Supplement to Counterfactuals

A. Indicative and Subjunctive Conditionals

Historically, many philosophers have been tempted to assume that indicatives and subjunctives involve entirely different conditional connectives with related but substantially different meanings (D. Lewis 1973b; Gibbard 1980; Jackson 1987; J. Bennett 2003). This may be justifiable as an analytic convenience: one can use it to focus, as we are here, on two different complex constructions involving if, tense, aspect, and modality, e.g., simple past conditionals vs. past perfect would-conditionals. But at a fully detailed level of analysis, there is no lexical ambiguity of if’s. There are just different effects produced by the elements with which if interacts. It might even turn out that there is no accurate binary semantic distinction between types of conditionals (Dudman 1988a).[45] This is just to accept a minimal version of compositionality, the fact that different conditionals contain crucially different components and the fact that if is not homonymous.[46] Recent work in compositional semantics and pragmatics has offered sophisticated and connected explanations of the differences between various conditionals. Of most relevance here is the work on the difference between simple past and past perfect would conditionals. Even this subregion of the literature is too rich to fully detail here, but the main issue and positions will be summarized.

As in (5) and (6), simple past conditionals (“indicatives”) do not admit of a counterfactual use, but past perfect would conditionals (“subjunctives”) do. Stalnaker (1975) proposed that indicative antecedents evoke possibilities compatible with what’s being assumed in the discourse, while subjunctives antecedents signal that no such assumption is being made. But this does not answer the key question: how can this difference be linked to the different morphology found in the two constructions? The two leading hypotheses begin with the observation that past tense marking in subjunctives does not receive its expected interpretation. The antecedent may be coherently supplemented with tomorrow to yield an antecedent that concerns a possibly counterfactual future event.[47]

  • (52)Bob died yesterday. If he had died \textbf{tomorrow} instead, he would have been 98 years old.

As evidenced by (54), this is not possible for a genuinely past tense reading of Bob had died, like that in (53).

  • (53) Yesterday I went to the Black Lodge. By the time I got there, Bob had died, but Cooper hadn't.
  • (54) I will go to the Black Lodge tomorrow. # By the time I get there, Bob had died, but Cooper hadn't.

This phenomenon does not occur with indicatives, and some have highlighted it as the dividing line between indicatives and subjunctives (Ippolito 2013: 2).[48]

  • (55)# If Bob danced tomorrow, Leland danced tomorrow.

This observation has generated two hypotheses. The first is:

  • Past as Remote Modality The past tense in subjunctives serves a modal function rather than a temporal one: it signals that the possibility described by the antecedent is not assumed to be among those regarded as actual in the discourse. (Isard 1974; Lyons 1977; Palmer 1986; Iatridou 2000; Schulz 2007, 2014; Starr 2014)

There is actually some disagreement about the exact content of the Past as Remote Modality hypothesis, but the above is the weakest version.[49] This neatly explains why subjunctives can have a counterfactual use, but needn’t be counterfactual. It also explains the intuition that subjunctives are logically stronger than indicatives: if it is appropriate to assert both, then the indicative follows from the subjunctive. It also generalizes more easily to languages which use a form for subjunctives that is unrelated to past tense. Schulz (2007, 2014) and Starr (2014) aim to address a gap in Past as Remote Modality analyses: they are not typically presented in a rigorous formal semantics. Past as Remote Modality approaches also inherit the responsibility of explaining why past tense would take on this modal meaning in these contexts. Iatridou (2000) proposes that remote modality and past tense have a common semantic feature: they express something about a topic that is remote from the perspective of the current discourse. This leaves room for a theory on which there is a single meaning that covers both uses, but that is refined to the modal use in conditional contexts. Schulz (2014) develops a polysemous account where the past tense in subjunctives contributes a distinct modal operator arises from the diachronic process of re-categorization.[50] The alternative hypothesis about past tense in subjunctives is this:

  • Past Modality The past tense in subjunctives modifies the modality rather than the time at which antecedent and consequent hold: it conveys what was possible/necessary in the past (Adams 1976; Skyrms 1981; Tedeschi 1981; Dudman 1984a,b; Arregui 2007, 2009; Ippolito 2006, 2008, 2013; Khoo 2015)

Past Modality approaches inherit no such responsibility because they find room for a normal past tense meaning by allowing for it to operate on the modality expressed, rather than the events described by the conditional. This approach begins with the idea that what’s possible is a function of time: what’s possible now is very different than what was possible at a prior point in history. For example, Tedeschi (1981) thinks of each event as a branch point that distinguishes one world from another. At the present time in the actual world, certain branches are open, but certain branches had to have been taken to have ended up here, now. The past tense in a subjunctive can then move one back to any salient earlier branch point and express generalizations about the branches open from there. However, from that past time, there will still be facts about what happens tomorrow. So, while the past tense changes the sense of possibility at play, adverbs like tomorrow can still refer to our current future, they just do so from a shifted modal perspective.

On the Past Modality approach, counterfactual uses are made possible by the assumption that something which is now impossible may have once been possible. Of course, non-counterfactual uses are also accommodated: one may want to describe what was possible at a past point in our timeline. Another crucial detail for Past Modality approaches is the treatment of simple past indicative conditionals. They are analyzed as a species of epistemic modality about a past event rather than historical modality (Tedeschi 1981; Arregui 2007; Ippolito 2013). This is needed to explain the truth-conditional differences between subjunctives and indicatives, e.g., (3)/(4).

Past Modality theories require the logical form of subjunctives to depart from its surface form: tense must take scope over the conditional. Various plausible ways of working this out have been explored (Tedeschi 1981; Arregui 2007; Ippolito 2013). A more significant concern arises from hindsight counterfactuals such as (56).

  • (56)You have been offered a $1 bet on the outcome of a fair coin toss. You decline. The coin is flipped and comes up heads.} If you had bet heads, you would have won $1.

Intuitively, the counterfactual is true. But, it is hard to see how this can be true on a past modality approach (Barker 1998; Edgington 2004; Schulz 2007). If one goes back to a time before the coin flip, it seems unlikely that on even most of the branches where you bet, the coin toss comes out the way it actually does. But then you wouldn’t have won $1, and the counterfactual would be false. Ippolito (2013: §3.6) offers a Past Modality approach designed to address this issue. Another potential issue arises with epistemic uses of counterfactuals like the following one from Hansson 1989.[51]

Suppose that one night you approach a small town of which you know that it has exactly two snack bars. Just before entering the town you meet a man eating a hamburger. You have good reason to accept the following conditional:

  • (57)If snack bar A is closed, snack bar B is open

Suppose now that after entering the town and seeing the man with the burger, you see that A is in fact open. I comment on how lucky we are that this one is open. You temper my enthusiasm by reminding me:

  • (58)If snack bar A had been closed, snack bar B would have been open

(57) appears to be a counterfactual conditional about the past, but which expresses something about our present epistemic state: there’s no temptation to read it as claiming that the closure of snack bar B caused A to be open. This challenges the assumption Past Modality approaches rely on to distinguish subjunctives from simple past indicatives: only simple past indicatives express something about our present information about past events. Incidentally, these epistemic counterfactuals are also a difficult case for many philosophical theories which aim to identify the indicative/subjunctive distinction with the epistemic/metaphysical modality distinction, e.g., Weatherson (2001). For more on the distinction between epistemic and metaphysical modality, see Varieties of Modality.

Copyright © 2019 by
William Starr <will.starr@cornell.edu>

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