Cosmology and Theology
As long as humans have been trying to make sense of the universe, they have been proposing cosmological theories. Furthermore, the notion of a deity often plays a central role in these cosmological theories. According to most monotheistic religions, God is the sole creator and sustainer of the universe.
But the last one hundred years have seen a different sort of cosmology: a scientific cosmology. Without running afoul of the demarcation problem, the notable characteristics of scientific cosmology are that it uses the tools of mathematical physics (it is formalizable) and that it makes precise and testable predictions. What has this new scientific cosmology to do with traditional (often theistic) cosmologies? Has the new cosmology replaced the older cosmologies? Does the new cosmology inform or interpret the older cosmologies?
Our subsequent discussion will be restricted almost completely to the case of western monotheism—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—and even more specifically to variants of Christianity. Even so, we note a wide range of diversity among Christian beliefs and Christian attitudes towards science in general, and towards scientific cosmology in particular. At one extreme, we find ultra-traditional versions of Christianity that emphasize literal interpretation of Scripture, and that often interpret theological doctrines in terms of ancient Greek philosophical categories (e.g., God as eternal, unchangeable, etc.). Even within this more traditional camp, we find differences in terms of amount of literalism, and amount of flexibility with regard to traditional theological doctrines. (e.g., there are ongoing debates among traditional theologians about the relation of God to time.) At another extreme, we find more recent incarnations of Christianity that draw heavily on ideas from German idealism and/or process philosophy. There are also subtle, but not negligible, differences in attitude among Protestant, Roman Catholic, and Orthodox Christian theists. Thus, we should not think of theism as one fixed set of doctrines that is simply consistent or inconsistent with scientific cosmology.
Furthermore, even though most theological interactions with cosmology have taken place within the Christian tradition, it has rarely—if ever—been the case that the defining feature of Christianity (viz. the unique role of Christ) has played any explicit role in these interactions.
- 1. Overview: Cosmology, theology and religion
- 2. Creation and the big bang
- 3. Steady-state theories
- 4. Quantum and string cosmologies
- 5. Other non-standard cosmologies
- 6. Infinity and the universe
- 7. Physical eschatology
- 8. Conclusions: Cosmology and God
- Academic Tools
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Christianity and other monotheistic religions (Islam and Judaism) assume a transcendent and sovereign God who created the universe and continually maintains its existence. The world only exists because of an ultimate and supernatural cause which is, as Newton said, “not blind and fortuitous, but very well skilled in Mechanicks and Geometry” (Cohen 1978, 282). Whether in a general philosophical sense or in a scientific sense, cosmology has always been part of theism, but it is only relatively recently that cosmology based on physics and astronomy has entered the discussion concerning the existence and role of God. A limited application of physics to the study of the universe can be found in the second half of the nineteenth century when the cosmological consequences of the law of entropy increase were eagerly discussed in relation to the Christian doctrines of a world with a beginning and end in time. However, physical cosmology is essentially a twentieth century science which emerged as a result of the discovery about 1930 that the universe is in a state of expansion that possibly started a finite time ago. Cosmology as a subdiscipline of physics differs in some respects from mathematical, philosophical and classical observational cosmology, but of course the different approaches are in constant interaction. In a modern sense, physical cosmology became established after the discovery of the cosmic microwave background in 1965 which quickly turned the hot big bang model into the standard model of the universe. Jim Peebles’ Physical Cosmology of 1971, possibly the first book with this title, may be taken as the beginning of modern physical cosmology.
Although physical cosmology based on general relativity theory and elementary particle physics is thus a modern science, many of the theologically relevant questions related to current cosmology are old. Did the universe come into existence a finite time ago? Will it come to an end? Why are the cosmic evolution and the laws of nature of just such a kind that they permit intelligent life to exist? These and other questions of obvious relevance to theism are currently being discussed in the light of the most recent cosmological theories and observations, but the questions themselves (and, indeed, many of the answers) were familiar to medieval philosophers and theologians. This is also the case with the question that is sometimes considered the ultimate one: Why is there a cosmos? There is no reason to expect that today’s advanced physical cosmology, or the even more advanced of tomorrow, will provide final answers that satisfy theists and atheists alike.
Einstein’s general theory of relativity shows that the structure of spacetime is itself a dynamical variable, subject to causal influence by the material constituents of the universe. Indeed, Einstein immediately saw the potential to apply general relativity to large-scale cosmological questions. The first cosmological model of Einstein (1917) described a static universe, i.e. one whose spatial geometry is constant over time. However, Einstein’s static universe was empirically inadequate: it could not account for the redshift data gathered by Edwin Hubble and others in the 1920s. The redshift data indicated that distant stars are moving away from us, and moving faster in direct proportion to their distance. Thus, the data indicated an expanding universe.
In the 1920s and 1930s, a number of cosmological models of general relativity were proposed that predict the expansion of the universe. The most accurate account of the data is given by the family of Friedmann-Robertson-Walker (FRW) models. The key characteristic of these models is that space is homogeneous, and hence isotropic (i.e. looks the same in all directions). From the homogeneity assumption, it follows that the entire 4-dimensional spacetime divides neatly into a stack of 3-dimensional “spaces” each of which has constant curvature. The three possibilities for this curvature correspond to the three classical geometries: Euclidean (flat), spherical (positive), or hyperbolic (negative). In a given FRW spacetime, the geometry of space at one time is related to the geometry at any other time by means of a scale factor S(t). Indeed, pick a reference time T, such as 2021, pick two reference galaxies, and let d(T) be the distance between these galaxies at time T. Then the distance between the two galaxies at any other time t is given by d(t)=S(t)d(T), where we set S(T)=1. This number S(t) is called the scale factor, and its behavior encodes the dynamics of a FRW universe.
In those FRW spacetimes that can reasonably be thought to model our cosmos (e.g., those with massive objects), the time parameter t has an absolute lower bound t0. In particular, as t decreases towards t0, the scale parameter S(t) goes to zero. What happens when t reaches t0? In short, these models cannot say what happens, because there are no points of spacetime with time coordinate t0. That is, t0 is an ideal point that is never reached: the universe exists at all times after t0, but not before or at time t0. A spacetime model with this feature is called singular, and the ideal point that is never reached is called a singularity. In other words, the big bang is a singularity in a FRW spacetime.
