Notes to Philosophy of Cosmology

1. See Smeenk 2012 and O’Raifeartaigh et al. forthcoming for further discussion of Einstein’s contributions.

2. There are several excellent textbook treatments of cosmology, including in particular Dodelson 2003, Mukhanov 2005, Durrer 2008, and Peter & Uzan 2013.

3. A geodesic is an analog of a straight line in two senses: the geodesic between two points extremizes the length, and the tangent vector to the curve remains parallel to itself as it is parallel transported along the curve.

4. Represented compactly using the metric field, \(g_{ab}\). The equations are non-linear both in terms of involving products of derivatives \(g_{ab,c}\) of \(g_{ab}\) with other derivative and also with its inverse \(g^{ab}.\)

5. These solutions are homogeneous and isotropic: homogeneity requires that at a given moment of cosmic time every spatial point “looks the same,” and isotropy holds if there are no geometrically preferred spatial directions. Thus the spatial geometry of \(\Sigma\) is such that there is an isometry carrying any point \(p \in \Sigma\) to any other point lying in the same surface (homogeneity), and at any point \(p\) the three spatial directions are equivalent to each other (isotropy). An isometry is a transformation that preserves the spacetime geometry; more precisely, a diffeomorphism \(\phi\) that leaves the spacetime metric invariant, i.e., \((\phi^*g)_{ab} = g_{ab}\). It is an isotropy about a point \(p\) if it leaves \(p\) fixed: \((\phi^*p) =p\).

6. These are the three possibilities if \(\Sigma\) is assumed to be simply connected, which holds if every closed loop can be smoothly contracted to a point. There are many possibilities for a globally isotropic space with constant curvature that is multiply connected (Ellis 1971b), for example a toroidal topology (a closed version of flat space) or projective space (with the same metric as spherical space but a different topology).

7. \(\dot{R}\) is the derivative of \(R\) with respect to cosmic time \(t\), \(\Lambda\) is the cosmological constant, and \(G\) is Newton’s gravitational constant. The Raychaudhuri equation is a fundamental equation that describes the evolution of a cluster of nearby worldlines, e.g., for the particles making up a small ball of dust, in response to spacetime curvature (Ellis 1971a). It takes on the simple form given here due to the symmetries we have assumed: in the FLRW models the small ball of dust can change only its volume as a function of time, but in general there can be a volume-preserving distortion (shear) and rotation of the ball as well.

8. The stress energy tensor for a perfect fluid is given by \(T_{ab} = (\rho + p) u_a u_b + (p) g_{ab}\), where \(u_a\) is the unit tangent vector to the trajectories of the fluid elements (\(u^a u_a = -1\)).

9. These models typically treat the evolution of perturbations using Newtonian gravity, over a fixed background cosmological model; the assumptions include specification of the initial spectrum of density perturbations and cosmological parameters. There are enormous computational challenges to giving a fully relativistic account of structure formation of comparable dynamical range, and it is furthermore unclear to what extent a relativistic account diverges from Newtonian N-body simulations.

10. See Ellis et al. 2012: §11.1, 13.1 for further discussion and references.

11. See Wainwright & Ellis 1997 for discussion.

12. See Clarkson & Maartens 2010, February et al. 2010, and Zhang & Stebbins 2011.

13. There could in principle be a curvature dominated phase before this happens, but in practice this seems to not be the case. See Ehlers & Rindler 1989 for an illuminating phase space representation of FLRW solutions with pressure and a cosmological constant that shows all the possibilities.

14. See Beringer et al. 2012 and Ade et al. 2016 for example, for reviews of evidence bearing on the cosmological parameters. The total number of parameters used to specify a cosmological model varies in different studies, but typically 5–10 fundamental parameters are used to determine the best fit to a given data set.

15. See, e.g., Particle Data Group 2016 for a recent review of observational constraints on the cosmological models.

16. See Norton (1993, 1994) for a discussion of this contrast between scientific and philosophical attitudes toward underdetermination.

17. See, for example, Laudan & Leplin 1991 for a sharp criticism of the treatment of empirical content by Quine, van Fraassen, and others, along these lines.

18. The light cone is the boundary of the causal past; EFE can be used to determine the spacetime geometry in the causal past from this data set. On this approach the ideal data set includes various astrophysical assumptions about the nature of sources, and their historical evolution, used to measure spacetime geometry, without assumptions regarding background geometry. There is an important limitation: there is no way to register the impact of dark matter or dark energy directly on the ideal observational set without substantive modeling assumptions.

19. The Gauss-Codacci constraint equations do impose some restrictions on spacelike separated regions, although these would not make it possible to determine the state of one region from the other (see Ellis & Sciama 1972). Events to the future of \(J^-(p)\) will in general be influenced by regions of spacetime that did not register on \(J^-(p)\), and extrapolations to the future are only valid if a no-interference condition holds.

