subtracted, leaving a “gap” in the content.

Adam Pautz (2010) provides a complex survey of the positions just mentioned in the course of defending an intentionalism that holds the phenomenal character of visual experience is determined by a relation of “sensorily entertaining a content”—where this content is understood as either a proposition or a (potentially) uninstantiated property complex. He argues that this view explains better than rivals certain facts about visual experience—in particular, the fact that it allows for the hallucination of contradictory and indeterminate objects, and the fact that it grounds (and justifies) beliefs involving external properties.

Siewert’s (1998, 2015) approach to the intentionality of visual experience, like Siegel’s, appeals in part to the fact that we may evidently assess visual experience for accuracy. But his argument (unlike those previously mentioned) leaves aside notions of representation and content. Using a concept of visual appearance/experience fixed partly by contrast with blindsight scenarios, he maintains that ordinarily, how it visually appears (looks) to you on an occasion is—due to the phenomenal character of this experience—accurate or inaccurate to some extent with respect to the shape, size, or location of things in your vicinity. For no clearly separable interpretation needs to be added to its phenomenal character to make these assessments for accuracy correct. Viewing experience as intentional is also supported by the phenomenology of object constancy. For this shows that, if what appears to you is as the subjective character of your experience makes it appear, it has spatial features that do not change with every change in their appearance to you, features which become more apparent to you as you get a better look. In that case your experience is directed at something beyond itself, in your surroundings, whose shape or location appears to you accurately to some extent.

Copyright © 2022 by
Charles Siewert <>

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