The FRW spacetimes are extremely accurate descriptions of the large scale structure of our universe. Since these models describe a universe with a finite lifetime, it is reasonable to conclude that the universe has not always existed.
But many physicists and philosophers hesitate to draw this conclusion. In fact, the standard view in the 1950s and early 1960s was that the singularities of the FRW models were consequences of false idealizing assumptions, namely assumptions of perfect isotropy and homogeneity. But this escape route from singularities was definitely closed when Robert Geroch, Stephen Hawking, and Roger Penrose proved the “singularity theorems,” according to which almost all spacetimes are singular, and in particular, almost all cosmological models describe a finitely old universe.
A number of theists take the past-singular nature of cosmological models as confirmation of the claim that God created the universe ex nihilo. The list of advocates of this “big bang theology” includes Pope Pius XII, Francis Collins (director, US National Institutes of Health), and apologists William Lane Craig and Hugh Ross. And indeed, big bang cosmology does provide prima facie support for theism. After all, big bang cosmology says that the universe has a finite age, and (traditional) theism says that God created the universe out of nothing. Does big bang cosmology not confirm traditional theism? We give several reasons to be cautious about such claims.
Advocates of big bang theology are most interested in the claim that the universe is finitely old. Thus, the chain of inferential support should run as follows:
Big Bang Model → supports → Universe Finitely Old → supports → Theism
Before discussing the first supposed inferential relation, we note that not all theists are committed to the claim that the universe is finitely old. For example, Aquinas claims (in several places, including the Summa Theologica) that Reason cannot demonstrate the finitude of the universe. But Aquinas also thinks that Reason can demonstrate the existence of God; therefore Aquinas does not think that the very concept of God as creator implies that the universe is finitely old. (Contrary to some contemporary theologians, Aquinas claims that a Christian theist should believe that the universe is finitely old. For Aquinas, the finite age of the universe is a revealed doctrine, like the divinity of Christ.)
Contemporary theologians Arthur Peacocke and Ian Barbour also claim that the doctrine of the “creation” of the universe is best interpreted as one of the universe’s timeless dependence on God, and that such dependence does not demand a temporal creation event. This is also the view of William Stoeger (2010), a Jesuit priest and cosmologist, who argues that scientific cosmology can purify theology but never be in conflict with what theology legitimately asserts. For the remainder of this article, we will not discuss further the question of whether theism requires, or strongly supports, the claim that the universe is finitely old. (Arguments for this claim are assessed in (Copan & Craig 2004).) For now we focus on versions of theism that are committed—in a perhaps naive way—to creation ex nihilo. Even on this understanding of theism, there are still reasons to exercise caution in seeing the big bang as confirming the prediction that God created the universe.
The big-bang theologian argues that the claim
“The universe is 13 billion years old”
provides evidential support for theism. But there are many theists for whom the discovery that the universe is 13 billion years old would actually serve as a disconfirmation of their theistic belief. For example, Bishop Ussher of Ireland (1581–1656) claimed to derive from the Bible that the universe was created in 4004 B.C.; and even in the twenty-first century, some Christian thinkers claim Biblical warrant for an age of the universe much less than 13 billion years (see Kelly 2000 and Byl 2001). For these thinkers, then, the big bang would disconfirm theism—or at least their version of theism, which is committed to the literal accuracy of the Biblical account of creation. More strongly, it seems that Christian theism is committed to a belief in a finitely old universe primarily on the basis of its commitment to the accuracy of Biblical accounts of creation. Thus, if a theist comes to believe the big-bang account of the universe’s origin, and hence to doubt the literal Biblical account, then she will lose one reason—and possibly her only reason—for believing that the universe is finitely old.
Of course, there are also theists who interpret Genesis metaphorically as implying that the universe was created, but not indicating a specific age for the universe. For these theists, finding that the universe is finitely old might confirm rather than undermine their belief.
According to traditional Christian theism, creation ex nihilo is miraculous—something which the laws of nature cannot explain. But then why should a theist expect to be able to derive creation ex nihilo from the laws of nature? Compare with other supposed miracles, e.g., within Christianity the claim that Jesus changed water into wine. Do Christian theists claim that chemistry should predict that water can transform into wine? Of course not: God is supposed to be able to transcend the laws of nature, and the laws of nature are defeasible when it comes to describing what actually did happen (since God could have intervened). But then couldn’t the best (most explanatory, most elegant) cosmological theory posit an infinite past, whereas in reality God created it some finite time in the past?
The puzzle we have just encountered trades on the special status of cosmology as a historical, yet law-based science, with only one actual model. While theists would certainly not expect the laws of chemistry to predict that water can transform into wine, they do believe that an accurate historical account would include reference to those miracles that did occur. So, is cosmology more like history, or more like chemistry? If God did create the universe, should a cosmological theory report (or predict or entail) such a fact? Or should cosmology only be required to provide laws for universes, laws which might in fact have been broken in our universe?
Suppose that the theist takes a harder line and says that theism requires (or favors) cosmological models with a finitely old universe. In this case, the time parameter in our cosmological models should never take values lower than some fixed number, which we can conveniently set to zero.
But the interval (0,t) is topologically isomorphic to (−∞,t), suggesting that duration of time (finite versus infinite) might lack intrinsic physical or theological significance. Such a point was made already by E.A. Milne in 1935, and then independently by Charles Misner in 1969. In particular, Misner replaces the time parameter t with the negative of its logarithm (i.e., −log t) in order to assuage worries that a bounded time parameter makes no sense. According to Misner (1969, 1331), even in models that begin with singularities, “the Universe is meaningfully infinitely old because infinitely many things have happened since the beginning.” Interestingly, Misner’s move can hardly be motivated by a desire to obviate the need for a creator: Misner is a self-described Catholic Christian.
The possibility that the finite/infinite time distinction is conventional was noted by the Catholic philosopher of science Ernan McMullin, who concludes that the theological doctrine of creation ex nihilo must not be given a metric interpretation (McMullin 1981). Rather, claims McMullin, the ex nihilo doctrine should be interpreted order-theoretically: the time series has a first point. But this order-theoretic criterion will not help theism, at least not in regard to current cosmological models. On the one hand, FRW cosmological models fail the order-theoretic criterion: they have no first moment of time. On the other hand, an ideal first moment of time could be adjoined to any spacetime, even those that have a metrically infinite past (see Earman 1995). Thus, a simple order-theoretic criterion is a bad guide to whether cosmological models are consistent with the doctrine of creation ex nihilo.
