Notes to Cosmological Argument

1. I include the disjunct “cause or explanation” because not all versions of the cosmological argument invoke the Principle of Sufficient Reason expressed in the Enlightenment sense. The Thomistic arguments emphasize a causal account. Since an explanation is usually (but not always) given in causal language, we will not exploit the difference.

2. We will not address Aquinas’s arguments. However, it is important to note that many contemporary treatments completely ignore the Aristotelian metaphysical roots of his arguments the he provides outside of Question Two of the Summa Theologica (e.g., Sobel 2004; Oppy 2006: 98–107). Kenny (1969) remains an important exception.

3. An alternate explanation to dark energy is that, according to string theory, the universe has multiple dimensions and that gravity is lost as gravitons pass from one dimension to another. See George Dvali, “Out of Darkness” (2004).

4. Critics point out that this is not a logical dichotomy. Whether it is a dichotomy of viable explanatory alternatives depends upon whether there are other reasonable explanatory accounts of the origin of the universe, e.g., the axiarchism of John Leslie, Value and Existence (1979).

5. At times it is unclear whether Swinburne is claiming the virtue of God’s simplicity or that of theism. Swinburne entitles chapter 3 of Is There a God? (1996), “The Simplicity of God”. But a subheading is “The Simplicity of Theism”.

Copyright © 2016 by
Bruce Reichenbach <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free