Notes to Teleological Theories of Mental Content

1. Throughout this entry, our focus will be on descriptive (‘belief-like’) representations. This reflects the fact that discussions of descriptive representations have dominated the teleosemantics literature, although there has been some work on directive (‘desire-like’) representations as well (see, e.g., Millikan’s and Papineau’s accounts of desire content that we will come back to in later sections, and Martínez 2011; Shea 2018, ch. 7; Schulte 2019b; Butlin 2020b).

2. We allude here to the difference between mere malfunctioning and the inability to function (or lack of a disposition to function). For more on this helpful distinction, which is often neglected in the literature, cf. Hundertmark (2018, ch. 5).

3. Buller (1998) goes even a step further and suggests that functions do not require past selection at all, but only past contributions to fitness that help to explain a trait’s reproduction. (Thanks to Marc Artiga for the pointer.)

4. Neander (2017, ch. 3) even argues that a functional analyses in biology, properly understood, presuppose an etiological conception of function.

5. Readers who would like to read more on this and other theories of function could turn to several volumes of readings that have appeared (see especially Allen et al. 1998, Buller 1999 and Ariew et al. 2002) or to Garson’s (2016) concise overview of biological functions.

6. See also Jacob (1997). A similar view is proposed by Matthen (1988), who maintains that the content of a perceptual representation is what it has the function to “detect”. In it unclear, however, whether Matthen’s theory is a version of informational teleosemantics since the notion of detection is not further specified.

7. Although indication is often underwritten by a causal regularity such that Cs cause Rs, Dretske tells us that this not a requirement. Cs and Rs might also have a common cause, for instance. Indication does require, however, that the co-occurrence of Rs and Cs is not merely coincidental.

8. For seminal discussions of Dretske’s account of the causal efficacy of content, see the essays in McLaughlin (1991); for a more recent perspective, see Hofmann & Schulte (2014).

9. Millikan’s ‘cooperation requirement’ for producers and consumers has been questioned (Sterelny 1995: 254–255; Stegmann 2009). However, the putative counterexamples to this requirement are certain kinds of animal signals, so they are not directly relevant here, given our focus on mental representations.

10. This can be illustrated with the bee dance example (discussed below). Suppose that a particular bee dance represents that there is nectar located at a distance of 100 m in a direction of 30° clockwise from the direction of the sun. Clearly, it is not strictly necessary for the dance to correspond to (co-occur with) nectar that is actually present at that location for the consumer bee to fulfill her function (collecting nectar). After all, even if there is no nectar at the indicated location, the bee might still find nectar by accident on her way there. Hence, correspondence is only necessary if the consumer bee is to perform her function in the Normal way, rather than by accident.

11. In a bit more detail, the mapping rule takes us from (a) dances with an orientation of x° (clockwise) relative to the vertical and a waggle run length of y cm to (b) nectar positions with a direction of x° (clockwise) relative to the direction of the sun and a distance of k × y cm (where k is a constant whose value is to be determined experimentally).

12. Personal communication; cf. also Millikan (ms).

13. Although Millikan never explicitly formulates this answer, there is a basis for it in her writings. In her (2004, 76), for instance, she states that “[v]ariations in the world must correspond to variations in the sign that produce adaptive variations in the activities of the sign’s interpreters or consumers” (our emphasis). This suggests thatin basic cases, contents are constituted exclusively by the states of affairs that Normally vary with the representations in question, which is only true of conditions which are specific to particular representational states, not of omnipresent beneficial background conditions (cf. also Millikan 1989b, 287).

14. The notion of a trait’s “specific function” (or “most specific function”) that Papineau uses here was introduced into the debate by Neander (1995).

15. Garson (2019b) criticizes Schulte’s account and suggests that Neander should adopt a Drestkean strategy (along the lines of the strategy discussed in section 3.1) for solving the distality problem. For a response, cf. Schulte (2022).

16. Shea defines correlational information in terms of conditional probabilities, but adopts an analysis that is less strict than Dretske’s. According to Shea (2018, 76), p carries correlational information about q iff P(q|p)≠P(q). This means that, in Shea’s terminology, p carries information “about qr” both if p raises the probability of q, i.e. if P(q|p) > P(q), and if p lowers the probability of q, i.e. if P(q|p) < P(q).

17. Abrams’ (2005) account is an intermediate case: while he rejects the strong etiological theory usually presupposed in standard teleosemantics, his suggested alternative, the “ancestral history” theory, seems to qualify as a weak etiological theory (in the terminology of Buller 1998).

18. There are several other important problems that we cannot address here, but that should at least be mentioned: the problem of explaining productivity (Martínez 2013b; Leahy 2016; Hundertmark 2021), the problem of reliable misrepresentation (Mendelovici 2013; Artiga 2013), the problem of normal misperception (Matthen 1988; Ganson 2018) and the problem of evolutionary beneficial misrepresentations (Burge 2010, 301–303; Graham 2014; Papineau 2016).

19. Fodor once devised a teleological theory of mental content (published years later, as Fodor 1990a). However, he quickly repudiated the idea and has since been one of the most vigorous critics of the general idea.

20. Not everyone accepts this conclusion. Price (1998, 2001) claims that, contrary to what has just been said, there is a unique, correct function ascription for each trait. She elaborates a number of principles to isolate these ascriptions, which form the basis for her theory of content. Enç (2002) endorses Price’s contention that function ascriptions must be determinate if any teleological theory of content is to succeed but raises problems for her attempt to show that this is indeed the case.

21. Braddon-Mitchell and Jackson (1997) have argued that this ‘real nature’ response is not available to proponents of teleological theories of content. For two different responses to this challenge, cf. Papineau (2001) and Schulte (2020).

22. Burge’s objection is not entirely new. A similar kind of argument is employed by Sterelny (1995) against Millikan’s teleosemantic theory, and by Ramsey (2007, ch. 4) against the “receptor notion” of representation.

23. A different argument for the same claim is offered by Ganson (2020).

24. The naturalistic analysis of constancy mechanisms provided in Schulte (2015) is rather sketchy; for a more elaborate account, cf. Schulte (2021).

25. For another teleosemantic account of representation that also includes a constancy-mechanism requirement, cf. de Souza Filho (2018).

26. There is a related, but even more basic problem that has been neglected until recently. As we have seen, most mainstream teleological theories rely on a producer-consumer (or ‘sender-receiver’) model of representation, but it is unclear whether this model is appropriate for complex information-processing systems like, e.g., vertebrate brains (Cao 2012, Godfrey-Smith 2013). Artiga (2016b) suggests that proponents of ‘sender-receiver’ teleosemantics can solve this problem by incorporating new insights from evolutionary game theory.

27. In her (2017), Millikan replaces talk of ‘concepts’ with talk of ‘unicepts’ and ‘unitrackers’, where unicepts are components of beliefs and other propositional attitudes, while unitrackers are mechanisms for “same-tracking” something. With respect to the issues discussed here, however, the theory remains substantially the same. According to Millikan (2017), conceptions play no role in determining the referents of unicepts; instead, the referent of unicepts are determined by the functions of their associated unitrackers (cf. Millikan [2017, 8]: “The ‘target’ of a unitracker, that which it tracks when functioning properly, is what its coordinate unicept is of, the referent of that unicept”).

Copyright © 2022 by
Peter Schulte <>
Karen Neander

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free