A more adequate criterion of when a cosmological model is consonant with creation ex nihilo would require a detailed analysis of singular spacetimes (for extensive discussion of the latter topic, see Earman 1995). The best current account of when a spacetime is truly singular (as opposed to merely being described with inadequate coordinates) is when it contains inextendible geodesics of finite length. Intuitively, a geodesic is the path that would be followed by a clock in freefall. If a clock were travelling on a past-inextendible geodesic, then at some finite time in the past, the clock did not exist; more strongly, spacetime itself did not exist. Thus, the big-bang theologian would do best to claim that creation ex nihilo is confirmed precisely by those cosmological spacetimes that have inextendible geodesics. (Indeed, this criterion does hold for FRW models.) The main problem with such a proposal is that it ties a robust, intuitive theological doctrine down to an extremely precise technical feature of Lorentzian manifolds (as described by differential geometry). The risk then is that by doing so, one would add extraneous content to the theological doctrine: a future model might fail the technical criterion while still being consistent with the theological doctrine. Furthermore, many Christian theists claim that core theological doctrines are perspicuous—in particularly, not understood exclusively by an elite class of priests or scholars. But the notion of a Lorentzian manifold having incomplete geodesics can hardly be said to be accessible to the average layperson.
Finally, big-bang theology overreaches if it says that general relativity and the singularity theorems have settled once and for all that the universe had a beginning in time. In fact, relativistic cosmology predicts its own invalidity for times close to a dynamic singularity, such as the big bang. (For a dissenting opinion, see Misner 1969.) The reason that relativistic cosmology predicts its own own invalidity is that in the neighborhood of singularities, gravitational effects are intense, and quantum effects can be expected to play a predominant role. But general relativity does not incorporate quantum effects, and indeed it is untested in such regimes of intense gravitational force. Thus, there is little reason to believe that the singularity theorems make a valid prediction about the structure of a future successor theory of general relativity that includes quantum effects. We discuss this issue further in Section 4.
Most philosophers and physicists have thought that big bang cosmology is either neutral towards, or supportive of, traditional theism. Thus, atheists have usually taken a defensive stance, trying to defeat the arguments of the big-bang theologians. But a vocal minority—we might call them “big-bang atheologians”—have made the stronger claim that big bang cosmology disconfirms theism. The most visible proponents of this big-bang atheology are the philosophers Adolf Grünbaum and Quentin Smith. In the case of Smith, quantum cosmologies are taken to provide even stronger evidence against theism.
In putting forward their arguments, big-bang atheologians make a number of points that seem to have been overlooked by their theistic counterparts. One such point is that FRW cosmological models have no first state. Thus, a theist who invokes the big bang cannot say that there is a state of the universe, say Α, such that God created the universe in state Α. He or she will have to invoke a more sophisticated notion of God creating initial temporal intervals, or something like that. Are these more sophisticated developments still consonant with traditional theology?
Big-bang atheologians also argue that it makes no sense to accept both that there were no times before the big bang (since time itself comes into existence with the universe) and that the universe was caused. Of course, many theists claim that God causes the universe timelessly, and they would attempt to defend the coherence of such a notion in the face of these criticisms.
The case of quantum cosmology provides further complications for theology. Without going into excessive detail of specific proposals, a common theme of many quantum cosmologies is that they postulate a probability distribution over universes themselves. In other words, quantum cosmologies provide a measure of likelihood that certain sorts of universes exist. Some older quantum cosmologies (e.g., Hawking’s early proposals) still predict that the universe is finitely old. And yet, one might consider their further explanatory power—over and above classical general relativity—as undermining theistic explanations of the universe. In particular, quantum cosmology predicts with a high probability that a universe like ours would exist. Seen from this perspective, one might take quantum cosmologies to offer a competing, non-theistic explanation for the origin of the universe.
Theists have argued, in response, that quantum cosmologies do not provide unconditional probabilities for the existence of the universe. For example, Craig (1997), Deltete & Guy (1997), and Oppy (1997) argue that quantum cosmologies provide only conditional probabilities for the existence of some universe configurations given other universe configurations. Smith (1998) responds by defending the claim that the probabilities in quantum cosmology are unconditional. But neither side of this debate has attended to the special complications involved in interpreting quantum, rather than classical, probabilities. For example, Smith treats the universal wavefunction Ψ(hi j, f) as providing a probability distribution over universe configurations (hi j, f). But we know, from elementary quantum mechanics, that it is literally inconsistent (i.e., leads to contradictions) to treat a wavefunction as giving probabilities in an absolute sense. (This contradiction is derived by the famous Kochen-Specker theorem.) We conclude that in order for the metaphysical significance of quantum cosmologies to be assessed, a more nuanced consideration of the interpretation of quantum mechanics will be required.
Aristotle’s cosmology belonged to the class of steady-state theories in so far that his universe was changeless and eternal. When Einstein in 1917 proposed the first relativistic model of the universe, he unwittingly pictured a universe which had qualitative features in common with Aristotle’s: it was finite in space, but infinite in time. The discovery of the expansion of the universe excluded the steady state from relativistic cosmology, but not from other forms of cosmology. Robert Millikan, Nobel laureate and famous physicist, was among those who in the 1930s favored an eternally recurrent universe with a continual creation of matter and energy to counter the increase of entropy. He thought that such an eternal and evolving universe revealed the creator’s continual activity and explicitly presented his cosmological view as support for the doctrines of Christianity in general and for the immanence of God in particular.
Contrary to the earlier ideas of a steady-state universe, the theory that Fred Hoyle, Hermann Bondi and Thomas Gold introduced in 1948 accepted that the universe is expanding. Conceptually the theory was founded on the “perfect cosmological principle,” that is, the postulate that the universe in its large-scale features is not only spatially but also temporally homogeneous. Although this classical steady-state theory was abandoned in the 1960s because of its inability to account for new discoveries (such as the cosmic microwave background and the redshifts of quasars), it remains an instructive case in the cosmology-theology discussion. Moreover, the theory is not quite dead yet, as some of its characteristic features survive in the quasi-steady-state cosmology (QSSC) still defended by Jayant Narlikar and a few other cosmologists. This model does not satisfy the perfect cosmological principle, but it assumes an indefinite cosmic time scale during which matter is continually created. In this respect it is an alternative to the big-bang theory and its supposed association with divine creation. In 1994, at a time when he was developing the QSSC model, Hoyle referred to big-bang cosmology as “a form of religious fundamentalism” (Hoyle 1994, 413). According to the classical steady-state theory, the universe has expanded for an infinity of time and will continue to do so for ever; yet the average density of matter remains constant because matter, or rather matter-energy, is continually being created out of nothing. (In later versions of the theory, matter creation was not ex nihilo.) Both features—the infinite time scale and the continuous creation of matter—were controversial and caused concern of a philosophical and also a theological nature.
