Supplement to Consciousness and Intentionality

Phenomenology and Intentionalism

At this point it may be illuminating to consider how the intentionalist views surveyed in Section 5, and the separatism/intentionalism contrast, might relate to the phenomenologists’ views surveyed in Section 3. It seems the latter could all plausibly be regarded as intentionalist, in a broad sense: much or all of our actual experiences, and/or dispositions for experience, could not be as they are for us, without our enjoying some form of intentionality. This is clearest in the cases of Brentano and Husserl. Even if Brentano does not rule out the possibility of unconscious intentionality, he seems committed to the idea that our mental states are invariably presented in consciousness just as the intentional acts they are. And though it’s true that Husserl (unlike Brentano—or evidently, Heidegger, Sartre, or Merleau-Ponty) maintains that there is a non-intentional sensory component to perceptual consciousness that must be “interpreted” to refer to objects, for Husserl the interpretation of sensation belongs to consciousness no less than does the sensation interpreted. Husserl also affirms the possibility that there could be a kind of consciousness too unstructured or chaotic to make objects apparent to a subject ([1913] 1983 §49). But clearly he regards this as far from how our experience ordinarily is in actuality. The attribution of intentionalism is most problematic in Heidegger’s case because of his attitude towards consciousness. But clearly Heidegger would not endorse a kind of separatism once widespread in analytic circles, which finds in perception inner sensory states (exhausting perceptual consciousness) that can be involved in revealing objects to us only if they receive some kind of interpretation (see Heidegger 1982, § 9).

Could any of the phenomenologists named be regarded as reductive intentionalists in the sense explained above? Do any try to explain the intentionality of experience wholly in terms of a prior kind of non-experiential intentionality? The only candidate would seem to be Brentano, given how he combines the possibility of nonconscious intentionality with a conception of consciousness as a special intentional act that takes an intentional act as object. But it is doubtful this can make him a genuinely reductive intentionalist. Even though Brentano’s use of “conscious” allows for the possibility of unconscious (i.e., unperceived) appearings, his appeal to appearing to explain presentation, which he takes to be fundamental to intentionality generally, makes it doubtful he can be seen as explaining intentionality without primitive resort to phenomenal notions (Brentano [1874] 1973: 81, 198). We might then also wonder: could any of the phenomenologists named be regarded as restrictive intentionalists? It seems not. Even when they recognize that everyday perception exemplifies a kind of intentionality that is not categorial/predicative, and a kind of understanding that is not rationative, no phenomenologist seems to have been drawn to the idea that these exhaust consciousness in any sense.

If phenomenologists were intensively concerned with the relationship of consciousness and intentionality, why, one might ask, were separatism, and reductive (sometimes restrictive) intentionalisms not part of their repertoires, seeing how large these loom in analytic treatments? This difference may be partly because the phenomenologists would have rejected assumptions that help motivate both separatism and reductive intentionalism, and along with this the general project of ontologically subordinating the mental to the nonmental. However, understanding the relevant divergence in background assumptions would require much more exegesis and intellectual history. As a start one might say this. Brentano famously claims that no physical phenomenon exhibits intentionality (as all mental phenomena do). But given Brentano’s (now idiosyncratic) use of the expression “physical phenomenon” specifically for a type of appearance (so the orbit of an electron would not, for him, count as a “physical phenomenon”), it is not exactly clear how this bears on contemporary physicalism about the mind. In any case, Brentano’s metaphysics and his theoretical aims hardly invite such an ontology. As for Husserl, he seems to have thought the anti-psychologism regarding principles of inference that he defended in his Investigations could be extended to rule out any attempt to derive the normative implications of epistemology, ethics and aesthetics from the causal laws of natural science (Husserl [1911] 1965). It seems likely he would have thought this also made futile any attempt to “naturalize” intentionality. Finally, the realist presuppositions of such ontological subordination projects also sit poorly with the sort of “transcendental” outlook, echoing Kant in some respects, embraced by Ideas-era Husserl, and seemingly, in some form by Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty as well.