20. For example, there are models which are locally (rather than globally) isotropic and homogeneous, such that the surfaces \(\Sigma\) have finite volume but are multiply connected, consisting of, roughly speaking, cells pasted together. Ellis 1971b explores this kind of model; see Lachieze-Rey & Luminet 1995 for a more recent review. Although isotropy and homogeneity hold locally at each point, above some length scale there would be geometrically preferred directions reflecting how the cells are connected.

21. A local spacetime property is a property such that for any pair of locally isometric spacetimes, they either both have the property or neither does. The property of being a solution to EFE is a local property in this sense. Global properties, by contrast, can vary between locally isometric spacetimes. There are a hierarchy of conditions that characterize the global causal structure of spacetimes. See Manchak 2013 for further discussion and references.

22. Roughly, the counterpart can be constructed by stringing together a collection of “copies” of the causal pasts, like laundry hanging on a clothesline. The properties of this counterpart spacetime are not constrained in regions outside the copies of the causal pasts. (For example, a closed timelike curve could exist in a region outside the copies of the causal pasts, violating global hyperbolicity.) See Malament 1977 and Manchak 2009 for further discussion. Malament (1977) reviews several different definitions of observational indistinguishability; Manchak (2009) establishes the generality of Malament’s “clothesline construction.”

23. See, for example, Baker et al. (2015) regarding the regimes of gravitational theory probed by solar system tests, observations of gravitational waves, and etc. Obviously, the physics horizon is based in part on an assessment of what is technologically and economically feasible, and will shift over time as new avenues of testing open up.

24. The CMB indicates that baryonic matter was very smooth at the time of decoupling because it was strongly coupled to radiation. Dark matter decouples from radiation earlier than baryonic matter, and can be much lumpier at the time the CMB is emitted; these lumps then generate perturbations in baryonic matter.

25. At the time of writing, there are no generally accepted candidates for successful detection of dark matter particles; instead, ongoing experimental searches have ruled out parts of the parameter space of candidate particles.

26. See Frieman et al. 2008 for a summary.

27. Synge’s G-method (Synge 1961) states that you can always run the EFE backwards from any given geometry \(g_{ab}\) to determine what energy-momentum stress tensor \(T_{ab}\) would solve the EFE exactly for that geometry. This does not provide a physical basis for the thus determined nature of such ‘matter’, which will for example generically violate the energy conditions.

28. See Ellis and Madsen (1991) for the general procedure, and Lidsey et al. 1997 for its use as regarding reconstructing the inflaton potential; this is essentially a version of Synge’s G-method.

29. In the case of say geology, even though each one is different, there are many mountains, rivers, and continents to observe and compare.

30. The first singularity theorem showed that these divergences follow from the Raychaudhuri equation (Ellis 1971a). One might have hoped that pressure would counteract these divergences, but this is not the case since it enters into the equation with the same sign as the energy density. Equation (2) is a special case of the general Raychaudhuri equation, in which shear, vorticity, and acceleration vanish due to the symmetries of the FLRW models.)

31. Refocusing leads to the “onion” shape of the past light cone: it reaches a maximum radius at some finite time, and decreases at earlier times (Ellis 1971a). See Ellis & Rothman 1993 for further discussion.

32. Cf. Earman (1995)’s defense, following Charles Misner, of “tolerance for spacetime singularities,” based on a critical assessment of the various reasons given in the physics literature for regarding singularities as a shortcoming of GR. See Curiel and Bokulich (2009 [2012]) for further discussion and references.

33. Bergmann argues that

a theory that involves singularities and involves them unavoidably, moreover, carries within itself the seeds of its own destruction; (1980: 186)

similarly, textbook discussions of the singularity theorems (such as Wald 1984: Chapter 9) emphasize that the singularity theorems show that the GR’s classical description of gravity breaks down in some regimes. See Curiel and Bokulich (2009 [2012]) for further discussion.

34. Penrose has emphasized this point; see Chapter 3 of Penrose 2016 for a recent discussion. Wikipedia has a thorough discussion of the BKL singularity (see Other Internet Resources).

35. These features are usually taken to be puzzling because they apparently require “fine-tuning,” discussed further in §4.2.

36. A particle horizon at time \(t_0\) is the timelike 3-surface in space-time separating world lines of particles moving along fundamental geodesics that could have interacted with a worldline \(\gamma\) at the time \(t_0\) (their world lines would have intersected the past light cone of that event) from those which could not. On the time slice \(t_0\), this defines a 2-sphere comprising the most distant matter that could have interacted with \(\gamma\) at that time. For a radiation-dominated FLRW model, the expression for horizon distance \(d_h\) is finite; the horizon distance at decoupling corresponds to an angular separation of \(\approx 1^{\circ}\) on the surface of last scattering.