It was widely assumed in the 1950s that the steady-state universe was contrary to theism or at least made God superfluous as a creator of the cosmos. After all, how can God have created a universe which has existed in an infinity of time? According to the astronomer, science popularizer and non-believer Carl Sagan, “this is one conceivable finding of science that could disprove a Creator—because an infinitely old universe would never have been created” (1997, 265). However, although the argument may seem to pose a real problem for theism, the theologians were well prepared—it had been discussed since the thirteenth century when Thomas Aquinas suggested that God could indeed have created an infinitely old universe. Moreover, theological responses to an infinitely old universe were far from new, for they had already been developed in relation to eternally cyclic models, either in the more speculative versions of the nineteenth century or the relativistic models that were proposed in the 1930s onwards.
According to the Thomistic doctrine of creatio continuans, God causes things to exist in the sense that their existence depends wholly on his power. If they were left to themselves they would turn into, or return into, nothingness. From this point of view creation is basically a metaphysical rather than a physical and temporal concept, and an eternal yet created universe is perfectly possible. Interestingly, the leading steady-state physicist William McCrea was also a devout Christian who argued that cosmology, in whatever form, must necessarily include the postulation of a divine creator. As theologians in the 1950s, both Protestants and Catholics, were quick to point out, Hoyle’s eternal universe was not particularly heretical, for it was still in need of a creator. Not only did they mobilize the old concept of continual divine creation, emphasizing that cosmic creation is primarily about the ontological dependence of the world on God, they also stressed that faith in God has little to do with physical cosmology in whatever of its versions. Erich Mascall, a priest and philosopher of religion, saw no reason why the steady-state model should cause worry among the faithful. As he said in 1956, “The whole question whether the world had a beginning or not is, in the last resort, profoundly unimportant for theology” (Mascall 1956, 155).
Views similar to Mascall’s have been held by many later theologians and Christian philosophers, but not by all. There is disagreement about how solidly based in the Bible the concept of atemporal continual creation is, and also about the significance of an absolute beginning of the world (for opposite views, see Copan and Craig 2004 and May 1994). The view that cosmology is essentially irrelevant to Christian belief has not gone uncontested. As Ernan McMullin has pointed out, Christian doctrines are more than metaphysics and codes for moral conduct; they are also cosmic claims that say something about the universe and what it contains of things. For this reason theologians need to pay attention to cosmology in particular and to science in general.
Some Christian scientists and philosophers have seen the continual creation of matter, as posited by the steady-state theory, as a manifestation of perpetual divine creation. Thus, the Catholic philosopher Philip Quinn (1993) adopted the old notion of creatio continuans to the case of steady-state cosmology. The argument is essentially that since ex nihilo creation of matter violates energy conservation, there must be an external creative cause that accounts for the violation, and this cause he identifies with perpetual divine creation. This kind of reasoning has been severely criticized by Adolf Grünbaum, who flatly dismisses the claim that underlies the idea of perpetual divine creation, namely that nothingness is the natural state of the universe. This claim has also been argued in detail by Richard Swinburne (1996), who finds it extraordinary that there exists anything at all and from the fact that something exists infers the existence of God. But according to Grünbaum there is no room for divine creation in either big-bang or steady-state cosmology. “Steady-state cosmology,” he concludes, “is indeed logically incompatible with [the] claim that divine creative intervention is causally necessary for the nonconservative popping into existence of new matter in the steady-state universe” (Grünbaum 1996, 529).
Whereas steady-state cosmology is at least problematical from the point of view of traditional theology, it goes well together with the ideas of process theology or philosophy, where God is seen as interacting creatively and incessantly with natural processes. In a general sense, Whitehead’s philosophy is more in harmony with the steady state than the big bang universe. The prominent British astronomer Bernard Lovell (1959), a devoted Christian inspired by process thinking, was in sympathy with the steady-state theory and saw no reason why it should be a threat to belief in a divine being. To him, the creation of matter was a sure sign of God’s activity.
As we mentioned previously, there are reasons to suspect the invalidity of classical general relativity in regions near a singularity—most importantly, for times very close to the big bang. In particular, when lengths are very small, and curvature and temperatures are very high, then—if the gravitational force behaves like all other known forces of nature—quantum effects will take over, and we should accordingly expect different outcomes. This observation is itself sufficient to destroy the aspirations of big-bang theology—unless there are good reasons to think that the finite-age prediction of relativistic cosmology will be preserved in a quantum gravity or in string theory. In this section, we briefly review the known data about singularities in theories that attempt to unify gravity and quantum mechanics. Our review supports two conclusions: (1) We do not know yet if the best model will predict a finitely old universe, but (2) there are good reasons to think that the big bang is not necessarily an absolute beginning.
There have been a number of proposed theories of quantum cosmology. Perhaps best known of these is the proposal of Stephen Hawking, which results in a universe with no boundary—motivating the famous question, “what place, then, for a creator?” The bearing of Hawking’s cosmology on theism has already been discussed extensively by Craig & Smith (1995), Deltete & Guy (1997), Craig (1997), and Smith (1998). But it would be ill advised to take Hawking’s theory as giving the final version of quantum cosmology. As noted by Drees (1990), Hawking’s approach is just one among several competing attempts to incorporate quantum effects into relativistic cosmology, and we are not compelled to accept its idiosyncratic metaphysical picture. More to the point, Hawking’s cosmological model is ad hoc in the sense that it does not flow from a more comprehensive unification of general relativity quantum theory. In this section we turn to two cosmological theories that do result from systematic and comprehensive unifications of general relativity and quantum theory: loop quantum cosmology and string cosmology.
