Supplement to Critical Thinking

Educational Methods

Experiments have shown that educational interventions can improve critical thinking abilities and dispositions, as measured by standardized tests. Glaser (1941) developed teaching materials suitable for senior primary school, high school and college students. To test their effectiveness, he developed with his sponsor Goodwin Watson the Watson-Glaser Tests of Critical Thinking, whose descendants are in widespread global use under the name “Watson-Glaser Critical Thinking Appraisal” (Watson & Glaser 1980a, 1980b, 1994). He found that senior secondary school students receiving 10 weeks of instruction using these materials improved their scores on these tests more than other such students receiving the standard English curriculum during the 10 weeks, to a degree that was statistically significant (i.e., probably not due to chance). More recently, Abrami et al. (2015) summarized in a meta-analysis the best available evidence on the effectiveness of various strategies for teaching students to think critically. The meta-analysis used as a measure of effectiveness a modified version of a statistical measure known as “Cohen’s d”: the ratio of a difference in mean score to the statistical deviation (SD) of the scores in a reference group. A difference of 0.2 SD is a small effect, a difference of 0.5 SD is a moderate effect, and a difference of 0.8 is a large effect (Cohen 1988: 25–27). Abrami et al. (2015) found a weighted mean effect size of 0.30 among 341 effect sizes, with effect sizes ranging from −1 to +2. This methodologically careful meta-analysis provides strong statistical evidence that explicit instruction for critical thinking can improve critical thinking abilities and dispositions, as measured by standardized tests.

Although contemporary meta-analysis provides a more justified verdict on claims of causal effectiveness than other methods of investigation, it does not give the reader an intuitive grasp of what difference a particular intervention makes to the lives of those who receive it. To get an appreciation of this difference, it helps to read the testimony of the teachers and students in the Laboratory School of Chicago where Dewey’s ideas obtained concreteness. The history of the school, written by two of its former teachers in collaboration with Dewey, makes the following claim for the effects of its approach:

As a result of this guarding and direction of their freedom, the children retained the power of initiative naturally present in young children through their inquisitive interests. This spirit of inquiry was given plenty of opportunity and developed with most of the children into the habit of trying a thing out for themselves. Thus, they gradually became familiar with, and to varying degrees skilled in, the use of the experimental method to solve problems in all areas of their experience. (Mayhew & Edwards 1936: 402–403)

A science teacher in the school wrote:

I think the children did get the scientific attitude of mind. They found out things for themselves. They worked out the simplest problems that may have involved a most commonplace and everyday fact in the manner that a really scientific investigator goes to work. (Mayhew & Edwards 1936: 403)

An alumna of the school summed up the character of its former students as follows:

It is difficult for me to be restrained about the character building results of the Dewey School. As the years have passed and as I have watched the lives of many Dewey School children, I have always been astonished at the ease which fits them into all sorts and conditions of emergencies. They do not vacillate and flounder under unstable emotions; they go ahead and work out the problem in hand, guided by their positively formed working habits. Discouragement to them is non-existent, almost ad absurdum. For that very fact, accomplishment in daily living is inevitable. Whoever has been given the working pattern of tackling problems has a courage born of self-confidence and achieves. (Mayhew & Edwards 1936: 406–407)

In the absence of control groups, of standardized tests, and of statistical methods of controlling for confounding variables, such testimonies are weak evidence of the effectiveness of educational interventions in developing the abilities and dispositions of a critical thinker—in Dewey’s conception, a scientific attitude. But they give a vivid impression of what might be accomplished in an educational system that takes the development of critical thinking as a goal.

Dewey established the Laboratory School explicitly as an experiment to test his theory of knowledge, which

emphasized the part in the development of thought of problems which originated in active situations and also the necessity of testing thought by action if thought was to pass over into knowledge. (Dewey 1936: 464)

Hence the curriculum of the school started from situations familiar to children from their home life (such as preparing food and making clothing) and posed problems that the children were to solve by doing things and noting the consequences. This curriculum was adjusted in the light of its observed results in the classroom.

