The theory of morality we can call full rule-consequentialism selects rules solely in terms of the goodness of their consequences and then claims that these rules determine which kinds of acts are morally wrong. George Berkeley was arguably the first rule-consequentialist. He wrote, “In framing the general laws of nature, it is granted we must be entirely guided by the public good of mankind, but not in the ordinary moral actions of our lives. … The rule is framed with respect to the good of mankind; but our practice must be always shaped immediately by the rule” (Berkeley 1712: section 31).
- 1. Utilitarianism
- 2. Welfare
- 3. Other Goods To Be Promoted
- 4. Full Rule-consequentialism
- 5. Global Consequentialism
- 6. Formulating Full Rule-consequentialism
- 7. Three Ways of Arguing for Rule-consequentialism
- 8. Must Rule-consequentialism Be Guilty of Collapse, Incoherence, or Rule-worship?
- 9. Other Objections to Rule-consequentialism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
A moral theory is a form of consequentialism if and only if it assesses acts and/or character traits, practices, and institutions solely in terms of the goodness of the consequences. Historically, utilitarianism has been the best-known form of consequentialism. Utilitarianism assesses acts and/or character traits, practices, and institutions solely in terms of overall net benefit. Overall net benefit is often referred to as aggregate well-being or welfare. Aggregate welfare is calculated by counting a benefit or harm to any one individual the same as the same size benefit or harm to any other individual, and then adding all the benefits and harms together to reach an aggregate sum. There is considerable dispute among consequentialists about what the best account of welfare is.
Classical utitilitarians (i.e., Jeremy Bentham, J.S. Mill, and Henry Sidgwick) took benefit and harm to be purely a matter of pleasure and pain. The view that welfare is a matter of pleasure minus pain has generally been called hedonism. It has grown in sophistication (Parfit 1984: Appendix I; Sumner 1996; Crisp 2006; de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014: ch. 9) but remains committed to the thesis that how well someone’s life goes depends entirely on his or her pleasure minus pain, albeit with pleasure and pain being construed very broadly.
Even if pleasures and pains are construed very broadly, hedonism encounters difficulties. The main one is that many (if not all) people care very strongly about things other than their own pleasures and pains. Of course these other things can be important as means to pleasures and to the avoidance of pain. But many people care very strongly about things over and beyond their hedonistic instrumental value. For example, many people want to know the truth about various matters even if this won’t increase their (or anyone else’s) pleasure. Another example is that many people care about achieving things over and beyond the pleasure such achievements might produce. Again, many people care about the welfare of their family and friends in a non-instrumental way. A rival account of these points, especially the last, is that people care about many things other than their own welfare.
On any plausible view of welfare, the satisfaction people can feel when their desires are fulfilled constitutes an addition to their welfare. Likewise, on any plausible view, frustration felt as a result of unfulfilled desires constitutes a reduction in welfare. What is controversial is whether the fulfilment of someone’s desire constitutes a benefit to that person apart from any effect that the fulfilment of the desire has on that person’s felt satisfaction or frustration. Hedonism answers No, claiming that only effects on felt satisfaction or felt frustration matter.
A different theory of welfare answers Yes. This theory holds that the fulfilment of any desire of the agent’s constitutes a benefit to the agent, even if the agent never knows that desire has been fulfilled and even if the agent derives no pleasure from its fulfilment. This theory of human welfare is often referred to as the desire-fulfillment theory of welfare.
Clearly, the desire-fulfillment theory of welfare is broader than hedonism, in that the desire-fulfillment theory accepts that what can constitute a benefit is wider than merely pleasure. But there are reasons for thinking that this broader theory is too broad. For one thing, people can have sensible desires that are simply too disconnected from their own lives to be relevant to their own welfare (Williams 1973a: 262; Overvold 1980, 1982; Parfit 1984: 494). I desire that the starving in far-away countries get food. But the fulfilment of this desire of mine does not benefit me.
For another thing, people can have desires for absurd things for themselves. Suppose I desire to count all the blades of grass in the lawns on this road. If I get satisfaction out of doing this, the felt satisfaction constitutes a benefit to me. But the bare fulfilment of my desire to count all the blades of grass in the lawns on this road does not (Rawls 1971: 432; Parfit 1984: 500; Crisp 1997: 56).
On careful reflection, we might think that the fulfilment of someone’s desire constitutes an addition to that person’s welfare if and only if that desire has one of a certain set of contents. We might think, for example, that the fulfilment of someone’s desire for pleasure, friendship, knowledge, achievement, or autonomy for herself does constitute an addition to her welfare, and that the fulfilment of any desires she might have for things that do not fall into these categories do not directly benefit her (though, again, the pleasure she derives from their satisfaction does). If we think this, it seems we think there is a list of things that constitute anyone’s welfare (Parfit 1984: Appendix I; Brink 1989: 221–36; Griffin 1996: ch. 2; Crisp 1997: ch. 3; Gert 1998: 92–4; Arneson 1999a).
Insofar as the goods to be promoted are parts of welfare, the theory remains utilitarian. There is a lot to be said for utilitarianism. Obviously, how lives go is important. And there is something deeply attractive (if not downright irresistible) in the idea that morality is fundamentally impartial, i.e., the idea that, at the most fundamental level of morality, everyone is equally important — women and men, strong and weak, rich and poor, Blacks, Whites, Hispanics, Asians, etc. And utilitarianism plausibly interprets this equal importance as dictating that in the calculation of overall welfare a benefit or harm to any one individual counts neither more nor less that the same size benefit or harm to any other individual.
The nonutilitarian members of the consequentialist family are theories that assess acts and/or character traits, practices, and institutions solely in terms of resulting good, where good is not restricted to welfare. “Nonutilitarian” here means “not purely utilitarian”, rather than “completely unutilitarian”. When writers describe themselves as consequentialists rather than as utilitarians, they are normally signalling that their fundamental evaluations will be in terms of not only welfare but also some other goods.
What are these other goods? The most common answers have been justice, fairness, and equality.
Justice, according to Plato, is “rendering to each his due” (Republic, Bk. 1). We might suppose that what people are due is a matter of what people are owed, either because they deserve it or because they have a moral right to it. Suppose we plug these ideas into consequentialism. Then we get the theory that things should be assessed in terms of not only how much welfare results but also the extent to which people get what they deserve and the extent to which moral rights are respected.
For consequentialism to take this line, however, is for it to restrict its explanatory ambitions. What a theory simply presupposes, it does not explain. A consequentialist theory that presupposes both that justice is constituted by such-and-such and that justice is one of the things to be promoted does not explain why the components of justice are important. It does not explain what desert is. It does not explain the importance of moral rights, much less try to determine what the contents of these moral rights are. These are matters too important and contentious for a consequentialist theory to leave unexplained or open. If consequentialism is going to refer to justice, desert, and moral rights, it needs to analyze these concepts and justify the role it gives them.
Similar things can be said about fairness. If a consequentialist theory presupposes an account of fairness, and simply stipulates that fairness is to be promoted, then this consequentialist theory is not explaining fairness. But fairness (like justice, desert, and moral rights) is a concept too important for consequentialism not to try to explain.
One way for consequentialists to deal with justice and fairness is to contend that justice and fairness are constituted by conformity with a certain set of justified social practices, and that what justifies these practices is that they generally promote overall welfare and equality. Indeed, the contention might be that what people are due, what people have a moral right to, what justice and fairness require, is conformity to whatever practices promote overall welfare and equality.
Whether equality needs to be included in the formula, however, is very controversial. Many think that a purely utilitarian formula has sufficiently egalitarian implications. They think that, even if the goal is promotion of welfare, not the promotion of welfare-plus-equality, there are some contingent but pervasive facts about human beings that push in the direction of equal distribution of material resources. According to the “law of diminishing marginal utility of material resources”, the amount of benefit a person gets out of a certain unit of material resources is less the more units of that material good the person already has. Suppose I go from having no way of getting around except by foot to having a bicycle, or, though I live in a place where one can get very cold, I go from having no warm coat to having one. I will benefit more from getting that first bicycle or coat than I would if I go from having nine bicycles or coats to having ten.