Loop quantum cosmology (LQC) is an approach to cosmology within the framework of the loop quantum gravity (LQG) program (Rovelli 2004), which itself starts with the idea that unifying quantum theory and general relativity will require “quantizing” the gravitational field—and hence the structures of spacetime itself. Roughly speaking, to quantize a theory means that the quantities (e.g., position, momentum, scalar curvature, etc.) are replaced by “matrices,” or more generally with “operators on a Hilbert space.” This replacement can have profound physical consequences, most particularly the spectrum of a quantity (i.e., the numerical values it can possess) can become discretized where it was previously continuous, or bounded where it was previously unbounded, and quantities can be forced to obey a Heisenberg uncertainty principle.
For our purposes, the important question is what happens to those quantities (e.g., spatial curvature) that grow unboundedly large in classical FRW spacetimes as the time parameter t approaches the initial boundary time t0? To answer this question requires going through intricate technicalities involving domains of definition of operators, etc.. To summarize, however, the most prominent proposal (championed primarily by Martin Bojowald and collaborators; see Bojowald 2009) results in a scale parameter S(t) that is bounded away from zero, entailing that curvature is bounded from above. More is true: the dynamical equations of LQC extend through the big bang, i.e., the universe existed before the big bang.
It would be premature to take loop quantum cosmology as having decisively overturned the big-bang, finite-age cosmological model. Nonetheless, there is a non-negligible probability that it will do so in the near future; and hence there is a non-negligible probability that the big bang is not the beginning of the universe, and a fortiori, not the creation event (even if there was one).
However, loop quantum gravity is not the most popular—in terms of sheer number of researchers—approach to unifying quantum theory and gravity. The title of most popular belongs to string theory, and so string theory’s perspective on the big bang event is of crucial interest for those wishing to assess the bearing of physical cosmology on traditional theological doctrines.
All indications from string cosmology point to the fact that the universe existed before the big bang. In particular, string theory claims that if we apply fundamental symmetry transformations to cosmological models of the recent universe, then we get a copy of the universe (with important quantities inverted) that might be called the “pre-big-bang universe.” In this scenario, the absolute big bang disappears and is replaced by a saddle point in the dynamical evolution of spacetime curvature: before this point, curvature is increasing, and after this point, it is decreasing.
According to Gasperini (2008), string cosmology’s prediction of a pre-big-bang universe results from a principled application of symmetry principles. Furthermore, string theory has a built in mechanism (namely a minimum string length) that seems to rule out singularities of infinite curvature or spatial length shrinking to zero. As was the case in LQC, the values of physical quantities in string theory are constrained by quantum mechanical laws; and so some quantities that grew beyond bounds in classical theory are well-behaved in quantized versions of that theory.
We currently lack the empirical data that would distinguish between competing models of quantum cosmology. But these models make different empirical predictions from each other, and they also make different predictions from classical relativistic cosmology. Hence, it is an empirical, rather than a metaphysical, question whether the big bang was the beginning of the universe.
However, just as the big-bang is not unambiguously friendly to theism, so quantum cosmology is not unambiguously hostile to theism. Indeed, Chris Isham (1993, 405) has suggested that quantum cosmology’s description of a boundary-free universe accords quite well with theism’s insistence that God sustains the universe at all times. (See also the discussion in Drees 1988, 1990, 1991.) Clearly, theism has shown some flexibility in integrating its doctrines with prevailing scientific worldviews—as evidenced, e.g., in the integration of Aristotelian cosmology, and in the exploitation of big-bang cosmology. Should we expect the situation to be any different with quantum cosmology?
Apart from the quantum-based cosmologies mentioned above, there are several other theories of the universe that differ from the generally accepted big bang theory and are, in this sense, “non-standard.” A few of these models have been discussed within a religious context. We shall limit ourselves to two groups of theories, cyclic cosmologies and multiverse theories.
Origen, a third-century Christian philosopher, speculated that God, before he created our universe, had busied himself with the creation of an endless series of earlier worlds. His idea of an eternal cyclic universe was however condemned by the church and has since then generally been regarded as associated with atheism and materialism. Indeed, from about 1850 to 1920 the classical cyclic or recurrent universe was popular among many atheistic thinkers who found it to be incompatible with Christian doctrines. Nonetheless, some theists have endorsed such a universe, e.g., Joseph Smith’s claim that “as one earth shall pass away, and the heavens thereof even so shall another come” (Mormon Book of Moses 1:38).
Although Einstein’s cosmological field equations do not justify a series of pulsating universes, many cosmologists have suggested ways in which a collapsing universe can reappear from a nonsingular state and thus give birth to a new universe, perhaps ad infinitum. It should be pointed out that Lemaître, the cosmologist-priest, did not suggest such a “Phoenix universe,” in spite of numerous claims to the opposite. In some cases atheism has been part of the motivation for proposing singularity-free models with an unlimited past and future. For example, the British physicist William Bonnor considered the new big bang theory “the opportunity Christian theology has been waiting for ever since science began to depose religion from the minds of rational men” (Bonnor 1964, 117). His own favored candidate, a universe oscillating smoothly and eternally between two states of finitely high density, avoided a divine miracle and theistic exploitation of cosmology, in which respect it was similar to the steady-state theory. Steven Weinberg noticed the similarity: “Some cosmologists are philosophically attracted to the oscillating model, especially because, like the steady-state model, it nicely avoids the problem of Genesis” (Weinberg 1977, 154).
Classical-relativistic cyclic models presupposed a closed universe disagreeing with current observations, for which reason they are no longer considered viable alternatives. But the twenty-first century has witnessed several new proposals, of which we shall mention only two: the “conformal cyclic cosmology” developed by Roger Penrose, and the “new cyclic cosmology” developed by Paul Steinhardt and Neil Turok.
In his theory of conformal cyclic cosmology, Penrose claims that as the big bang is approached, massive objects play a negligible role, so that the physics is governed by degrees of freedom that are invariant under rescaling of lengths and times. Such degrees of freedom are called “conformal invariants.” Thus, Penrose claims, we make a mistake to model the early universe by a Lorentzian manifold with a metric (as is done in classical general relativity). Rather, spacetime should be described by a conformal manifold, which is essentially a conformal equivalence class of general relativistic spacetimes. The “cyclic” part of Penrose’s cosmology comes from noticing that the future of one ever-expanding universe can be smoothly bridged to the past of another big-bang universe by means of such a conformal manifold. In this case, the big bang is not a true beginning, but only a sort of phase change from one “epoch” to another (Penrose 2010).
