Notes to Nicolaus Copernicus

1. Swerdlow and Neugebauer (4) used the bindings to establish Copernicus’s acquisition of the 1492 Venice edition of the Alfonsine Tables and the 1490 Augsburg edition of Regiomontanus’s Tabulae directionum, two very important books for astronomical calculation, to this period. They were bound together with sections of other astronomical works. A second volume contained the 1482 Venice edition of Euclid’s Elements with the commentary by Campanus and the 1485 Venice edition of the astrological treatise In iudiciis astrorum by the Arab author Ali ibn Abir-Rijal.

2. The debate on the validity of astrology became particularly vociferous after the publication of Pico’s Disputations against Judicial Astrology in 1494. (See, e.g., Shumaker, chapter 1.) Given the facts that Copernicus’s undergraduate and medical programs most likely included astrology and Copernicus’s main publication was in the field of astronomy, his silence on the subject of astrology, pro or con, is surprising.

3. There is no proof that Copernicus took his heliocentric idea from Aristarchus, as Gingerich (1993, 185–92) rightly argued. Arthur Koestler (212–13) had claimed that Copernicus’s idea for the heliocentric model was taken from Aristarchus, suggesting that Copernicus did not deserve credit for the idea. Koestler’s The Sleepwalkers is a popularized version of the lives and works of Copernicus, Kepler, and Galileo; though extremely readable, it is simplistic, judgmental, and ahistorical. Yet, its points must be addressed. It is still a very popular book and has often been a stimulus to the study of the history of science in this period; witness Gingerich (2004, vii-viii), one of the most respected scholars of Copernicus and Kepler. Scholars in cultural studies often depend heavily on Koestler. For example, Hallyn (50) used an erroneous assertion by Koestler that Copernicus approved the anonymous preface to On the Revolutions to bolster his argument about irony. Lastly, many scholars either tacitly or vociferously have had a running debate with Koestler in their works; witness the title of Gingerich’s 2004 volume. Therefore, this article will continue to call attention to points that refute Koestler.

4. “In De revolutionibus he uses the form of Tusi’s device with inclined axes for the inequality of the precession and the variation of the obliquity of the ecliptic, and in both the Commentariolus and De revolutionibus he uses it for the oscillation of the orbital planes in the latitude theory…The planetary models for longitude in the Commentariolus are all based upon the models of Ibn ash-Shatir – although the arrangement for the inferior planets is incorrect – while those for the superior planets in De revolutionibus use the same arrangement as Urdi’s and Shirazi’s model, and for the inferior planets the smaller epicycle is converted into an equivalent rotating eccentricity that constitutes a correct adaptation of Ibn ash-Shatir’s model. In both the Commentariolus and De revolutionibus the lunar model is identical to Ibn ash-Shatir’s and finally in both works Copernicus makes it clear that he was addressing the same physical problems of Ptolemy’s models as his predecessors.” (Swerdlow and Neugebauer, 47; see also Saliba, chapter 6). On the other hand, Blåsjö claimed there was enough difference between Copernicus’s planetary models and those of the late Islamic astronomers that Copernicus could have derived them directly from ancient models. Goddu (476–86) also wondered why there is no proof of their transmission from East to West. But Morrison suggested that Jewish travelers, like the scholar Moses Galeano, created intellectual links between the Islamic world and the Italian peninsula just about the time when Copernicus was studying there.

5. Swerdlow categorically rejected this assessment, though he agreed that Copernicus was bothered by Ptolemy’s violation of uniform circular motion. He wrote, “The common belief that Copernicus did away with the equant, or wished to do away with the equant, is simply false, for it was as fundamental to his planetary theory as to Ptolemy’s, and even in the time of Brahe and Kepler, there was no observational distinction between the models of Ptolemy and Copernicus. The motivation for Copernicus’s model was entirely physical: to preserve the uniform rotation of spheres” (Swerdlow, 2000, 167). Swerdlow (1973) preferred attributing it to Regiomontanus’s transformation of the eccentric models of the planets in the geocentric model. Whether or not Copernicus accomplished that goal of eliminating the equant, or whether or not it made any observational difference is immaterial because he believed that the equant had to be eliminated, and he gave that as a motivation for his reform of astronomy. Moreover, Copernicus believed that he had succeeded in eliminating the equant, as did his contemporaries. It was not until the end of the sixteenth century that Maestlin discovered the hidden equant in Copernicus’s models (see Goddu 383, n. 52). There is irony, of course, in Copernicus’s anxiety to eliminate Ptolemy’s equant, for Kepler had to reinstate it in order to derive his first two laws of planetary motion. But this, too, should not be a reason to diminish the importance of eliminating the equant for Copernicus. Swerdlow (2017) also rejected Ragep’s suggestion (2016) that Copernicus could have arrived at the heliocentric system from Ibn al-Shatir’s models. Westman (2011, chap. 3) followed up on Goldstein’s suggestion (2002) that Copernicus was motivated by the more logical order of the planets under the heliocentric system and maintained that Copernicus used the argument from order to preserve astrology from Pico’s attack. The problem with Goldstein’s proposal, however, is that it does not explain how Copernicus would have known about the issue of the order before he postulated the heliocentric system.