There are exceptions to the law of diminishing marginal utility. In most of these exceptions, an additional unit of material resource pushes someone over some important threshold. For example, consider the meal or pill or gulp of air that saves someone’s life, or the car whose acquisition pushes the competitive collector into first place. In such cases, the unit that puts the person over the threshold might well be as beneficial to that person as any prior unit was. Still, as a general rule, material resources do have diminishing marginal utility.
To the assumption that material resources have diminishing marginal utility, let us add the assumption that different people generally get roughly the same benefits from the same material resources. Again, there are exceptions. If you live in a freezing climate and I live in a hot climate, then you would benefit much more from a warm coat than I would.
But suppose we live in the same place, which has freezing winters, good paths for riding bicycles, and no public transportation. And suppose you have ten bicycles and ten coats (though you are not vying for some bicycle- or coat-collector prize). Meanwhile, I am so poor that I have none. Then, redistributing one of your bicycles and one of your coats to me will probably harm you less than it will benefit me. This sort of phenomenon pervades societies where resources are unequally distributed. Wherever the phenomenon occurs, a fundamentally impartial morality is under pressure to redistribute resources from the richer to the poorer.
However, there are also contingent but pervasive facts about human beings that pull in favor of practices that have the foreseen consequence of material inequality. First of all, higher levels of overall welfare can require higher levels of productivity (think of the welfare gains resulting from improvements in agricultural productivity). In many areas of the economy, the provision of material rewards for greater productivity seems the most efficient acceptable way of eliciting higher productivity. Some individuals and groups will be more productive than others (especially if there are incentive schemes). So the practice of providing material rewards for greater productivity will result in material inequality.
Thus, on the one hand, the diminishing marginal utility of material resources exerts pressure in favor of more equal distributions of resources. On the other hand, the need to promote productivity exerts pressure in favor of incentive schemes that have the foreseen consequence of material inequality. Utilitarians and most other consequentialists find themselves balancing these opposed pressures.
Note that those pressures concern the distribution of resources. There is a further question about how equally welfare itself should be distributed. Many recent writers have taken utilitarianism to be indifferent about the distribution of welfare. Imagine a choice between an outcome where overall welfare is large but distributed unequally and an outcome where overall welfare is smaller but distributed equally. Utilitarians are taken to favor outcomes with greater overall welfare even if it is also less equally distributed.
To illustrate this, let us take an artificially simple population, divided into just two groups.
Units of welfare Total welfare for both groups Alternative 1 Per person Per group 10,000 people in group A 1 10,000 100,000 people in group B 10 1,000,000 Impartially calculated: 1,010,000
Units of welfare Total welfare for both groups Alternative 2 Per person Per group 10,000 people in group A 8 80,000 100,000 people in group B 9 900,000 Impartially calculated: 980,000
Many people would think Alternative 2 above better than Alternative 1, and might think that the comparison between these alternatives shows that there is always pressure in favor of greater equality of welfare.
As Derek Parfit (1997) in particular has argued, however, we must not be too hasty. Consider the following choice:
Units of welfare Total welfare for both groups Alternative 1 Per person Per group 10,000 people in group A 1 10,000 100,000 people in group B 10 1,000,000 Impartially calculated: 1,010,000
Units of welfare Total welfare for both groups Alternative 3 Per person Per group 10,000 people in group A 1 10,000 100,000 people in group B 1 100,000 Impartially calculated: 110,000
Is equality of welfare so important that Alternative 3 is superior to Alternative 1? To take an example of Parfit’s, suppose the only way to make everyone equal with respect to sight is to make everyone totally blind. Is such “levelling down” required by morality? Indeed, is it in any way at all morally desirable?
If we think the answer is No, then we might think that equality of welfare as such is not really an ideal (cf. Temkin 1993). Losses to the better off are justified only where this benefits the worse off. What we had thought of as pressure in favor of equality of welfare was instead pressure in favor of levelling up. We might say that additions to welfare matter more the worse off the person is whose welfare is affected. This view has come to be called prioritarianism (Parfit 1997; Arneson 1999b). It has tremendous intuitive appeal.
For a simplistic example of how prioritarianism might work, suppose the welfare of the worst off counts five times as much as the welfare of the better off. Then Alternative 1 from the tables above comes out at:
\((1 \times 5 \times 10,000) + (10 \times 100,000)\),
which comes to 1,050,000 total units of welfare. Again with the welfare of the worst off counting five times as much, Alternative 2 comes out at:
\((8 \times 5 \times 10,000) + (9 \times 100,000)\),
which comes to 1,300,000 total units of welfare. This accords with the common reaction that Alternative 2 is morally superior to Alternative 1.
Of course in real examples there is never only one division in society. Rather there is a scale from the worst off, to the not quite so badly off, and so on up to the best off. Prioritarianism is committed to variable levels of importance of benefitting people at different places on this scale: the worse off a person is, the greater the importance attached to that person’s gain.
This raises two serious worries about prioritarianism. The first concerns prioritarianism’s difficulty in nonarbitrarily determining how much more importance to give to the welfare of the worse off. For example, should a unit of benefit to the worst off count 10 times more than the same size benefit to the best off and 5 times more than the same size benefit to the averagely well off? Or should the multipliers be 20 and 10, or 4 and 2, or other amounts? The second worry about prioritarianism is whether attaching greater importance to increases in welfare for some than to the same size increases in welfare for others contradicts fundamental impartiality (Hooker 2000: 60–2).
This is not the place to go further into debates between prioritarianism and its critics. So the rest of this article sets aside those debates.
Consequentialists have distinguished three components of their theory: (1) their thesis about what makes acts morally wrong, (2) their thesis about the procedure agents should use to make their moral decisions, and (3) their thesis about the conditions under which moral sanctions such as blame, guilt, and praise are appropriate.
What we might call full rule-consequentialism consists of rule-consequentialist criteria for all three. Thus, full rule-consequentialism claims that an act is morally wrong if and only if it is forbidden by rules justified by their consequences. It also claims that agents should do their moral decision-making in terms of rules justified by their consequences. And it claims that the conditions under which moral sanctions should be applied are determined by rules justified by their consequences.
Full rule-consequentialists may think that there is really only one set of rules about these three different subject matters. Or they may think that there are different sets that in some sense correspond to or complement one another.
Much more important than the distinction between different kinds of full rule-consequentialism is the distinction between full rule-consequentialism and partial rule-consequentialism. Partial rule-consequentialism might take many forms. Let us focus on the most common form. The most common form of partial rule-consequentialism claims that agents should make their moral decisions about what to do by reference to rules justified by their consequences, but does not claim that moral wrongness is determined by rules justified by their consequences. Partial rule-consequentialists typically subscribe to the theory that moral wrongness is determined directly in terms of the consequences of the act compared to the consequences of alternative possible acts. This theory of wrongness is called act-consequentialism.
Distinguishing between full and partial rule-consequentialism clarifies the contrast between act-consequentialism and rule-consequentialism. Act-consequentialism is best conceived of as maintaining merely the following:
Act-consequentialist criterion of wrongness: An act is wrong if and only if it results in less good than would have resulted from some available alternative act.
When confronted with that criterion of moral wrongness, many people naturally assume that the way to decide what to do is to apply the criterion, i.e.,
Act-consequentialist moral decision procedure: On each occasion, an agent should decide what to do by calculating which act would produce the most good.
However, consequentialists nearly never defend this act-consequentialist decision procedure as a general and typical way of making moral decisions (Mill 1861: ch 2; Sidgwick 1907: 405–6, 413, 489–90; Moore 1903: 162–4; Smart 1956: 346; 1973: 43, 71; Bales 1971: 257–65; Hare 1981; Parfit 1984: 24–9, 31–43; Railton 1984: 140–6, 152–3; Brink 1989: 216–7, 256–62, 274–6; Pettit and Brennan 1986; Pettit 1991, 1994, 1997: 156–61, 2017; de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014: ch. 10). There are a number of compelling consequentialist reasons why the act-consequentialist decision procedure would be counter-productive.