The new cyclic cosmology of Steinhardt and Turok develops ideas from string theory to describe a universe without inflation going through an endless sequence of cycles—in which case, the big bang is not the beginning of time (Steinhardt and Turok 2007). In this respect the model is similar to the steady-state model, and Steinhardt and Turok have indeed described it as a “remarkable reincarnation” of Hoyle’s old theory. Although the new cyclic model has attracted a fair amount of attention, it is not widely accepted. Nor is this the case with the pre-big-bang bouncing cosmology advanced by Gabriele Veneziano and Maurizio Gasperini on the basis of string theory. According to the pre-big-bang model the universe is not only eternal into the future, it is also eternal into the past, the two cosmic phases (contracting and expanding) being separated by a non-singular big bang.
Eternal bouncing models qualitatively similar to the pre-big-bang scenario have been proposed earlier, either on the basis of the relativistic field equations or on the idea of a plasma universe. According to the Swedish physicist Hannes Alfvén, a Nobel laureate of 1970 who developed the latter idea, the plasma universe was an alternative to the theistic big bang theory. Since none of the models considered in this section operate with an absolute beginning, they may seem to be problematic from a theistic point of view. However, the theist can always appeal to perpetual divine creation, just as in the case of the steady-state universe.
The modern idea of the multiverse is theologically more controversial. In its so-called landscape version, which since 2002 has been promoted and developed by Leonard Susskind and many other physicists, it is based on the apparent non-uniqueness of the equations of string theory. The solutions of the equations describe, in a sense, possible worlds with different physical parameters, interactions, types of particles, and even dimensionality; the multitude of solutions are then identified with really existing worlds which generally are causally separate from ours. As a mechanism for generating the huge number of universes, multiverse physicists make use of the eternal inflation scenario. Moreover, the multiverse is closely associated with anthropic reasoning: we find ourselves in our universe, with its particular physical laws and content of particles, not because other universes are impossible or improbable, but because our kind of life cannot exist in other universes. The theory of the multiverse has seductively great explanatory power (while it has almost no predictive power), which is a major reason why many physicists and cosmologists find it attractive. On the other hand, other physicists dismiss it as pseudoscience because it is practically untestable.
It is common among supporters of the multiverse to conceive it as an alternative to a divinely created world and ideas of natural theology. Because it represents our universe as a chance universe, special only by the fact that we live in it, the multiverse has been likened to another and more famous anti-design theory, neo-Darwinianism. Weinberg puts it as follows: “Just as Darwin and Wallace explained how the wonderful adaption of living forms could arise without supernatural intervention, so the string landscape may explain how the constants of nature that we observe can take values suitable for life without being fine-tuned by a benevolent creator” (Weinberg 2007, 39). At least to some theists, the multiverse stands in sharp contrast to Christian belief. As Richard Swinburne sees it, “To postulate a trillion trillion other universes, rather than one God in order to explain the orderliness of our universe, seems the height of irrationality” (Swinburne 1996, 68).
Swinburne joins several other philosophers and physicists in seeing physical cosmology as providing key data for a new design argument. The strength of such fine-tuning arguments continues to be a hotly contested issue among philosophers (see Collins 2009, Colyvan et al. 2005, McGrew et al. 2001, White 2000).
On the other hand, there is no one-to-one correspondence between the multiverse and belief in a divine creator. Several philosophers have argued that if theism is true, we should expect the actual world to be a multiverse: being a perfect being, God would create a multiverse rather than just a single universe (Kraay 2010). It is possible to answer affirmatively to the question, “does God love the multiverse?”, such as the physicist Don Page did at a symposium in 2008 (see Page 2008). Even if there are 10500 universes (but not, perhaps, if there are an infinite number of them), they could have been providentially created by the almighty God with a purpose we cannot fathom. Why not? It has even been suggested (by Paul Davies) that multiverse explanations are reminiscent of divine explanations and unintentionally reintroduce a transcendent creator.
Mormon theology differs in several respects drastically from the theology of traditional Christianity. Not only is God personal and held to have been created by a prior god (who was again created by a prior god, etc.), according to the central doctrine of “eternal progression” human beings will ultimately become like God himself. There is an infinite number of beings and it takes an eternity for them to become gods. Standard big bang cosmology, based as it is on a universe of finite age, is incompatible with Mormonism, where existence has neither beginning nor end. Whereas traditional theologians have no problem with a universe created ex nihilo, and many subscribe to this doctrine, Mormons flatly reject it. In order to overcome the conflict with physical cosmology, some Mormon thinkers have turned to the multiverse. Realizing that the attempt to harmonize the Mormon dogma of eternal progression with modern cosmology is problematic, Kirk Hagen says: “For Mormonism, a compelling reason to consider a multiverse cosmology is to attempt a reconciliation of modern cosmological ideas and the central tenet of Mormon doctrine” (Hagen 2006, 28).
The anthropic principle, an integral part of multiverse cosmology, has similarly been discussed in theological contexts and, again similarly, without any consensus emerging from the many discussions. In its most common version, called the weak anthropic principle, it states that what we observe is selected by our existence in a universe with just such properties that allow us to exist. Swinburne and some other theists in favor of design arguments find the anthropic principle to be, at best, unnecessary and obfuscating. To them, the values of the cosmic parameters and constants of nature appear to be fine-tuned because they are fine-tuned, the designer being God. The atheist Richard Dawkins goes further, arguing that the anthropic principle is an alternative to the design hypothesis and provides strong evidence for a world without God. However, theists do not generally see anthropically based arguments as a problem for a divinely created world. William Lane Craig and John Polkinghorne are among those who hold that the anthropic principle is compatible with divine design and can even be seen as indirect support for theism. According to the South-African cosmologist (and Quaker) George Ellis, anthropic fine-tuning is the result of a purposeful design of the universe. He has suggested a “Christian anthropic principle” as the basis for an ultimate understanding of the universe that combines scientific and religious perspectives (Ellis 1993).
In relation to the design argument, as reinvigorated by the discussions of the anthropic principle, some physicists and philosophers have returned to an old objection to it, namely that it is not an argument for the Christian God; it is at best an argument for a cosmic architect in a deistic sense, or for that matter several such architects. On the other hand, theists have replied that even if this objection be true it does not constitute a proof that the God of theism does not exist. Although design arguments frequently occur in connection with the anthropic principle, it needs to be said that they were not part of the original anthropic program initiated by Brandon Carter in 1974.
