Supplement to Critical Thinking

Internal Critical Thinking Dispositions

Researchers have identified a dauntingly long list of internal critical thinking dispositions. However, the task of designing a curriculum that will foster them all is simpler than it seems. For by definition internal critical thinking dispositions are fostered by getting students into the habit of inquiry and facilitating improvement in how they do it. The obvious key to such improvement is guided and scaffolded internally motivated practice of inquiry, with feedback.

The following traits have been identified as critical thinking dispositions in the publications cited:

  • wholehearted interest in the subject (Dewey 1933)
  • intellectual responsibility (Dewey 1933; Siegel 1988; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • concern to become and remain generally well-informed (Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991)
  • flexibility in considering alternatives and options (Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991)
  • fair-mindedness (Siegel 1988; Facione 1990a; Bailin et al. 1999b; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • honesty in facing one’s own biases, prejudices, stereotypes. and egocentric or sociocentric tendencies (Siegel 1988; Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991)
  • understanding of the opinions of other people (Facione 1990a; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • prudence in suspending, making or altering judgments (Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991; Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001)
  • willingness to reconsider and revise views where honest reflection suggests that change is warranted (Siegel 1988; Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001; Ennis 1991)
  • clarity in speaking; writing or otherwise communicating (Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001; Ennis 1991)
  • orderliness in working with complexity (Facione 1990a; Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001)
  • intellectual perseverance (Facione 1990a; Halpern 1998; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • reasonableness in selecting and applying criteria (Facione 1990a)
  • focusing attention on the concern at hand (Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991)
  • seeking as much precision as the situation requires (Facione 1990a; Ennis 1991)
  • taking into account the total situation (Ennis 1991)
  • seeking and offering reasons (Siegel 1988; Ennis 1991)
  • suppression of impulsive activity (Halpern 1998)
  • willingness to abandon non-productive strategies in an attempt to self-correct (Halpern 1998)
  • awareness of the social realities that need to be overcome so that thought can become actions (Halpern 1998)
  • respect for high-quality products and performances (Bailin et al. 1999b)
  • independent-mindedness (Siegel 1988; Bailin et al. 1999b; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • intellectual humility (Siegel 1988; Paul & Elder 2006)
  • respect for others in group inquiry and deliberation (Bailin et al. 1999b)
  • respect for legitimate intellectual authority (Bailin et al. 1999b)
  • an intellectual work-ethic (Bailin et al. 1999b)
  • anticipating possible consequences (Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001)
  • mature and nuanced judgment (Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001)

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David Hitchcock <>

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