Notes to Causal Theories of Mental Content

1. Theories of mental content are typically supposed to work for all kinds of attitudes towards contents, e.g., for belief, hope, desire, wonder, but for simplicity of exposition we will generally not mention these other attitudes.

2. Sometimes the terms “assigned” and “unassigned” or “conventional” and “non-conventional” are used to mark this distinction. Underived meaning is also sometimes described as “original” or “intrinsic”.

3. The locus classicus for this is Grice (1948).

4. The natural/non-natural distinction is perhaps not entirely independent of the derived/non-derived distinction. Thoughts, beliefs, desires, etc., are typically assumed to have non-natural, non-derived meanings; smoke and tree rings might be assumed to have natural, non-derived meanings; and symbols in artificial languages (such as those of first-order logic), are typically assumed to have non-natural, derived meaning; however, it is unclear that anything could bear natural, assigned meaning.

5. Causal theories, broadly construed as they are here, differ among themselves on just exactly what relation is supposed to hold between “X” and X. Some hypothesize a causal relation between individuals (e.g., Stampe (1977) others a nomic connection between properties (e.g., Fodor, 1987, 1990a), and others an informational connection (e.g., Dretske, 1981, 1988).

6. It is sometimes suggested that the disjunction problem and how it is possible to have false beliefs are, in fact, two sides of the same coin. This may be too quick. Consider cases of type III). A token of “What kind of animal is named ‘Fido’?” can lead to a token of “X” that means dog, but one would not wish to say that the person queried has a false belief. Here the person queried does not have a false belief, but there remains the question why the question is not among the content-determining causes of “X”. That is, one can apparently have the disjunction problem without a problem of false belief.

7. When causal theories appeal to one or another notion of function, they blur the line between causal and teleological theories of mental content.

8. The present point is often made by way of different example. One might think that what the frog’s eye tells the frog’s brain is that there is a fly at a particular spatial location and that this is because the mechanisms of the frog’s eye are selected for their ability to specify the spatial location of flies. The troubling rival hypothesis, however, is that the frog’s eye tells the frog’s brain that there is a black spot at a particular spatial location and that the mechanisms of the frog’s eye are selected for their ability to specify the spatial location of black dots, and, by the way, because flies look like black dots, the snapping at black dots gets the frog flies, hence increases their reproductive fitness.

9. In truth, the matter is not so simple. Fodor (1987, 109) gives one account of how the theory avoids the disjunction problem, where Fodor (1990, 91) gives another. Both differ from the story given here.

10. This is actually the second putative solution Rupert (1999) gives to the disjunction problem. The first is that dogs are more efficient in causing “X”s than are foxes on a dark night at a distance. (We can illustrate this with our biography, by letting “X” = “X”1, dog = K2, and fox = K1.) This argument, however, only shows, at most, that “X” can’t mean fox, rather than dog. It doesn’t show that “X” can’t mean dog or fox-on-a-dark-night-at-a-distance. What he perhaps could have added, but did not, however, is that, if we grant that the dog efficiency is greater than the fox efficiency, then the (dog + fox) efficiency will be less than the dog efficiency. Thus, efficiency considerations alone will lead “X” to mean dog. This extended argument, however, would contradict what Rupert wrote regarding the restriction of his theory to natural kinds. In presenting the second argument, Rupert suggested that he needed the restriction of the Best Test Theory to natural kinds in order to block the disjunction problem. As has just been argued, however, this is not clear, given his other assumptions.

11. Strictly speaking, Mendelovici does not focus on causal connections, but tracking connections. Also, the discussion of geometric perception in McLaughlin, (2016), might suggest other candidates.

12. Rupert (2001) has a lengthy reply to the foregoing argument.

13. Rupert (2008) challenges the first premise of this argument.

Copyright © 2017 by
Fred Adams <>
Ken Aizawa <>

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