Notes to Medieval Theories of Consequence

1. For methodological reasons, the analysis here will focus exclusively on the developments in the Latin medieval tradition, thus disregarding the significant developments elsewhere, especially in the Arabic tradition. Henceforth, I shall no longer use the qualification ‘Latin’, but the reader must bear in mind that there is much more to medieval philosophy than merely the Latin tradition. See for example the chapters on Arabic logic in Dutilh Novaes and Read (eds.) 2016.

2. Throughout the text, the term ‘sentence’ will be used as a translation of the Latin term ‘propositio’, except when quoting translations of Latin texts, where occasionally ‘proposition’ will appear. What Latin authors meant by propositio is best captured by the notion of a declarative sentence, not by the modern abstract notion of proposition.

3. Traditional Aristotelian logic, syllogistic in particular, is term-based in that the basic units of analysis are terms, not whole sentences: “All A is B, all B is C, thus all A is C” is a typical term-based valid schema. The Stoics had famously adopted a sentential perspective when investigating schemata such as modus ponens and modus tollens; Latin medieval authors, while under no direct Stoic influence, also investigated sentential operations and sentential connectives. But it would be a mistake to view the medieval theories as entirely sentential, in the sense of modern sentential/propositional logic: term-based analysis remains an important component of these theories.

4. Martin (2009, 67) categorically asserts that Boethius had no direct knowledge of Stoic logic when developing the notion of hypothetical syllogism, even though his use of some of the classic Stoic examples suggests at least some kind of indirect influence.

5. All translations from the Latin are my own, unless otherwise stated.

6. The perfect vs. imperfect terminology is likely a reference to Aristotle’s distinction between perfect and imperfect syllogisms. Notice however that Aristotle’s imperfect syllogisms (i.e. those not belonging to the first figure) count as perfect inferences by Abelard’s criterion.

7. See chapter E of (Green-Pedersen 1984).

8. On the identity of the author of this text, see (Read 1993, fn. 10).

9. Ockham’s multiple distinctions do not seem to be meant to be organized in a specific way, i.e. some being sub-distinctions of others, but rather as alternative ways of classifying consequences.

10. The passage where Ockham defines material consequences is thought by many to be corrupted, so the exact content of this definition is still controversial among scholars — see (Schupp 1993)

11. One is here reminded of the distinction between first-figure, perfect syllogisms and second- and third-figure imperfect but equally valid syllogisms, which is also essentially an epistemic distinction (Corcoran 1974).

12. This similarity simply confirms that this way of arguing was very widespread at the time; incidentally, one is easily reminded of the current method of arguing by counterexamples in analytic philosophy.

13. See (Read 2001) for an account of Pseudo-Scotus ‘paradox’, where it is also argued that this so-called paradox did not obtain the desired effect of violating the modal criterion.

Copyright © 2020 by
Catarina Dutilh Novaes <>

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