37. It follows from the FLRW dynamics that \(\frac{|\Omega - 1|}{\Omega} \propto R^{3\gamma - 2}(t)\). \(\gamma > 2/3\) if the strong energy condition holds, and in that case an initial value of \(\Omega\) not equal to 1 is driven rapidly away from 1. Observational constraints on \(\Omega (t_0)\) can be extrapolated back to a constraint on the total energy density of the Planck time, namely \(|\Omega(t_p) - 1| \leq 10^{-59}\).

38. The Hubble radius \(d(H_0)\) is defined in terms of the instantaneous expansion rate \(\dot{R}(t)\), by contrast with the particle horizon distance \(d_h\), which depends upon the expansion history since the start of the universe. For radiation or matter-dominated solutions, the two quantities have the same order of magnitude.

39. Brout et al. 1978, Vilenkin 1983, and Hartle & Hawking 1983 are early papers pursuing a quantum account of the creation from different theoretical perspectives; see also Butterfield & Isham 2000.

40. Here we are in agreement with Albert 2012, which initiated a polemical exchange with Lawrence Krauss (whose book was the subject of Albert’s review).

41. Carter (1974) introduced a terminology that has been widely used: the “weak anthropic principle” refers to a selection effect, as illustrated in the case of Dicke’s response to Dirac, whereas the “strong anthropic principle” holds that the universe must (in some sense) allow for the existence of life. These two claims strike us as too different to be weak and strong versions of a single underlying principle. Rather than adopting these terms, below we will draw a related distinction between selection effects and the use of typicality assumptions to make anthropic predictions.

42. See Titelbaum (2013) for a recent proposal and references to related work.

43. Although we will not pursue the topic here, Weinberg’s argument is a special case that avoids some of the questions that arise in giving a general account of “anthropic prediction.” For example, the argument concerns variation of a single parameter, whereas the general case requires considering the variation of several parameters. See Aguirre (2007) for an account of the challenges and complications involved in carrying out anthropic predictions for a variety of parameters, and Starkman & Trotta 2006 for further problems with these methods.

44. This is closely related to Vilenkin (1995)’s “Principle of Mediocrity,” and Bostrom (2002)’s “Self-Sampling Assumption” (although he eventually argues for a principle applied to “observer-moments” rather than observers); see also Dorr and Arntzenius (2017).

45. As Aguirre et al. 2007 notes, it is possible to choose some other object to conditionalize on in a Weinberg-style argument; but this leads to similar problems regarding the choice of reference class and appeal to indifference.

46. More precisely, the assignment of probabilities depends on algebraic structure—the event algebra—defined on the sample space. Many different event algebras can be assigned over the same sample space.

47. See Norton (2010), who is also critical of Bostrom’s approach, but advocates a non-Bayesian approach to inductive reasoning.

48. There are different ways of enumerating the fundamental constants in both cases, but the arguments below do not depend upon choosing a specific list.

49. Barrow & Tipler 1986 is an influential early discussion of fine-tuning; for more recent discussions, see Barnes 2012 and Lewis & Barnes 2016.

50. See McGrew et al. 2001 and Colyvan et al. 2005 for challenges to justifying probabilities in this case, and Manson 2009 for a response and general discussion of fine-tuning.

51. A somewhat similar view is taken to follow from the existence of many distinct vacua in string theory (the “landscape”). Both views are distinct from the Everettian multiverse, although there have been speculative attempts to link these distinct multiverses.

52. See Ade et al. 2016 and Martin et al. 2014 regarding the most recent constraints from the CMB.

53. See Freivogel et al. 2006 for multiverses based in Coleman de Luccia tunnelling, and Aguirre 2007 for a an overview of EI.

54. A third one is that it is claimed by some that a multiverse definitively requires universes with spatial sections of negative curvature (Freivogel et al. 2006), so if if this is not observed the hypothesis is disproved. However that claim is disputed (Buniy et al. 2008).

55. See, for example, Vilenkin 2007.

56. There are active debates in the philosophy of physics regarding the status of infinite idealizations in other areas of physics; see, e.g., Batterman 2005 and Menon & Callender 2013.

57. Despite the prevalence of multiverse debates in popular science, there is in fact only a small minority of cosmologists actively working on this topic: see Hossenfelder’s comments in a blog post (2013, in Other Internet Resources), and the lack of mention of the topic in the standard textbooks referred to above and the data analysis by the Planck team (Ade et al. 2016).

58. It is also assumed that the consequence does not itself entail the hypothesis.

59. For further discussion along these lines, see Norton 2000, Harper 2012, Smith 2014, and Stein 1994; Smeenk (2017) considers the implications of this line of thought for inflation.

60. Although most of the anthropic literature is concerned only with necessary conditions for life, rather than sufficient. In other words, they do not in fact deal with biology, only with conditions for stars, planes, and elements like Carbon and Oxygen to exist. To make the link to life proper one needs to extend this discussion to the possibility spaces for life to function, as discussed for example by Andreas Wagner in his illuminating book Arrival of the Fittest (2014) describing various spaces of genotype to phenotype maps.

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George Ellis <>

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