First, very often the agent does not have detailed information about what the consequences would be of various acts.
Second, obtaining such information would often involve greater costs than are at stake in the decision to be made.
Third, even if the agent had the information needed to make calculations, the agent might make mistakes in the calculations. (This is especially likely when the agent’s natural biases intrude, or when the calculations are complex, or when they have to be made in a hurry.)
Fourth, there are what we might call expectation effects. Imagine a society in which people know that others are naturally biased towards themselves and towards their loved ones but are trying to make their every moral decision by calculating overall good. In such a society, each person might well fear that others will go around breaking promises, stealing, lying, and even assaulting whenever they convinced themselves that such acts would produce the greatest overall good (Woodard 2019: 149). In such a society, people would not feel they could trust one another.
This fourth consideration is more controversial than the first three. For example, Hodgson 1967, Hospers 1972, and Harsanyi 1982 argue that trust would break down. Singer 1972 and Lewis 1972 argue that it would not.
Nevertheless, most philosophers accept that, for all four of the reasons above, using an act-consequentialist decision procedure would not maximize the good. Hence even philosophers who espouse the act-consequentialist criterion of moral wrongness reject the act-consequentialist moral decision procedure. In its place, they typically advocate the following:
Rule-consequentialist decision procedure: At least normally, agents should decide what to do by applying rules whose acceptance will produce the best consequences, rules such as “Don’t harm innocent others”, “Don’t steal or vandalize others’ property”, “Don’t break your promises”, “Don’t lie”, “Pay special attention to the needs of your family and friends”, “Do good for others generally”.
Since act-consequentialists about the criterion of wrongness typically accept this decision procedure, act-consequentialists are in fact partial rule-consequentialists. Often, what writers refer to as indirect consequentialism is this combination of act-consequentialism about wrongness and rule-consequentialism about the appropriate decision procedure.
Standardly, the decision procedure that full rule-consequentialism endorses is the one that it would be best for society to accept. The qualification “standardly” is needed because there are versions of rule-consequentialism that let the rules be relativised to small groups or even individuals (D. Miller 2010; Kahn 2012). And act-consequentialism insists upon the decision procedure it would be best for the individual to accept. So, according to act-consequentialism, since Jack’s and Jill’s capacities and situations may be very different, the best decision procedure for Jack to accept may be different from the best decision procedure for Jill to accept. However, in practice act-consequentialists typically ignore for the most part such differences and endorse the above rule-consequentialist decision procedure (Hare 1981, chs. 2, 3, 8, 9, 11; Levy 2000).
When act-consequentialists endorse the above rule-consequentialist decision procedure, they acknowledge that following this decision procedure does not guarantee that we will do the act with the best consequences. Sometimes, for example, our following a decision procedure that rules out harming an innocent person will prevent us from doing that act that would produce the best consequences. Similarly, there will be some circumstances in which stealing, breaking our promises, etc., would produce the best consequences. Still, our following a decision procedure that generally rules out such acts will in the long run and on the whole probably produce far better consequences than our trying to run consequentialist calculations on an act-by-act basis.
Because act-consequentialists typically agree with a rule-consequentialist decision procedure, whether to classify some philosopher as an act-consequentialist or as a rule-consequentialist can be problematic. For example, G.E. Moore (1903, 1912) is sometimes classified as an act-consequentialist and sometimes as a rule-consequentialist. Like so many others, including his teacher Henry Sidgwick, Moore combined an act-consequentialist criterion of moral wrongness with a rule-consequentialist procedure for deciding what to do. Moore simply went further than most in stressing the danger of departing from the rule-consequentialist decision procedure (see Shaw 2000). Hare (1981) and Pettit (1991, 1994, 1997) have also been especially influential act-consequentialists about what makes acts right or wrong while holding that everyday decision-making should be conducted in terms of familiar rules focused on things other than consequences.
Some writers propose that the purest and most consistent form of consequentialism is the view that absolutely everything should be assessed by its consequences, including not only acts but also rules, motives, the imposition of sanctions, etc. Let us follow Pettit and Smith (2000) in referring to this view as global consequentialism. Kagan (2000) pictures it as multi-dimensional direct consequentialism, in that each thing is assessed directly in terms of whether its own consequences are as good as the consequences of alternatives.
How does this global consequentialism differ from what we have been calling partial rule-consequentialism? What we have been calling partial rule-consequentialism is nothing but the combination of the act-consequentialist criterion of moral wrongness with the rule-consequentialist decision procedure. So defined, partial rule-consequentialism leaves open the question of when moral sanctions are appropriate.
Some partial rule-consequentialists say that agents should be blamed and feel guilty whenever they fail to choose an act that would result in the best consequences. A much more reasonable position for a partial rule-consequentialist to take is that agents should be blamed and feel guilty whenever they choose an act that is forbidden by the rule-consequentialist decision procedure, whether or not that individual act fails to result in the best consequences. Finally, partial rule-consequentialism, as we have defined it, is compatible with the claim that whether agents should be blamed or feel guilty depends not on the wrongness of what they did, nor on whether the recommended procedure for making moral decisions would have led them to choose the act they choose, but instead solely on whether this blame or guilt will do any good. This is precisely the view of sanctions that global consequentialism takes.
One objection to global consequentialism is that simultaneously applying a consequentialist criterion to acts, decision procedures, and the imposition of sanctions leads to apparent paradoxes (Crisp 1992; Streumer 2003; Lang 2004).
Suppose, on the whole and in the long run, the best decision procedure for you to accept is one that leads you to do act x now. But suppose also that in fact the act with the best consequences in this situation is not x but y. So global consequentialism tells you (a) to use the best possible decision procedure but also (b) not to do the act picked out by this decision procedure. That seems paradoxical.
Things get worse when we consider blame and guilt. Suppose you follow the best possible decision procedure but fail to do the act with the best consequences. Are you to be blamed? Should you feel guilty? Global consequentialism claims that you should be blamed if and only if blaming you will produce the best consequences, and that you should feel guilty if and only if this will produce the best consequences. Suppose that for some reason the best consequences would result from blaming you for following the prescribed decision procedure (and thus doing x). But surely it is paradoxical for a moral theory to call for you to be blamed although you followed the moral decision procedure mandated by the theory. Or suppose that for some reason the best consequences would result from blaming you for intentionally choosing the act with the best consequences (y). Again, surely it is paradoxical for a moral theory to call for you to be blamed although you intentionally chose the very act required by the theory.
So one problem with global consequentialism is that it creates potential gaps between what acts it claims to be required and what decision procedures it tells agents to use, and between each of these and blamelessness. (For explicit replies to this line of attack, see Driver 2014: 175 and de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014: 315–16.)
That is not the most familiar problem with global consequentialism. The most familiar problem with it is instead its maximising act-consequentialist criterion of wrongness. According to this maximising criterion, an act is wrong if and only if it fails to result in the greatest good. This criterion judges some acts to be not wrong which certainly seem to be wrong. It also judges some acts that seem not wrong to be wrong.
For example, consider an act of murder that results in slightly more good than any other act would have produced. According to the most familiar, maximising act-consequentialist criterion of wrongness, this act of murder is not wrong. Many other kinds of act such as assaulting, stealing, promise breaking, and lying can be wrong even when doing them would produce slightly more good than not doing them would. Again, the familiar, maximising form of act-consequentialism denies this.
Or consider someone who gives to her child, or keeps for herself, some resource of her own instead of contributing it to help some stranger who would have gained slightly more from that resource. Such an action hardly seems wrong. Yet the maximising act-consequentialist criterion judges it to be wrong. Indeed, imagine how much self-sacrifice an averagely well-off person would have to make before her further actions satisfied the maximising act-consequentialist criterion of wrongness. She would have to give to the point where further sacrifices from her in order to benefit others would harm her more than they would benefit the others. Thus, the maximising act-consequentialist criterion of wrongness is often accused of being unreasonably demanding.
