Supplement to Consciousness and Intentionality

Consciousness of Self

How should we bring together questions about the relation of consciousness to “state self-consciousness” with questions about its relation to consciousness of oneself—its connection with “subject self-consciousness”? We can see these topics are distinct, by noting how someone might hold that conscious states are states one is conscious of, while denying this involves any consciousness of the subject who has them. Consider David Armstrong’s (1968) theory of consciousness. This holds that the higher-order perception of a state that constitutes both its being conscious and its being introspected, is a bare perception of the state—which does not assign that state to anyone (or to any mind). To say that the state is someone’s in particular would be to go beyond what is strictly found in inner perception.

Armstrong’s position recalls David Hume’s famous remarks, testifying to his failure to observe anything but “perceptions” when, as he says, “I enter into what I call my self”. These remarks have often been cited as expressing insights about the “elusiveness of self” that we should honor in our accounts of self-consciousness. Robert Howell (2006), for example, speaks of the need to respect the “phenomenological data adduced by Hume”, in arguing for his descriptivist account of “basic self reference”. On Howell’s proposal, I understand to whom I refer in saying “I”, via an acquaintance not with the referent (Hume’s phenomenology correctly denies there is any such acquaintance)—but with an experience, an awareness of which is naturally expressible in demonstrative terms: “this sensation”. My basic self-reference—my understanding of who I am—is grasped only by a description: the person who has this sensation. Whether one tries in some such way to reduce subject self-consciousness to state self-consciousness or not, one may wish to separate what one is conscious of, in being conscious of the state, from the subject or self to whom it is attributed—consciousness of the subject being arrived at, if at all, only by a distinct operation. In Armstrong’s account this extra operation is an implicit bit of theorizing, positing a mind to which the introspected states belong. In Howell’s account it comes from forming a demonstrative-embedding description. And one may recall an analogous position expressed in Sartre’s ([1943] 1956) view: his pre-reflective self-consciousness (alleged to be inseparable from consciousness generally) is a consciousness merely of consciousness, not of an “ego” whose consciousness it is—the ego being a reflective construct born of anxiety in the face of radical freedom.

In response to such views, one may resist the Humean phenomenology. If one doubts that there is anything like “inner sense”, one might well think that, far from observing only perceptions, one never observes them. On the other hand, one does at least perceive one’s own body: why is this not a perception of self? As for introspection, if this consists in judgments about one’s own experiences, the phenomenological question will be whether a non-descriptive self-reference is rightly excluded from its content in favor of purely demonstrative, egoless reference to experiences. An affirmative answer to this question may seem dubious, and would appear to render puzzling why in such reflection I cannot reasonably wonder whose sensation this is. (Regarding this last point, see the discussion of Howell in Gertler 2011: 217–221.) However, a broadly Humean orientation might be defended while conceding these points. For example, Prinz (2012) remarks that while one may indeed have non-descriptive (or “non-attributive”) I-thoughts, and while one of course experiences one’s own body, none of this amounts to an experience of self “as subject”. And that is what ultimately is at issue.

