Notes to Constitutionalism

1. Unless otherwise indicated, the word ‘power’ should be taken to mean normative power of the kind associated with the theory developed by legal theorist Wesley Hohfeld. A normative power, on this understanding, is the capacity or ability to effect a change in the relevant normative landscape of rights, duties, privileges, and so on. When a legislature enacts a new law it exercises its normative power to alter existing legal rights, duties, etc., or create new ones that did not exist before that legal power was exercised.

2. Unless otherwise indicated, the term “constitutional” (and its cognate terms “constitutionalism”, “constitution”, and so on) should henceforth be understood to carry this richer meaning.

3. Whether Locke and Hobbes are properly invoked in this way is perhaps open to question. There is reason to believe that Locke’s argument defends political, as opposed to strictly legal, limitations upon the sovereign. It might be argued that effective political limitation requires legal limitation as well, but this does not seem strictly necessary.

4. “For to be subject to laws is to be subject to the commonwealth — that is to the sovereign — that is, to himself, which is not subjection but freedom from the laws” (Leviathan, Ch. 29, 255).

5. What Parliament does “no authority upon Earth can undo.” (Sir William Blackstone) Three points are worth stressing here. First, it is not at all clear that the British Parliament ever did possess the unlimited sovereignty ascribed to it by Blackstone. Although the United Kingdom has no written constitution of the kind one finds in the United States, legal scholars are generally in agreement that Britain has, for centuries, contained an unwritten constitution arising from a variety of sources, including long-standing principles of the common law and landmark judicial decisions concerning the appropriate limits of Parliament’s legislative power (see Section 4). Second, the British constitution also includes a number of written documents adopted at various points in its political history, a primary example being Magna Carta (1215 C.E.). Third, it is arguable that the people of the United Kingdom, in virtue of their membership in the European Community and the fact that British Courts now enforce, as binding, Community law, have in fact relinquished their unlimited sovereignty. If the law of member states (e.g., France, Denmark, and the UK) must now be consistent with Community law, and the latter is immune from legislative change or repeal through legislative acts on the part of member governments, then it can be argued that the sovereignty of the member states within the European Community has been replaced (or supplemented) by the sovereignty of “the people of Europe.”

6. Leviathan, Part 1, Ch. 13. Although Hobbes’s sovereign is constitutionally unlimited, Hobbes insisted that individuals retained the right to self-preservation. It would be incoherent, Hobbes thought, for individuals to give up that right the protection of which is the very reason people have for creating a sovereign power. Although individuals retain the right to self-preservation, it is also true that Hobbes’ unlimited sovereign has the right to take anyone’s life if, in the sovereign’s judgment, this is necessary to preserve the well being of the commonwealth.

7. Constitutional conventions are explored in Section 6. Although entrenchment is an almost universal characteristic of modern constitutions, and although one could plausibly argue that it is practically desirable, it may not be absolutely necessary. Some constitutional norms are ordinary statutes amenable to introduction and change by ordinary legislative procedures. Indeed, some constitutions are almost wholly statutory, e.g., the constitution of New Zealand.

8. Two different procedures for amending The United States Constitution are specified in Article V. First, amendment can take place by a vote of two-thirds of both the House of Representatives and the Senate followed by a ratification of three-fourths of the various state legislatures. This first method of amendment is the only one that has ever been used. Second, the Constitution might be amended by a Convention called for this purpose by two-thirds of the state legislatures. The Convention’s proposed amendments must later be ratified by three-fourths of the state legislatures. In Canada, the process of amendment is laid out in Part V (sections 38 to 49) of the Constitution Act, 1982. The general amendment procedure is commonly referred to as the 7/50 formula (section 38.(1)). This requires resolutions of the Senate, the House of Commons, and the legislative assemblies of at least two thirds of the provinces (7) that have at least 50% of the population of Canada as a whole. These cover, e.g., amendments in relation to the powers of the Senate and the method of selecting Senators. Other amendments relating, for example, to the Office of the Governor General or the composition of the Supreme Court, require unanimous consent of the Senate, the House of Commons, and the legislative assembly of each province.

9. The matter is far from clear. There is a long-standing tradition within British Parliamentary systems of governance according to which Parliament alone possesses authority to create, interpret and implement its own constitutional limits. And whatever its faults, there seems little doubt that Parliaments modeled on the British system typically act responsibly in observing their own constitutional limits.

10. This is not, incidentally, Rubenfeld’s reason.

11. For an example where the distinction between constitutional law and convention served as the basis of a court ruling, see the Canadian Patriation Reference, [1981] 1 S.C.R. at 870. For discussion of this case, and for further elaboration of the difference between constitutional law and convention, see Waluchow 2011.