The objections just directed at maximising act-consequentialism could be side-stepped by a version of act-consequentialism that did not require maximising the good. This sort of act-consequentialism is now called satisficing consequentialism. See the entry on consequentialism/ for more on such a theory.
There are a number of different ways of formulating rule-consequentialism. For example, it can be formulated in terms of the good that actually results from rules or in terms of the rationally expected good of the consequences of rules. It can be formulated in terms of the consequences of compliance with rules or in terms of the wider consequences of acceptance of rules. It can be formulated in terms of the consequences of absolutely everyone’s accepting the rules or in terms of the rules’ acceptance by something less than everyone. Rule-consequentialism can also be formulated in terms of the teaching of a code to everyone in the next generation, in the full realization that the degrees of resulting acceptance will vary (Mulgan 2006, 2017, 2020; D. Miller 2014, 2021; T. Miller 2016, 2021). Rule-consequentialism is more plausible if formulated in some ways than it is if formulated in other ways. This is explained in the following three subsections. Questions of formulation are also relevant in later sections on objections to rule-consequentialism.
As indicated, full rule-consequentialism consists in rule-consequentialist answers to three questions. The first is, what makes acts morally wrong? The second is, what procedure should agents use to make their moral decisions? The third is, what are the conditions under which moral sanctions such as blame, guilt, and praise are appropriate?
As we have seen, the answer that full rule-consequentialists give to the question about decision procedure is much like the answer that other kinds of consequentialist give to that question. So let us focus on the points of contrast, i.e., the other two questions. These two questions — about what makes acts wrong and about when sanctions are appropriate — are more tightly connected than sometimes realized.
Indeed, J.S. Mill, one of the fathers of consequentialism, affirmed their tight connection:
We do not call anything wrong, unless we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished in some way or other for doing it; if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience. (1861: ch. 5, para. 14)
Let us assume that Mill took “ought to be punished, at least by one’s own conscience if not by others” to be roughly the same as “blameworthy”. With this assumption in hand, we can interpret Mill as tying wrongness tightly to blameworthiness. In a moment, we can consider what follows if Mill is mistaken that wrongness is tied tightly to blameworthiness. First, let us consider what follows if Mill is correct that wrongness is tied tightly to blameworthiness.
Consider the following argument, whose first premise comes from Mill:
If an act is wrong, it is blameworthy.
Surely, an agent cannot rightly be blamed for accepting and following rules that the agent could not foresee would have sub-optimal consequences. From this, we get our second premise:
If an act is blameworthy, the sub-optimal consequences of rules allowing that act must have been foreseeable.
From these two premises we get the conclusion:
So if an act is wrong, the sub-optimal consequences of rules allowing that act must have been foreseeable.
Of course, the actual consequences of accepting a set of rules may not be the same as the foreseeable consequences of accepting that set. Hence, if full rule-consequentialism claims that an act is wrong if and only if the foreseeable consequences of rules allowing that act are sub-optimal, rule-consequentialism cannot also hold that an act is wrong if and only if the actual consequences of rules allowing that act will be sub-optimal.
Now suppose instead the relation between wrongness and blameworthiness is far looser than Mill suggested (cf. Sorensen 1996). That is, suppose that our criterion of wrongness can be quite different from our criterion of blameworthiness. In that case, we could hold:
Actualist rule-consequentialist criterion of wrongness: An act is wrong if and only if it is forbidden by rules that would actually result in the greatest good.
Expectablist rule-consequentialist criterion of blameworthiness: An act is blameworthy if and only if it is forbidden by the rules that would foreseeably result in the greatest good.
Let us replace “foreseeably result in the greatest good” with “result in the greatest expected good”. Here is how expected good of a set of rules is calculated. Suppose we can identify the value or disvalue of each possible outcome a set of rules might have. Multiply the value of each possible outcome by the probability of that outcome’s occurring. Take all the products of these multiplications and add them together. The resulting number quantifies the expected good of that set of rules.
Expected good is not to be calculated by employing whatever crazy estimates of probabilities people might assign to possible outcomes. Rather, expected good is calculated by multiplying the value or disvalue of possible outcomes by rational or justified probability estimates.
Different agents have different evidence and thus have different rational and justified probability estimates. Such differences are sometimes exactly what explains disagreements about what changes to an extant moral code would be improvements. In some cases of disagreements, the cause of such disagreement is that at least one of the parties is not aware of, or has not fully assimilated, evidence that is available. Expectablist rule-consequentialist would likely want to tie rational or justified probability estimates to the evidence that is available at the time, even if some people are not aware of it or have not fully appreciated its implications.
There might be considerable scepticism about how calculations of expected good are even possible (Lenman 2000). Even where such calculations are possible, they will often be quite impressionistic and imprecise. Nevertheless, we can reasonably hope to make at least some informed judgements about the likely consequences of alternative possible rules (Burch-Brown 2014). And we could be guided by such judgements, as legislators often say they are. In contrast, which rules would actually have the very best consequences will normally be inaccessible. Hence, the expectablist rule-consequentialist criterion of blameworthiness is appealing.
Now return to the proposal that, while the criterion of blameworthiness is the expectablist rule-consequentialist one, the correct criterion of moral wrongness is the actualist rule-consequentialist one. This proposal rejects Mill’s move of tying moral wrongness to blameworthiness. There is, however, a very strong objection to this proposal. What is the role and importance of moral wrongness if it is disassociated from blameworthiness?
In order to retain an obvious role and importance for moral wrongness, those committed to the expectablist rule-consequentialist criterion of blameworthiness are likely to endorse:
Simple expectablist rule-consequentialist criterion of moral wrongness: An act is morally wrong if and only if it is forbidden by the rules that would result in the greatest expected good.
Indeed, once we have before us the distinction between (a) the amount of value that actually results and (b) the rationally expected good, the full rule-consequentialist is likely to go for expectablist criteria of moral wrongness, blameworthiness, and decision procedures.
What if, as far as we can tell, no one code has greater expected value than its rivals? We will need to amend our expectablist criteria in order to accommodate this possibility:
Sophisticated expectablist rule-consequentialist criterion of moral wrongness: An act is morally wrong if and only if it is forbidden either by the rules that would result in the greatest expected good, or, if two or more alternative codes of rules are equally best in terms of expected good, by the one of these codes closest to conventional morality.
The argument for using closeness to conventional morality to break ties between otherwise equally promising codes begins with the observation that social change regularly has unexpected consequences. And these unexpected consequences usually seem to be negative. Furthermore, the greater the difference between a new code and the one already conventionally accepted, the greater the scope for unexpected consequences. So, as between two codes we judge to have equally high expected value, we should choose the one closest to the one we already know. (For discussion of the situation where two codes have equally high expected value and seem equally close to conventional morality, see Hooker 2008: 83–4.)
An implication is that people should make changes to the status quo where but only where these changes have greater expected value than sticking with the status quo. Rule-consequentialism manifestly has the capacity to recommend change. But it does not favor change for the sake of change.
Rule-consequentialism most definitely does need to be formulated so as to deal with ties in expected value. However, for most of the rest of this article, I will ignore this complication.
There are other important issues of formulation that rule-consequentialists face. One is the issue of whether rule-consequentialism should be formulated in terms of compliance with rules, in terms of acceptance of rules, or in terms of the teaching of rules. Admittedly, the most important consequence of teaching and accepting rules is compliance with them. And early formulations of rule-consequentialism did indeed explicitly mention compliance. For example, they said an act is morally wrong if and only if it is forbidden by rules the compliance with which will maximize the good (or the expected good). (See Austin 1832; Brandt 1959; M. Singer 1955, 1961.)