Cosmological theory has gone through many phases and proposals over the past 100 years. Some have included universes with infinite pasts and these were mentioned previously. However, for the past forty years there has been a strong consensus on the modern big bang theory which has a finite past. But even if the universe is temporally finite in the past, it may well be spatially and materially infinite. If space is infinite and the cosmological principle is assumed to be valid, the universe will contain an infinite number of galaxies, stars, atoms and everything else. Such actual infinities not only cause philosophical and logical problems, they may also cause problems of a theological nature. In his thought experiment known as “Hilbert’s hotel” the famous mathematician David Hilbert argued that (countable) actual infinities are so bizarre that they cannot have anything to do with the real world we live in. In this thought experiment, Hilbert imagines that he arrives at a hotel with an infinite number of rooms, all of which are occupied. The desk clerk claims nonetheless that there is a vacancy. He then proceeds to ask each guest to move to the room with the next highest number in the sequence (see Oppy 2006, 8; Kragh 2014, Other Internet Resources).
Hilbert himself was uninterested in religion, but later philosophers and theologians have occasionally used his peculiar hotel apologetically, as an argument for the existence of God and also for the finitude of the universe.
The theological problems related to an infinitely large universe are not specifically related to modern physical cosmology but have been discussed since the early days of Christianity. On the other hand, they may be seen as even more relevant today, when the favored cosmological model has zero curvature, meaning that space is flat. Although a flat cosmic space does not necessarily imply an infinite universe, many cosmologists assume that the universe is indeed spatially infinite.
The theological implications of an infinite universe were discussed by the church fathers and, in greater detail, by Johannes Philoponus in the sixth century. Many of the arguments were of the same kind as those used in the attempts to prove the impossibility of a temporal infinity. At the time of the scientific revolution it was commonly assumed that physical space cannot be truly infinite, only indefinitely large. Infinity was seen as a divine attribute not to be found elsewhere; to claim that nature is infinite would be to endow it with divinity, a heretical view characteristic of pantheism. While the generally accepted view among theists was, and to some extent still is, that an infinite universe is philosophically absurd and theologically heretical, there was no consensus on the issue. In fact, several Christian thinkers, from Descartes in the seventeenth century through Kant in the eighteenth to Edward Milne in the twentieth, have argued that an infinite universe is in better agreement with God’s will and omnipotence than a finite one. According to Milne, “It requires a more powerful God to create an infinite universe than a finite universe; it requires a greater God to leave room for an infinity of opportunities for the play of evolution than to wind up a mechanism, once and for all” (Milne 1948, 233). The correlation between finitism and theism, and infinitism and atheism, should be seen as historically contingent rather than justified by either scientific or theological reasons.
During the early period of modern cosmology, relativistic models with zero or negative curvature were sometimes associated with materialism and atheism because they implied a universe of infinite size. Conversely, Einstein’s closed and finite universe was welcomed by theists. According to Ernest W. Barnes, the mathematically trained bishop of Birmingham, infinite space was “a scandal to human thought,” (Barnes 1931, 598). His argument was epistemic as well as theological: only if God’s universe is finite can we hope to understand the full range of his activity. Lemaître thought likewise that the universe had to be finite in order to be comprehensible. In agreement with his later warning against the “nightmare of infinite space” (Kragh 2004, 139), both of his two innovative cosmological models, the expanding model of 1927 and the big-bang model of 1931, were spatially closed. The steady-state model of the 1950s was not only unpopular among Christians because of its lack of a cosmic creation, but also because it implied a homogeneous universe of infinite extent. According to Stanley Jaki, a Benedictine priest and historian of science, the infinite universe is a scientific cover-up for atheism. Mormons do not agree, though, for they need a universe which is infinite in both time and space.
The present consensus model of a geometrically flat accelerating universe is usually taken to imply an infinite cosmos. The general attitude of cosmologists is to ignore the troublesome philosophical problems and speak of the infinite universe as just an indefinitely large one. They rarely reflect on the weird epistemic consequences of an actual infinity and even more rarely on the theological consequences. Ellis is an exception to the rule. He and his collaborators have argued forcefully against an infinite universe, suggesting that the flat space of the consensus model is probably an abstraction that does not hold physically (Ellis, Kirchner and Stoeger 2004). If the universe is really infinite and uniform it can be (and has been) argued that there will be an infinity of identical copies of all human beings and indeed of everything. Such a consequence, as discussed by Ellis, Max Tegmark, Alan Guth and others, clearly is theologically disturbing.
Even more disturbing, says Ellis, is that God may then not be able to keep track of and give attention to the infinite number of beings in the universe. Moreover, if there is a multitude of cosmic regions, each of which is inhabited with intelligent beings, one may need to contemplate a multitude of Christ-figures, incarnations and crucifixions. Ellis was not only willing to consider such a scenario, he also thought that it strengthened the case for a finite universe, for then “we would have to countenance only a finite number of civilizations needing redemption. Surely an infinite number of Christ-figures must be too much, no matter how one envisages God” (Ellis 1993, 394).
The cosmological field equations are time-symmetric and the fundamental laws of physics are assumedly valid at any time. Thus, modern cosmology is not only about the past of the universe, it also offers scenarios about its far future, including speculations about the fate of intelligent life. Given that the apocalyptic passages in the Bible speak of an end of the world and a possible new creation (e.g., 2 Peter 3:10–13), the cosmic future may seem to offer another point of contact between cosmology and theistic religion. But can there be a secular or scientific eschatology?
Scientifically based speculations about the state of the cosmos in the far future and the possibility of endless life were first discussed in the late nineteenth century in connection with the controversy over the heat death predicted by the second law of thermodynamics. Some of the German scientists involved in the controversy argued that life might persist even in the very high-entropic environment of the far future, and they explicitly referred to the eschatological aspects of cosmology. Characteristically, while the heat death scenario was welcomed by Christian authors, it was vehemently opposed by materialists and atheists who argued for an eternal universe with eternal life. As Eddington, a Quaker and an advocate of the inevitable heat death, later asked: “Since when has the teaching that ‘ heaven and earth shall pass away’ become ecclesiastically un-orthodox?” (Eddington 1935, 59).