6. Kuhn, 128–31, and Yates, 153–54, turned to the popularity during the Renaissance of Neoplatonism and Hermetism respectively and their supposed glorification of the sun as a possible reason for Copernicus’s adoption of the heliocentric model. But given the paucity of Copernicus’s references to Neoplatonism and a single incorrect reference to Hermes Trismegistus, this assumes that Copernicus must have been under the influence of Neoplatonism simply because it was one of the many philosophies available to him and this seemed most likely. Kuhn also suggested that the Ptolemaic model had developed too many circles and had become too cumbersome, but this simply is not true. In fact, Copernicus’s model had more circles. On the other hand, if Kuhn and Yates thought that he was influenced by being at the forefront of Renaissance thought, Koestler thought that he was too conservative, as proved by his Aristotelianism. But Koestler’s belief that Aristotelianism was conservative, and therefore bad, came from his associating Aristotle with medieval scholastic thought, which Koestler believed to be bad. In fact, neither Aristotelianism nor medieval scholastic thought was inherently conservative nor progressive, neither good nor bad. They were both very important in the history of all western thought and both contributed much to scientific thought as well.

7. Koestler titled his section on Copernicus ‘The Timid Canon’ and throughout mocked him for his cowardice. But Copernicus was rightly concerned that his observations and mathematical proofs should be adequate to his task, and like all scholars he needed a colleague who could evaluate them.

8. Swerdlow and Neugebauer (58) claimed that “[o]ne of the principal reasons Copernicus adopted the heliocentric theory is that it gives the distances of the planets from the mean sun unambiguously, and it gives them without making any assumptions about nested spheres.” Goldstein considered this relationship between the length of the orbit and the distance from the sun the real impetus for Copernicus’s move to the heliocentric system. While it is true that this is a major advantage of that system, there is nothing to suggest that it is why Copernicus turned to the system. Westman (2011, 100–05), based in part on the importance of this concept, argued that Copernicus’s response to one of Pico’s criticisms in the Disputations was the genesis of the heliocentric system. In book 10 Pico claimed that the inability of astrologers to establish the correct order of the inner planets was further proof of its falsehood. Heliocentricism, in this reading, established the order and thereby became the savior of astrology, which was Copernicus’s intent. Problems with this hypothesis arise because not only did Copernicus fail to mention astrology, but Rheticus, who did refer to it in the First Report, wrote that Copernicus’s work answered Pico’s criticisms in books 8 and 9. There was no mention of book 10.

9. Swerdlow and Neugebauer provided an excellent commentary on the mathematics of On the Revolutions.

10. Swerdlow and Neugebauer (24) listed several books from Petreius: Regiomontanus’s De triangulis omnimodis (1533), Apianus’s Instrumentum primi mobilis and Jabir ibn Aflah’s De astronomia (1534), and Vitelo’s Perspectiva (1535). Other books that Rheticus definitely brought with him were the first printing in Greek of Euclid’s Elements with commentary by Proclus on book 1 (Basel, 1533) and Ptolemy’s Almagest (or Syntaxis in Greek) with Theon’s commentary (Basel, 1538). Swerdlow and Neugebauer conjectured that he also brought Regiomontanus’s Problemata XXIX saphaeae instrumenti astronomici (1534), Camerarius’s first Greek edition and partial translation of Ptolemy’s Tetrabiblos (1536), and Schšner’s edition of Al-Farghani and Al-Battani with Regiomontanus’s ‘Oration’ on the mathematical sciences (1537).

11. Koestler (176) claimed that the omission of Rheticus’s name in the dedication “killed the apostle in Rheticus.” In fact, Rheticus did not lose interest in promoting the Copernican system after the publication of On the Revolutions. It would have been preposterous for Rheticus to expect Copernicus to mention him in a dedication to the pope, and Rheticus was with Copernicus when he wrote the dedication. In fact, given the religious tensions in Europe at the time, the bond between the Catholic canon and the Protestant minister is notable – and heartening.

12. Westman (2011,31) noted that Copernicus used the term mathematici, which is translated here as ‘astronomers’. This word was often used as a synonym for astrologer, and Westman suggested that this showed that Copernicus identified with astrologers.

13. Koestler’s claim (217) that “the Copernican theory was practically ignored until the opening of the seventeenth century” is simply untrue. For the most effective – and affecting – rebuttal, see Gingerich 2004.

14. As Rosen (1984, 182–83) noted, there are differing accounts of what Luther said.

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