However, acceptance of a rule can have consequences other than compliance with the rule. As Kagan (2000: 139) writes, “once embedded, rules can have an impact on results that is independent of their impact on acts: it might be, say, that merely thinking about a set of rules reassures people, and so contributes to happiness.” (For more on what we might call these ‘beyond-compliance consequences’ of rules, see Sidgwick 1907: 405–6, 413; Lyons 1965: 140; Williams 1973: 119–20, 122, 129–30; Adams 1976: 470; Scanlon 1998: 203–4; Kagan 1998: 227–34.)
These consequences of acceptance of rules should most definitely be part of a cost-benefit analysis of rules. Formulating rule-consequentialism in terms of the consequences of acceptance allows them to be part of this analysis. Important consequences of communal acceptance of a set of rules include assurance, incentive, and deterrent effects. And consideration of assurance and incentive effects has played a large role in the development of rule-consequentialism (Harsanyi 1977, 1982: 56–61; 1993: 116–18; Brandt 1979: 271–77; 1988: 346ff [1992: 142ff.]; 1996: 126, 144; Johnson 1991, especially chs. 3, 4, 9). Hence, we should not be surprised that rule-consequentialism has gone from being formulated in terms of compliance with rules to being formulated in terms of acceptance of rules.
However, just as we need to move from thinking about the consequences of compliance to thinking about the wider consequences of acceptance, we need to go further. Focusing purely on the consequences of acceptance of rules ignores the “transition” costs for the teachers of teaching those rules, and the costs to the teaching’s recipients of internalizing these rules. And yet these costs can certainly be significant (Brandt 1963: section 4; 1967 [1992: 126]; 1983: 98; 1988: 346–47, 349–50 [1992: 140–143, 144–47]; 1996: 126–28, 145, 148, 152, 223).
Suppose, for example, that, once a fairly simple and relatively undemanding code of rules Code A has been accepted, the expected value of Code A would be n. Suppose a more complicated and demanding alternative Code B would have an expected value of \(n + 5\) once Code B has been accepted. So if we just consider the expected values of acceptance of the two alternative codes, Code B wins.
But now let us factor into our cost/benefit analysis of rival codes the relative costs of teaching the two codes and of getting them internalized by new generations. Since Code A is fairly simple and relatively undemanding, the cost of getting it internalized is −1. Since Code B is more complicated and demanding, the cost of getting it internalized is −7. So if our comparison of the two codes considers the respective costs of getting them internalized, Code A’s expected value is \(n-1\), and Code B’s is \(n+5-7\). Once we include the respective costs of getting the codes internalized, Code A wins.
As indicated, the costs of teaching a code successfully, so that the code is very widely internalized, are “transition costs”. But of course such transitions are always to one arrangement from another. The arrangement we are imagining the transition being to is the acceptance of a certain proposed code. The arrangement we are imagining the transition being from is … well, what?
One answer is that the arrangement from which the transition is supposed to be starting is whatever moral code the society happens to accept already. That might seem like the natural answer. However, there is a strong objection to this answer, namely that rule-consequentialism should not let the cost/benefit analysis of a proposed code be influenced by the costs of getting people to give up whatever rules they may have already internalised. This is for two reasons.
Most importantly, rule-consequentialist assessment of codes needs to avoid giving weight directly or indirectly to moral ideas that have their source in other moral theories but not in rule-consequentialism itself. Suppose people in a given society were brought up to believe that women should be subservient to men. Should rule-consequentialist evaluation of a proposed non-sexist code have to count the costs of getting people to give up the sexist rules they have already internalised so as to accept the new, non-sexist ones? Since the sexist rules are unjustifiable, that they were accepted should not be allowed to infect rule-consequentialist assessment.
Another reason for rejecting the answer we are considering is that it threatens to underwrite an unattractive relativism. Different societies may differ considerably in their extant moral beliefs. Thus, a way of assessing proposed codes that considers the costs of getting people already committed to some other code will end up having to countenance different transition costs to get to the same code. For example, the transition costs to a non-racist code are much higher from an already accepted racist code than from an already accepted non-racist one. Formulating rule-consequentialism so that it endorses the same code for 1960s Michigan as for 1960s Mississippi is desirable. (For opposing arguments that rule-consequentialism should be formulated so as to coutenance social relativism, see Kahn 2012; D. Miller 2014, 2021; T. Miller 2021.)
A way to avoid ending up with the social relativism just identified is to formulate rule-consequentialism in terms of acceptance by new generations of humans. The proposal might be that we compare the respective “teaching costs” of alternative codes, on the assumption that these codes will be taught to new generations of children, i.e., children who have not already been educated to accept a moral code. We are to imagine the children start off with natural (non-moral) inclinations to be very partial towards themselves and a few others. We should also assume that there is a cognitive cost associated with the learning of each rule.
These are realistic assumptions, with big implications. One is that a cost/benefit analysis of alternative codes of rules would have reason to favor simpler codes over more complex ones. Of course there can also be benefits from having more, or more complicated, rules. Yet there is probably a limit on how complicated or complex a code can be and still have greater expected value than simpler codes, once teaching costs are included.
Another implication concerns prospective rules about making sacrifices to help others. Since children start off focused on their own gratifications, getting them to internalize a kind of impartiality that requires them to make large sacrifices repeatedly for the sake of others would have extremely high costs. There would also, of course, be enormous benefits from the internalization of such a rule — predominately, benefits to others. Would the benefits be greater than the costs? At least since Sidgwick (1907: 434), many utilitarians have taken for granted that human nature is such that the real possibilities are (1) that human beings care passionately about some and less about each of the rest of humanity or (2) that human beings care weakly but impartially about everyone. In other words, what is not a realistic possibility, according to this view of human nature, is human beings’ caring strongly and impartially about everyone in the world. If this view of human nature is correct, then one enormous cost of successfully making people completely impartial is that doing so would leave them with only weak concerns.
Even if that picture of human nature is not correct, that is, even if making people completely impartial could be achieved without draining them of enthusiasm and passion, the cost of successfully making people care as much about every other individual as they do about themselves would be prohibitive. At some point on the spectrum running from complete partiality to complete impartiality, the costs of pushing and inducing everyone further along the spectrum outweigh the benefits.
A complication worth mentioning comes from the obvious point that moral education is developmental. How many rules are to be taught to children, how complicated these rules are, how demanding the rules are, and how to resolve conflicts among the rules depend on the developmental stage of the children. Hence, there can be conflict between the simpler and less demanding rules taught to the very young and the more elaborate, nuanced, and demanding rules taught at higher developmental stages. Of course, rule-consequentialism is best formulated in terms of the rules featured in the end of the development rather than the ones figuring in earlier stages.
While rule-consequentialist cost/benefit analyses of codes should count the cost of getting those codes internalised by new generations, such analyses should acknowledge that the internalisation will not be achieved in every last person (D. Miller 2021: 130). No matter how good the teaching is, the results will be imperfect. Some people will learn rules that differ to some degree from the ones that were taught, and some of these people will end up with very mistaken views about what is morally required, morally optional, or morally wrong. Other people will end up with insufficient moral motivation. Other people will end up with no moral motivation at all (psychopaths). Rule-consequentialism needs to have rules for coping with the inevitably imperfect results of moral teaching.
Such rules will crucially include rules about punishment. From a rule-consequentialist point of view, one point of punishment is to deter certain kinds of act. Another point of punishment is to get undeterred, dangerous people off the streets. Perhaps rule-consequentialism can admit that another point of punishment is to appease the primitive lust for revenge on the part of victims of such acts and their family and friends. Finally, there is the expressive and reinforcing power of rules about punishment.
Some ways of formulating rule-consequentialism make having rules about punishment difficult to explain. One such way of formulating rule-consequentialism is:
An act is morally wrong if and only if it is prohibited by the code of rules the full acceptance of which by absolutely everyone would produce the greatest expected good.