However, it would be a mistake to assume that these phenomenologists shared none of the concerns that attracted analytic philosophers of mind to separatism, and reductive or restrictive intentionalism. Clearly they also found subjectivity deeply philosophically challenging. They too aimed to show how to avoid thinking of understanding as isolated in a private sphere of consciousness. But unlike many analytic philosophers, they were not concerned to see consciousness as somehow necessitated by a fundamental objective reality whose constituents lacked it. So they did not see the problem of subjectivity as that of how to interpret it in such a way as to secure this necessitation. Thus phenomenologists were also not liable—as were later philosophers of mind—to think of cultivating first-person reflection is a hindrance to metaphysics, to be removed by realizing it can tell us nothing of substance about experience—since “introspection” works only with empty “topic neutral” or brutely demonstrative “phenomenal concepts”. In fact, that attitude would appear antithetical to the very practice of phenomenology. What problems then did the phenomenologists find in subjectivity, and how were these met?

We may distinguish two general issues. First, there is the problem of transcendence—arguably the basic problem of intentionality for phenomenology after Husserl. This appears in Husserl and Merleau-Ponty as the challenge of explaining how a subject’s perspectivally limited experience, nearly constantly in flux, could at the same time somehow constitute a consciousness of stable objectivity. Husserl and Merleau-Ponty address this sort of issue by trying to show how, properly described, and dynamically considered, the perspectival character of sensory experience actually gives it an experience-transcending reference. This would seem to serve also as their argument for intentionalism. Notably, Heidegger conceives of transcendence rather differently; for him the problem is to say how intentionality is made possible by our relationship with time (Heidegger 1982 §§9, 20–21). He addresses his problem of transcendence by working out a notion of temporality (influenced by Husserl on time-consciousness) that purports to explain how our basic forms of comportment towards entities are possible.

Subjectivity also raised for phenomenologists a second set of issues, concerning how to combine a recognition of the peculiarity of self-understanding with the possibility of understanding others and participating in communal life. Generally, they tried to show how the two are not as independent as they may seem. Husserl ([1929] 1960) purports to link subjectivity closely to intersubjectivity, while Heidegger ([1927] 1962) tries to explain how a peculiarly individuating self-consciousness and authenticity can emerge only against the background of one’s prior understanding of social norms (discussed in connection with “das Man”). Sartre ([1943] 1956) addresses the issue in his famous discussion of how self-consciousness arises in the consciousness of another’s gaze. And finally, Merleau-Ponty ([1945] 2012: II.4) appeals to the idea that there is a basic, unified understanding of self and other embodied in our own movements, gestures and postures. (It is unified, because it is at once subjectively experienced and publically recognizable, expressive of self and responsive to others. It is basic, because it precedes and makes possible both the understanding of self in reflective judgments, and the understanding of others in mentalistic explanations of their behavior. )

We would need to take all this into account to assess any attempt to map these earlier perspectives onto more recent discussions of intentionality. However, without taking on such heavy tasks, we might cursorily remark on a few connections. Again, there are the apparent affinities between some phenomenologists’ views and recent relational views of perception. (But even if, as suggested, some kind of relationalism is attributable to Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre—and even more clearly so to Merleau-Ponty—this would seem to be (as in Schellenberg 2011) a kind of intentionalist relationalism.) We also may note parallels between views found in the phenomenological tradition and recent embodied or embedded conceptions of cognition. Merleau-Ponty, at least, resembles their proponents in some respects—insofar as he would locate understanding (and thus if you like, in a broad sense “cognitive processes”) in our sensorimotor interactions with the environment, rather than see them as mere effects (or causes) of representational-inferential processes hidden in the brain or soul, where the real cognition (understanding) allegedly happens. Heidegger too has been appropriated as a precursor of contemporary “situated” approaches to cognition (see Wheeler 2005 and Kaüfer and Chemero 2015). Husserl and Merleau-Ponty both inspire Evan Thompson’s (2007) articulation of an explicitly phenomenological “enactivist” account that locates mind (and consciousness) in one’s relationship with the environment. And some of those who recently have argued in favor of locating cognitive processes partly outside of our heads, such as Andy Clark and Alva Noë, acknowledge affinities with Merleau-Ponty (even if, unlike Thompson, they don’t engage in the interpretation of his ideas or identify with the phenomenological movement). Clark and Noë significantly differ, however, on how to place consciousness in such an account. For Clark (1997), while both belief-states and cognitive processes (and so presumably in some sense, intentionality) extend outside of the head into bodily interactions with and states of one’s environment, consciousness remains firmly “skull-bound”. For Noë (2004, 2009), on the other hand (somewhat like Merleau-Ponty), in both consciousness and understanding we reach—sometimes literally—out to the world.

Copyright © 2016 by
Charles Siewert <>

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