12. Henceforth, and unless otherwise indicated, all uses of the word ‘constitution’ (and cognate terms) should be understood as referring to constitutional law.

13. This is not to deny that deep controversy can also arise over the meaning and import of less abstract constitutional provisions. In the United States, for example, debates sometimes arise over the meaning of the so-called “Commerce Clause.” Article 1, Section 8, Clause 3 of the U.S. Constitution gives Congress the power “to regulate commerce with foreign nations, and among the several states, and with the Indian tribes.” The US Congress has often used the Commerce Clause to justify exercises of legislative power with respect to the activities of states and their citizens. This has, in turn, led to significant dispute regarding the proper balance of power between the federal government and the states. Despite the importance of such debates, and unless the context indicates otherwise, our focus in discussing constitutional interpretation will be exclusively on abstract civil rights provisions. It is in terms of these that the most deeply felt differences of opinion emerge in their starkest form and bring sharply into focus differences of opinion on the nature and authority of constitutions.

14. Again, this is not to deny that disputes also arise over less abstract, morally charged constitutional provisions, such as the US Commerce Clause. Nor is it to deny that the same deep divisions lie behind these such disputes.

15. To be both clear and fair, virtually all originalists believe that original understandings are sometimes underdetermined. They fail to determine concrete results and decisions about particular cases and issues. When this difficulty pops up in a constitutional case, many originalists argue that the judge must sometimes resort to a type of reasoning that is different from constitutional interpretation. For example, Keith Whittington (1999a) argues that the American Constitution has a dual nature. The first aspect is the degree to which the Constitution acts as a binding set of rules that can be neutrally interpreted and enforced by the courts against government actors. This is the process of constitutional interpretation and the desired neutrality is achieved by having judges focus on original, public understandings of the Constitution’s terms. But according to Whittington, the US Constitution also serves to guide political actors in the process of making public policy. In so doing, the Constitution is dependent on political actors, both to formulate authoritative, concrete constitutional requirements and rules and to enforce them in future cases. Whittington describes this process as constitutional construction as opposed to constitutional interpretation. The originalist’s distinction between these two processes will be further discussed in Section 8 below.

16. Brown v. Board of Education ((1954) 347 U.S. 483. According to the US Supreme Court, “[t]he ”separate but equal“ doctrine adopted in Plessy v. Ferguson (1896) 163 U.S. 537), has no place in the field of public education.” Plessy, decided in 1896, essentially affirmed the original understanding of ‘equal protection’ as being fully consistent with that doctrine.

17. Roe v. Wade ((1973) 410 U.S. 113).

18. Dobbs v. Jackson Women’s Health Organization, No. 19-1392, 597 U.S. (2022).

19. This is a point Scalia himself seems to acknowledge. “I hasten to confess that in a crunch I may prove a faint-hearted originalist. I cannot imagine myself, any more than any other federal judge, upholding a statute that imposes the punishment of flogging” (Scalia 1989, 864). The assumption underlying Scalia’s comment is that the original understanding of the 8th Amendment endorsed flogging as an acceptable form of punishment. The 8th Amendment states that “Excessive bail shall not be required, nor excessive fines imposed, nor cruel and unusual punishments inflicted.”

20. Some hard critics, e.g., those within what is popularly known as the critical legal studies movement, are prepared to broaden their critique to cover areas of law outside constitutional practice, such as tort or contract law. See, e.g., Unger (1986).

21. “I no longer believe that constitutional theory constrains, or is supposed to constrain judges. Rather…it serves primarily to provide a set of rhetorical devices that judges can deploy as they believe effective.” (Tushnet 1992, 759).

22. Lochner v. New York, 198 U.S. 45 (1905).

23. Judicial review need not focus on compatibility with constitutional standards. For instance, it might be based on standards of reasonableness or fairness developed by judges in contract or administrative law. Our focus will be on judicial review as it features in constitutional practice, that is, on what we have been calling ‘constitutional review’.

24. The phrase ‘tyranny of the majority’ was first coined by French political theorist Alexis de Tocqueville in Democracy in America and later made famous by by John Stuart Mill in On Liberty.

25. Among the most notorious, contemporary examples is Bush v. Gore 531 U.S. 98 (2000) where, in a 5-4 decision the United State Supreme Court put a stop to a recount of Florida votes cast in the very close 2000 Presidential election. Had the recount proceeded it’s quite possible that the Democratic Party candidate, Al Gore, would have won over the Republican Party candidate, George W. Bush.

Copyright © 2023 by
Wil Waluchow <>
Dimitrios Kyritsis <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free