Imagine a world in which absolutely every adult human fully accepts rules forbidding (for example) physical attacks on the innocent, stealing, promise breaking, and lying. Suppose these rules have been internalized so deeply by everyone in this world that in this world there is complete compliance with these rules. Also assume that, if everyone in this world always complies with these rules, this perfect compliance becomes common knowledge. In this world, there would be little or no need for rules about punishment and thus little or no benefit from having such rules. But there are teaching and internalization costs associated with each rule taught and internalized. So there are teaching and internalization costs associated with the inclusion of any rule about punishment. The combination of costs without benefits is repellant. Therefore, for a world of complete compliance, the version of rule-consequentialism immediately above would not endorse rules about punishment.
We need a form of rule-consequentialism that includes rules for dealing with people who are not committed to the right rules, indeed even for people who are irredeemable. In other words, rule-consequentialism needs to be formulated so as to conceptualize society as containing some people insufficiently committed to the right rules, and even some people not committed to any moral rules. Here is a way of doing so:
An act is wrong if and only if it is prohibited by a code of rules the acceptance of which by the overwhelming majority of people in each new generation would have the greatest expected value.
Note that rule-consequentialism neither endorses nor condones the non-acceptance of the code by those outside the overwhelming majority. On the contrary, rule-consequentialism claims those people are morally mistaken. Indeed, the whole point of formulating rule-consequentialism this way is to make room for rules about how to respond negatively to such people.
Of course, the term “overwhelming majority” is very imprecise. Suppose we remove the imprecision by picking a precise percentage of society, say 90%. Picking any precise percentage as an obvious element of arbitrariness to it. For example, if we pick 90%, why not 89% or 91%?
Perhaps, we can argue for a number in the range of 90% as a reasonable compromise between two pressures. On the one hand, the percentage we pick should be close enough to 100% to retain the idea that, ideally, moral rules would be accepted by everyone. On the other hand, the percentage needs to be far enough short of 100% to leave considerable scope for rules about punishment. It seems that 90% is in a defensible range, given the need to balance those considerations. (For dissent from this, see Ridge 2006; for a reply to Ridge, see Hooker and Fletcher 2008. The matter receives further discussion in H. Smith 2010; Tobia 2013, 2018; T. Miller 2014, 2021; Toppinen 2016; Portmore 2017; Yeo 2017; Podgorski 2018; Perl 2021.)
Holly Smith (2010) pointed out that a cost/benefit analysis of the acceptance of any particular code by a positive percentage of the population less than 100% depends on what the rest of the population accepts and is disposed to do. Consider the following contrast. One imagined scenario is that 90% of the population accept one code, and the other 10% accept a very similar code, such that the two codes rarely diverge in practice. A second imagined scenario is that 90% of the population accept one code, and the other 10% accept various codes that frequently and dramatically conflict in practice with code accepted by 90%. Conflict resolution and enforcement are less important in the first imagined scenario than in the second. Hence, if rule-consequentialism is formulated in terms of the acceptance of a code by less than 100% of people, it matters what assumptions are made about whatever percentage of the population do not accept this code.
Some theorists propose that formulating rule-consequentialism in terms of the code the teaching of which has the greatest expected value is superior to formulating the theory in terms of either a fixed or variable acceptance rate for codes (Mulgan 2006, 141, 147; 2017, 291; 2020, 12–21; T. Miller 2016; 2021; D. Miller 2021). A “teaching formulation” of rule-consequentialism holds:
An act is morally prohibited, obligatory, or optional if and only if and because it is prohibited, obligatory, or permitted by the code of rules the teaching of which to everyone has at least as much expected value as the teaching of any other code.
Two clarifications are needed immediately. First, “everyone” here needs to be qualified so as not to include people “with significant, cognitive, or conative deficits” (D. Miller 2021: 10). Second, teaching a code to everyone is not assumed to lead to everyone’s internalization of this code. Hence, even if everyone is taught a certain code, foreseeably there will be some who internalize rules that are more or less different from the rules that were taught. There will also be some whose moral motivation is unreliable or even indiscernible. And there will be some who take themselves to be sceptics about moral rules and even about the rest of morality.
There are some definite advantages of teaching formulations of rule-consequentialism. To be sure, we have to build into our cost/benefit analysis that enough costs are incurred to make the teaching at least partly successful. In other words, we must insist that the teaching be successful enough to get enough people to internalize rules such that a good degree of cooperation and security results. But we do not need to be precise about what percentage of people taught this code remain amoralists, what percentage of people taught this code end up internalizing codes somewhat different from the one being taught, or what percentage end up insufficiently motivated to comply with the moral code they have internalized unless effective enforcement is in place (D. Miller 2021; T. Miller 2021).
Another advantage of teaching formulations is that the idea of teaching a code to everyone connects tightly to the idea that this code should be public knowledge. The idea that a moral code must be suitable for being public knowledge is very appealing (Baier 1958: 195–196; Rawls 1971: 133; Gert 1998: 10–13, 225, 239–240; Hill 2005; Cureton 2015; Pettit 2017: 39, 65, 102). And rule-consequentialists have championed the idea that moral rules are subject to this “publicity condition” (Brandt 1992: 136, 144; Hooker 2010; 2016, forthcoming; Parfit 2011, 2017a; D. Miller 2021: 131–32).
What rules will rule-consequentialism endorse? It will endorse rules prohibiting physically attacking innocent people, taking or harming the property of others, breaking one’s promises, and lying. It will also endorse rules requiring one to pay special attention to the needs of one’s family and friends, but more generally to be willing to help others with their (morally permissible) projects. A society where such rules are prominent in a public code would be likely to have more good in it than one lacking such rules.
The fact that these rules are endorsed by rule-consequentialism makes rule-consequentialism attractive. For, intuitively, these rules seem right. However, other moral theories endorse these rules as well. Most obviously, a familiar kind of moral pluralism contends that these intuitively attractive rules constitute the most basic level of morality, i.e., that there is no deeper moral principle underlying and unifying these rules. Call this view Rossian pluralism (in honor of its champion W.D. Ross (1930, 1939)).
Rule-consequentialism may agree with Rossian pluralism in endorsing rules against physically attacking the innocent, stealing, promise breaking, and rules requiring various kinds of loyalty and more generally doing good for others. But rule-consequentialism goes beyond Rossian pluralism by specifying an underlying unifying principle that provides impartial justification for such rules. Other moral theories try to do this too. Such theories include some forms of Kantianism (Audi 2001, 2004) and some forms of contractualism (Scanlon 1998; Parfit 2011; Levy 2013). In any case, the first way of arguing for rule-consequentialism is to argue that it specifies an underlying principle that provides impartial justification for intuitively plausible moral rules, and that no rival theory does this as well (Urmson 1953; Brandt 1967; Hospers 1972; Hooker 2000). (Attacks on this line of argument for rule-consequentialism include Stratton-Lake 1997; Thomas 2000; D. Miller 2000; Montague 2000; Arneson 2005; Moore 2007; Hills 2010; Levy 2014.)
This first way of arguing for rule-consequentialism might be seen as drawing on the idea that a theory is better justified to us to the extent that it increases coherence within our beliefs (Rawls 1951, 1971: 19–21, 46–51; DePaul 1987; Ebertz 1993; Sayre-McCord 1986, 1996). [See the entry on coherentist theories of epistemic justification.] But the approach might also be seen as moderately foundationalist in that it begins with a set of beliefs (in various moral rules) to which it assigns independent credibility though not infallibility (Audi 1996, 2004; Crisp 2000). [See the entry on foundationalist theories of epistemic justification.] Admittedly, coherence with our moral beliefs does not make a moral theory true, since our moral beliefs might be mistaken. Nevertheless, if a moral theory fails significantly to cohere with our moral beliefs, this undermines the theory’s ability to be justified to us.
Wolf (2016) and Copp (2020) argue that the meta-ethical view that morality is a social practice with a particular function might lead us to rule-consequentialism. However, Hooker (forthcoming) contends that the meta-ethical view that morality is a social practice with a particular function stands in need of justification in terms of whether it coheres with our considered moral principles and more specific considered moral judgements. In other words, that meta-ethical view about the function of morality needs to be judged in terms of whether it helps us achieve a reflective equilibrium among our beliefs or not.