Since the 1970s “physical eschatology” has emerged as a new subfield of astrophysics and cosmology, pioneered by Freeman Dyson, Jamal Islam and others (see the survey in Kragh 2011, 325–353). The field deals primarily with the state of the universe in the remote future as based on extrapolations of cosmological models and the assumption that the presently known laws of physics will remain indefinitely valid. The favored scenario is the open ever-expanding universe where extrapolations typically result in an ultimate future (at about 10100 years from now!) in which the universe consists of nothing but an exceedingly thin electron-positron plasma immersed in a cold radiation of neutrinos and photons. Other studies presume a closed universe collapsing in a big crunch and others again investigate the nearer future of humankind, say a few million years from now. While many of these studies are not concerned with the final state of life, some are, and it is this latter group that constitutes physical eschatology proper. According to John Barrow and Frank Tipler, the research field is, “the study of the survival and the behavior of life in the far future” (Barrow & Tipler 1986, 658).
Physical eschatologists usually ignore the religious associations of their studies or deny that they exist. Tipler is a controversial exception, however. Not only does he argue that some kind of life can continue forever in a closed universe, he also claims that it is the very collapse of the universe that permits eternal life. When the final eternity has been reached at what he calls the “omega point,” life becomes omniscient and the temporal becomes atemporal. According to Tipler, the final singularity is God and “theology is nothing but physical cosmology based on the assumption that life as a whole is immortal” (Tipler 1995, 17). In his book The Physics of Christianity (Tipler 2007), he continues his idiosyncratic exploration of modern cosmotheology according to which theology is merely a branch of physics. Tipler’s views are undoubtedly extreme, but (and perhaps for this reason) they have caused much discussion among theologians.
The term physical eschatology indicates a connection to biblical eschatology, but it is far from clear that the two are related in any meaningful sense. The message of the Bible is not so much the end of the physical universe as it is about the imminent return of Christ, the transformation of humans from flesh to spirit, and the final kingdom of God. It is about the ultimate destiny and goal of humans, not of self-reproducing robots. As Jefferson Davis (1999) notes, the ultimate hope which is crucial in theology cannot be supplied by the laws of physics. The scenario of a closed universe, such as argued by Tipler, may appear to be more compatible with the biblical view than the case of the ever-expanding universe, but even in the former case it is hard to establish a meaningful connection. While the end of the world does not conflict with the Bible, the claims of immortality of intelligent life forms (not necessarily humans) do. The Bible says that God alone is immortal and that all his created beings are doomed to extinction unless God decides otherwise.
Several theologians have expressed concern about the cosmologists’ scenarios of the end of the universe and stressed that there is a world of difference between these scenarios and proper eschatology. According to Wolfhart Pannenberg the Christian affirmation of an imminent end of the world is scarcely reconcilable with the cosmological extrapolations of the state of the universe zillions of years ahead. Karl Peters probably speaks for the majority of theologians when he writes: “If the expanding universe is indeed open, expanding forever, then how can one speak of God recreating the universe? If the universe is closed, then it is likely to end in a ‘big crunch’ of mammoth black-hole proportions. Again, it is difficult to see how a new creation can take place” (Schwarz 2000, 180). According to Peters, the physical end of the universe would in effect imply the non-existence of God as understood in the Christian tradition. Whereas Pannenberg, Peters, Arthur Peacocke and others tend to think that physical and Christian eschatology are either contradictory or incommensurable, Craig has taken a more reconcilable view. According to him, the cosmologists’ versions of secular eschatology furnish grounds for taking seriously the hypothesis of a transcendent creative and omnipotent agent. This agent may not be the classical God, but more likely God in a panentheistic version.
Finally, Robert Russell (2008) argues that the potential conflict might be resolved by appealing to God’s omnipotence and freedom to perform miracles: the future of the universe would have been what science predicts had God not decided to act at Easter and bring about, and will continue to bring about, the new creation. This view is allegedly not in conflict with science, but only with the philosophical assumption that the events predicted by science must happen, and this assumption Russell sees no reason to accept.
The question, “why does the universe exist?” admits of answers from traditional religions as well as from contemporary cosmological theories. However, according to Bede Rundle (2004), neither of these answers are needed, for philosophical analysis is sufficient to prove the existence of a physical universe. While some claim that the scientific answer has superseded all theological answers, others claim that the scientific answer reinforces the claim that God created the universe. Indeed, the story of the interaction between scientific cosmology and theology is by no means a simple tale of a better theory replacing an inferior; nor a simple tale of the convergence of diverse sources of knowledge. A naive or ideological reading of twentieth century cosmology might count big bang cosmology as providing new support for theism, and alternatives such as steady-state cosmology as atheistic backlashes. (And of course, the work of apologists such as W.L. Craig lends credence to this sort of picture.) But such a view misses many nuances, both in the historical record, as well as in the logical structure of these issues. From a historical point of view, there has been little correlation between religious views of scientific cosmologists and their proposed cosmological models. From an epistemological point of view, there are numerous obstacles to claiming that the big bang confirms the hypothesis that God exists. And from a metaphysical point of view, God’s hand is not manifest even in big bang models: these models have no first state for God to create, and these models have no time for God to exist in before the big bang.
By pointing out some of the subtleties in the relationship between scientific cosmology and theology, we do not intend to claim that the two are nonoverlapping magisteria (to borrow a phrase from Stephen Jay Gould). To the contrary, contemporary cosmology is fascinating precisely because it has such intricate logical relations with traditional metaphysical and theological issues.
A good source for modern cosmology and its philosophical and religious contexts is Hetherington 1993. The historical interaction between cosmology and religion in the twentieth century is dealt with in Kragh 2004, and, from a different perspective, in Worthing 1996. An interesting dialogue about the (a)theistic implications of physical cosmology can be found in Craig & Smith 1995. A popular account of loop quantum cosmology is given in Bojowald 2009; more technical accounts are given in Ashtekar 2009 and Wüthrich 2006. Popular accounts of string cosmology are given in Gasperini 2008 and Veneziano 2004, 2009. For Steinhardt and Turok’s cyclic cosmology, see Steinhardt & Turok 2007. For Penrose’s conformal cyclic cosmology, see Penrose 2010.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Kragh, H., 2014. “The True (?) Story of Hilbert’s Infinite Hotel,” manuscript at arXiv.org.
- infidels.org, has several open-access articles on related topics.
- counterbalance.org, has bibliographies and discussions of these topics.
- Partial bibliography on theism and physical cosmology, by Hans Halvorson.