Here we join with the third idea earlier identified in phenomenology when discussing the “reflexivity” theme: the idea that there is a consciousness of self “as subject” basic to experience. The contrast between “as object” and “as subject” consciousness of self that is found in phenomenology stems from the Kantian tradition. Andrew Brook (2006), in a helpful overview of Kant’s views on self-consciousness, identifies this notion as an enduring part of Kant’s contribution: necessarily connected with one’s experience of objects is an awareness of oneself as subject of those experiences, in a self-consciousness that is distinct from and prior to any attribution of properties to oneself (see also Longuenesse 2006). This Kantian legacy may be discerned in some of the aspects of phenomenologists’ views earlier noted that take up the idea that a consciousness of self as subject is associated with agency and the “spontaneity of the understanding”. Recall how, for Husserl, commitments necessarily involved in experienced acts of thought imply a persisting thinker who makes and can be held to them. For Heidegger, we are pre-reflectively disclosed to ourselves through discovering things in everyday practical dealings with them. For Merleau-Ponty, the body we experience as our own in ordinary active perception is an understander, a subject—understanding in a manner directly exhibited in movement. More recently, a view of the “experiential self”, inspired by an interpretation of the phenomenological tradition, has been elaborated by Dan Zahavi (2005, 2014)—who locates the most primitive experience of self—and indeed the self primitively experienced—not in active understanding, but in a basic “for-me-ness” he holds is essential to consciousness, and which he also identifies with the “first-person givenness” of experience. Other related, recent proposed articulations of a pared-down experience of self, include Galen Strawson’s (2009) notion of ephemeral, primitive “selves” in consciousness, and Barry Dainton’s (2008) notion of a “phenomenal self” understood in terms of the continuity of the stream of consciousness. An experienced (or experiential) self so conceived is sometimes contrasted with a “narrative self” (one’s self conceived of as the protagonist in autobiographical accounts)—especially where this notion figures in claims that the self is nothing but a kind of fiction spun out of such narrative—a “center of narrative gravity”, in Dennett’s (1991) metaphor. Arguments that a purely “narrativist” conception of self is at least incomplete, missing some important aspect of a basic experience of self, have also focused on the idea that we have an experience of ourselves as agents (Bayne and Pacherie 2007).

The idea that there is a consciousness distinctive of agency that amounts to a special and important form of consciousness of self has been taken up, in recent decades, in trying to understand both how basic self-reference is possible (the sort of issues we saw Howell addressing), and what makes a particular person (or a self, or whatever the personal pronoun takes as referent) one and the same over time. With respect to the former topic, one encounters the challenge (forcefully raised in Bermúdez 1998) of understanding what sort of primitive self-consciousness precedes and enables the kind of self-consciousness exhibited in mastery of the first-person pronoun. Taking up this challenge, Lucy O’Brien (2007) argues we need to recognize a distinctive sort of “agent awareness”—a non-attributive, non-conceptual (and non-perceptual) awareness of self, that arises through the basic exercise of practical reason, in considering and choosing possibilities for action “as possibilities”. Such awareness enables you to be conscious of yourself as an agent (without representing yourself to be an agent), and thereby to know yourself as a speaker, so that, when you then acquire and apply knowledge of the “self-reference rule” (the rule that “‘I’ refers to the speaker”) you may non-attributively grasp self-reference in language. With respect to concerns about the identity of persons over time, Christine Korsgaard (1989) has argued in a Kantian vein that, as rational beings engaged in even the most ordinary sorts of planning and choice, we must be conscious of ourselves as having, and must construct for ourselves, a unique path through time—by “identifying with a future” in our choice of what to do. What sort of unity over time is available to you will depend on various contingent constraints, having to do with the sort of body you happen to have, and current technological limitations. But your right to regard yourself as having an identify over time, and as possessed of an individual moral status that resists a utilitarian “leveling” of moral concern—this is adequately secured by the demands of practical reason, and needs no vindication from viewing the practical, moral subject you are as a theoretical object with certain persistence conditions.

Another view, recently developed by Martine Nida-Rümelin (2017) neatly pulls together many of the issues raised here in a novel way. She argues that no experience can be subjectless, and any that exhibits what she calls “basic intentionality” will necessarily involve something being presented to a subject who, moreover, is pre-reflectively aware of itself being presented to. In being such a subject you are not, however, necessarily presented to yourself—you are not an intentional object of your own awareness. But this pre-reflective self-awareness is intentional insofar as it is assessable for correctness. This self-awareness inseparable from intentional consciousness is held to be important for several reasons. It furnishes your core “I-concept”; it makes reflective self-consciousness possible for you (even as it enables you also to see unreflecting creatures as conscious subjects); and it secures an understanding of what it is to be numerically the same subject over time.

Copyright © 2022 by
Charles Siewert <>

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