The second way of arguing for rule-consequentialism is very different. It begins with a commitment to consequentialist assessment. With that commitment as a first premise, the point is then made that assessing acts indirectly, e.g., by focusing on the consequences of communal acceptance of rules, will in fact produce better consequences than assessing acts directly in terms of their own consequences (Austin 1832; Brandt 1963, 1979; Harsanyi 1982: 58–60; 1993; Riley 2000). After all, making decisions about what to do is the main point of moral assessment of acts. So if a way of morally assessing acts is likely to lead to bad decisions, or more generally lead to bad consequences, then, according to a consequentialist point of view, so much the worse for that way of assessing acts.
Earlier we saw that all consequentialists now accept that assessing each act individually by its expected value is in general a terrible procedure for making moral decisions. Agents should decide how to act by instead appealing to certain rules such as “don’t physically attack others”, “don’t steal”, “don’t break your promises”, “pay special attention to the needs of your family and friends”, and “be generally helpful to others”. And these are the rules that rule-consequentialism endorses. Many consequentialists, however, think this hardly shows that full rule-consequentialism is the best form of consequentialism. Once a distinction is made between, on the one hand, the best procedure for making moral decisions about what to do and, on the other hand, the criteria of moral rightness and wrongness, all consequentialists can admit that we need rule-consequentialism’s rules for our decision procedure. But consequentialists who are not rule-consequentialists contend that such rules play no role in the criterion of moral rightness. Hence these consequentialists reject what this article has called full rule-consequentialism.
However, whether the objection we have just been considering to the second way of arguing for rule-consequentialism is a good objection depends on whether it is legitimate to distinguish between procedures appropriate for making moral decisions and the criteria of moral rightness or wrongness. That matter remains contentious (Hooker 2010; de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014: ch. 10).
Yet the second way of arguing for rule-consequentialism runs into another and quite different objection. This objection is that the first step in this argument for rule-consequentialism is a commitment to consequentialist assessment. This first step itself needs justification. Why assume that assessing things in a consequentialist way is uniquely justified?
It might be said that consequentialist assessment is justified because promoting the impartial good has an obvious intuitive appeal. But that won’t do, since there are alternatives to consequentialist assessment that also have obvious intuitive appeal, for example, “act on the code that no one could reasonably reject”. What we need is a way of arguing for a moral theory that does not start by begging the question which kind of theory is most plausible.
A third way of arguing for rule-consequentialism is contractualist (Harsanyi 1953, 1955, 1982, 1993; Brandt 1979, 1988, 1996; Scanlon 1982, 1998; Parfit 2011; Levy 2013). Suppose we can specify reasonable conditions under which everyone would choose, or at least would have sufficient reason to choose, the same code of rules. Intuitively, such an idealized agreement would legitimate that code of rules. Now if those rules are the ones whose internalisation would maximise the expected good, contractualism is leading us to rule-consequentialism’s rules.
There are different views about what would be reasonable conditions for choosing among alternative possible moral rules. One view is that everyone’s impartiality would have to be insured by the imposition of a hypothetical “veil of ignorance” behind which no one knew any specific facts about himself or herself (Harsanyi 1953, 1955). Another view is that we should imagine that people would be choosing a moral code on the basis of (a) full empirical information about the different effects on everyone, (b) normal concerns (self-interested as well as altruistic), and (c) roughly equal bargaining power (Brandt 1979; cf. Gert 1998). Parfit (2011) proposes seeking rules that everyone has (personal or impartial) reason to choose or will that everyone accept. If impartial reasons are always sufficient even when opposed by personal ones, then everyone has sufficient reason to will that everyone accept the rules whose universal acceptance will have the best consequences impartially considered. Similarly, Levy (2013) supposes that no one could reasonably reject a code of rules that would impose on her burdens that add up to less than the aggregate of burdens that every other code would impose on others. Such arguments suggest the extensional equivalence of contractualism and rule-consequentialism. (For assessment of whether Parfit’s contractualist arguments for rule-consequentialism succeed, see J. Ross 2009; Nebel 2012; Hooker 2014. For similarities between rule-consequentialism and Scanlon’s contractualism, and the difficulty of deciding between these two theories, see Suikkanen 2022.)
An oft-repeated line of objection to rule-consequentialism from the mid 1960s to the mid 1990s was that this theory is fatally impaled on one or the other horn of the following dilemma: Either rule-consequentialism collapses into practical equivalence with the simpler act-consequentialism, or rule-consequentialism is incoherent.
Here is why some have thought rule-consequentialism collapses into practical equivalence with act-consequentialism. Consider a rule that rule-consequentialism purports to favor — e.g., “don’t steal”. Now suppose an agent is in some situation where stealing would produce more good than not stealing. If rule-consequentialism selects rules on the basis of their expected good, rule-consequentialism seems driven to admit that compliance with the rule “don’t steal except when … or … or …” is better than compliance with the simpler rule “don’t steal”. This point generalizes. In other words, for every situation where compliance with some rule would not produce the greatest expected good, rule-consequentialism seems driven to favor instead compliance with some amended rule that does not miss out on producing the greatest expected good in the case at hand. But if rule-consequentialism operates this way, then in practice it will end up requiring the very same acts that act-consequentialism requires.
If rule-consequentialism ends up requiring the very same acts that act-consequentialism requires, then rule-consequentialism is indeed in terrible trouble. Rule-consequentialism is the more complicated of the two theories. This leads to the following objection. What is the point of rule-consequentialism with its infinitely amended rules if we can get the same practical result much more efficiently with the simpler act-consequentialism?
Rule-consequentialists in fact have an excellent reply to the objection that their theory collapses into practical equivalence with act-consequentialism. This reply relies on the point that the best kind of rule-consequentialism ranks systems of rules not in terms of the expected good of complying with them, but in terms of the expected good of their teaching and acceptance. Now if a rule forbidding stealing, for example, has exception clause after exception clause after exception clause tacked on to it, the rule with all these exception clauses will provide too much opportunity for temptation to convince agents that one of the exception clauses applies, when in fact stealing would be advantageous to the agent. And this point about temptation will also undermine other people’s confidence that their property won’t be stolen. The same is true of most other moral rules: incorporating too many exception clauses could undermine people’s assurance that others will behave in certain ways (such as keeping promises and avoiding stealing).
Furthermore, when comparing alternative rules, we must also consider the relative costs of getting them internalised by new generations. Clearly, the costs of getting new generations to learn either an enormous number of rules or hugely complicated rules would be prohibitive. So rule-consequentialism will favor a code of rules without too many rules, and without too much complication within the rules.
There are also costs associated with getting new generations to internalise rules that require one to make enormous sacrifices for others with whom one has no particular connection. Of course, following such demanding rules will produce many benefits, mainly to others. But the costs associated with internalising such rules should be weighed against the benefits of following them. At some level of demandingness, the costs of getting such demanding rules internalised will outweigh the benefits that following them will produce. Hence, doing a careful cost/benefit analysis of internalising demanding rules will come out opposing rules’ being too demanding.
The code of rules that rule-consequentialism favours a code comprised of rules that are not too numerous, too complicated, or too demanding can sometimes lead people to do acts that do not have the greatest expected value. For example, following the simpler rule “Don’t steal” will sometimes produce less good consequences than following a more complicated rule “Don’t steal except when … or … or … or … or …”. Another example might be following a rule that allows people to give some degree of priority to their own projects, even when they could produce more good by sacrificing their own projects in order to help others. Still, rule-consequentialism’s contention is that bringing about widespread acceptance of a simpler and less demanding code, even if acceptance of that code does sometimes lead people to do acts with sub-optimal consequences, has higher expected value in the long run than bringing about widespread acceptance of a maximally complicated and demanding code. Since rule-consequentialism can tell people to follow this simpler and less demanding code, even when following it will not to maximise expected good, rule-consequentialism escapes collapse into practical equivalence to act-consequentialism.
