Notes to Cosmological Argument

1. We will not address Aquinas’s arguments. However, it is important to note that contemporary treatments often ignore the Aristotelian metaphysical roots of his arguments that he provides outside of Question Two of the Summa Theologica (e.g., Sobel 2004; Oppy 2006: 98–107). Kenny (1969) remains an important exception.

2. Ramon Harvey (2021), appealing to Craig’s response (Copan and Craig, eds.: 2017, 60) to Grünbaum (Copan and Craig, ed. 2017), recasts premises 4 and 5. “Only a personal agent (not a mechanistic cause) is able to select between possible tensed time effects in causing the universe. Time is tensed. Therefore, the cause of the universe is a personal agent.” The underlying presupposition of this phase of the argument is that divine selection is at least analogous to human selection.

3. Critics point out that this is not a logical dichotomy. Whether it is a dichotomy of viable explanatory alternatives depends upon whether there are other reasonable explanatory accounts of the origin of the universe, e.g., the axiarchism of John Leslie, Value and Existence (1979).

4. At times it is unclear whether Swinburne is claiming the virtue of God’s simplicity or of the simplicity of theism. Swinburne entitles chapter 3 of Is There a God? (1996), “The Simplicity of God”. But a subheading is “The Simplicity of Theism”.

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Bruce Reichenbach <>

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