To the extent that rule-consequentialism circumvents collapse, this theory is accused of incoherence. Rule-consequentialism is accused of incoherence for maintaining that an act can be morally permissible or even required though the act fails to maximise expected good. Behind this accusation must be the assumption that rule-consequentialism contains an overriding commitment to maximise the good. It is incoherent to have this overriding commitment and then to oppose an act required by the commitment. (For developments of this line of thought, see Arneson 2005; Card 2007; Wall 2009.)
In order to evaluate the incoherence objection to rule-consequentialism, we need to be clearer about the supposed location of an overriding commitment to maximize the good. Is this commitment supposed to be part of the rule-consequentialist agent’s moral psychology? Or is it supposed to be part of the theory rule-consequentialism?
Well, rule-consequentialists need not have maximizing the good as their ultimate and overriding moral goal. Instead, they could have a moral psychology as follows:
Their fundamental moral motivation is to do what is impartially defensible.
They believe acting on impartially justified rules is impartially defensible.
They also believe that rule-consequentialism is on balance the best account of impartially justified rules.
Agents with this moral psychology — i.e., this combination of moral motivation and beliefs — would be morally motivated to do as rule-consequentialism prescribes. This moral psychology is certainly possible. And, for agents who have it, there is nothing incoherent about following rules when doing so will not maximize the expected good.
So, even if rule-consequentialist agents need not have an overriding commitment to maximize expected good, does their theory contain such a commitment? No, rule-consequentialism is essentially the conjunction of two claims: (1) that rules are to be selected solely in terms of their consequences and (2) that these rules determine which kinds of acts are morally wrong. This is really all there is to the theory — in particular, there is not some third component consisting in or entailing an overriding commitment to maximize expected good.
Without an overriding commitment to maximize the expected good, there is nothing incoherent in rule-consequentialism’s forbidding some kinds of act, even when they maximize the expected good. Likewise, there is nothing incoherent about rule-consequentialism’s requiring other kinds of act, even when they conflict with maximizing the expected good. The best known objection to rule-consequentialism dies once we realize that neither the rule-consequentialist agent nor the theory itself contains an overriding commitment to maximize the good.
The viability of this defense of rule-consequentialism against the incoherence objection may depend in part on what the argument for rule-consequentialism is supposed to be. The defense seems less viable if the argument for rule-consequentialism starts from a commitment to consequentialist assessment. For starting with such a commitment seems very close to starting from an overriding commitment to maximize the expected good. The defence against the incoherence objection seems far more secure, however, if the argument for rule-consequentialism is that this theory does better than any other moral theory at specifying an impartial justification for intuitively plausible moral rules. (For more on this, see Hooker 2005, 2007; Rajczi 2016; Wolf 2016; Copp 2020.)
Another old objection to rule-consequentialism is that rule-consequentialists must be “rule-worshipers” — i.e., people who will stick to the rules even when doing so will obviously be disastrous.
The answer to this objection is that rule-consequentialism endorses a rule requiring one to prevent disaster, even if doing so requires breaking other rules (Brandt 1992: 87–8, 150–1, 156–7). To be sure, there are many complexities about what counts as a disaster. Think about what counts as a disaster when the “prevent disaster” rule is in competition with a rule against lying. Now think about what counts as a disaster when the “prevent disaster” rule is in competition with a rule against stealing, or even more when in competition with a rule against physically harming the innocent. Rule-consequentialism may need to be clearer about such matters. But at least it cannot rightly be accused of potentially leading to disaster.
An important confusion to avoid is to think that rule-consequentialism’s including a “prevent disaster” rule means that rule-consequentialism collapses into practical equivalence with maximising act-consequentialism. Maximising act-consequentialism holds that we should lie, or steal, or harm the innocent whenever doing so would produce even a little more expected good than not doing so would. A rule requiring one to prevent disaster does not have this implication. Rather, the “prevent disaster” rule comes into play only when there is a very much larger difference in the amounts of expected value at stake.
Woodard (2022) contends that the “prevent disaster” rule needs reconceptualizing. Many rules identify kinds of reasons. Examples are the reason to prevent harm, the reason not to steal, and the reason to keep your promises. But, Woodard holds, we should not think of the “prevent disaster” rule as being a rule identifying a kind of reason, which then is claimed to have overriding force. We should rather think that the “prevent disaster” rule distinguishes between cases in which the reason to prevent harm overrides opposing moral reasons and cases in which the reason to prevent harm is weaker than opposing reasons.
Even if Woodard is correct about this, a “prevent disaster” rule can be accused of vagueness and indeterminacy. Indeed, the line between cases in which the moral reason to prevent harm overrides opposing moral reasons and cases in which the moral reason to prevent harm is weaker than opposing moral reasons might well be indeterminant. Woollard (2022) argues that admitting such vagueness and indeterminacy does not weaken rule-consequentialism. And she draws on her earlier work (2015) to explain how rule-consequentialism’s “prevent disaster” rule need not impale the theory on the dilemma of either being overly demanding or placing a counterintuitive limit on a requirement to come to the aid of others.
From the mid 1960s until the mid 1990s, most philosophers thought rule-consequentialism couldn’t survive the objections discussed in the previous section. So, during those three decades, most philosophers didn’t bother with other objections to the theory. However, if rule-consequentialism has convincing replies to all three of the objections just discussed, then a good question is whether or not there are other fatal objections to the theory.
Some other objections try to show that, given the theory’s criterion for selecting rules, there are conditions under which it selects intuitively unacceptable rules. For example, Tom Carson (1991) argued that rule-consequentialism turns out to be extremely demanding in the real world. Mulgan (2001, esp. ch. 3) agreed with Carson about that, and went on to argue that, even if rule-consequentialism’s implications in the actual world are fine, the theory has counterintuitive implications in possible worlds. If Mulgan were right about that, this would cast doubt on rule-consequentialism’s claim to explain why certain demands are appropriate in the actual world. Debate about such matters continues (Hooker 2003; Lawlor 2004; Parfit 2011, 2017a, 2017b; Woollard 2015: 181–205; Rajczi 2016; Portmore 2017; Podgorski 2018; D. Miller 2021; Perl 2021, 2022). And Mulgan has become a developer of rule-consequentialism rather than a critic (Mulgan 2006, 2009, 2015, 2017, 2020).
A related objection to rule-consequentialism is that rule-consequentialism makes the justification of familiar rules contingent on various empirical facts, such as what human nature is like, and how many people there are in need or in positions to help. The objection to rule-consequentialism is that some familiar moral rules are necessarily, not merely contingently, justified (McNaughton and Rawling 1998; Gaut 1999, 2002; Montague 2000; Suikkanen 2008). A sibling of this objection is that rule-consequentialism makes the justification of rules depend on the wrong facts (Arneson 2005; Portmore 2009; cf. Woollard 2015: esp. pp. 185–86, 203–205; 2022).
The mechanics of teaching new codes throws up serious questions for forms of rule-consequentialism that count the costs of getting rules internalised by new generations. As explained earlier, limiting the targets of the teaching to new generations is meant to avoid having to count the costs of getting rules internalised by existing generations of people who have already internalised some other moral rules and ideas. But can we come up with a coherent description of those who are supposed to do the teaching of these new generations? If the teachers are imagined to have already internalised the ideal code themselves, then how is that supposed to have happened? If these teachers are imagined not to have already internalised the ideal code, then there will be costs associated with the conflict between the ideal code and whatever they have already internalised. (This objection was formulated by John Andrews, Robert Ehman, and Andrew Moore. Cf. Levy 2000; D. Miller, 2021.) A related objection is that rule-consequentialism has not yet been formulated in a way that enables it to deal plausibly with conflicts among rules (Eggleston 2007). But see Copp 2020; D. Miller 2021; Woodard 2022.
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