The school’s continued experimentation with the subject matter of the elementary curriculum proved that classroom results were best when activities were in accord with the child’s changing interests, his growing consciousness of the relation of means and ends, and his increasing willingness to perfect means and to postpone satisfactions in order to arrive at better ends…. The important question for those guiding this process of growth, and of promoting the alignment and cooperation of interest and effort, is this. What specific subject-matter or mode of skill has such a vital connection with the child’s interest, existing powers, and capabilities as will extend the one [the interest–DH] and stimulate, exercise, and carry forward the others [the powers and capabilities–DH] in a progressive course of action? (Mayhew & Edwards 1936: 420–421)

In an appendix to the history of the Laboratory School, Dewey (1936: 468–469) acknowledges that the school did not solve the problem of finding things in the child’s present experience out of which would grow more elaborate, technical and organized knowledge. Passmore (1980: 91) notes one difficulty of starting from children’s out-of-school experiences: they differ a lot from one child to another. More fundamentally, the everyday out-of-school experiences of a child provide few links to the systematic knowledge of nature and of human history that humanity has developed and that schools should pass on to the next generation. If children are to acquire such knowledge through investigation of problems, teachers must first provide information as a basis for formulating problems that interest them (Passmore 1980: 93–94).

More than a century has passed since Dewey’s experiment. In the interim, researchers have refined the methodology of experimenting with human subjects, in educational research and elsewhere. They have also developed the methodology of meta-analysis for combining the results of various experiments to form a comprehensive picture of what has been discovered. Abrami et al. (2015) report the results of such a meta-analysis of all the experimental and quasi-experimental studies published or archived before 2010 that used as outcome variables standardized measures of critical thinking abilities or dispositions of the sort enumerated in Facione 1990a and described in sections 8 and 9 of the main entry. By an experimental study, they mean one in which participants are divided randomly into two groups, one of which receives the educational intervention designed to improve critical thinking and the other of which serves as a control; they found few such experiments, because of the difficulty of achieving randomization in the classrooms where the studies were conducted. By a quasi-experiment, they mean a study with an intervention group that receives an educational intervention designed to improve critical thinking and a control group, but without random allocation to the two groups. Initially, they included also what they called “pre-experiments”, with single-group pretest-posttest designs, but decided at the analysis stage not to include these studies. By a standardized measure, they mean a test with norms derived from previous administration of the test, as set out in the test’s manual, such as the Watson-Glaser Critical Thinking Appraisal (Watson & Glaser 1980a, 1980b, 1994), the Cornell Critical Thinking Tests (Ennis & Millman 1971; Ennis, Millman, & Tomko 1985; 2005), the California Critical Thinking Skills Test (Facione 1990b, 1992) and the California Critical Thinking Dispositions Inventory (Facione & Facione 1992; Facione, Facione, & Giancarlo 2001). They included all such studies in which the educational intervention lasted at least three hours and the participants were at least six years old.

In these studies they found 341 effect sizes. They rated each educational intervention according to the degree to which it involved dialogue, anchored instruction, and mentoring. They found that each of these factors increased the effectiveness of the educational intervention, and that they were most effective when combined. They explained the three factors as follows.

Dialogue: In critical dialogue, which historically goes back to Socrates, individuals discuss a problem together. The dialogue can be oral or written, and cooperative or adversarial. It can take the form of asking questions, discussion, or debate. Some curricula designed to promote critical thinking establish “communities of inquiry” among the students. Such communities were a prominent feature of Dewey’s Laboratory School, incorporated as a means of promoting the primary moral objective of fostering a spirit of social cooperation among the children.

An important aspect of this conditioning process by means of the school’s daily practices was to aid each child in forming a habit of thinking before doing in all of his various enterprises. The daily classroom procedure began with a face-to-face discussion of the work of the day and its relation to that of the previous period. The new problem was then faced, analyzed, and possible plans and resources for its solution suggested by members of the group. The children soon grew to like this method. It gave both individual and group a sense of power to be intelligent, to know what they wanted to do before they did it, and to realize the reasons why one plan was preferred to another. It also enlisted their best effort to prove the validity of their judgment by testing the plan in action. Each member of the group thus acquired a habit of observing, criticizing, and integrating values in thought, in order that they should guide the action that would integrate them in fact. The value of thus previsioning consequences of action before they became fixed as fact was emphasized in the school’s philosophy. The social implication is evident. The conscious direction of his actions toward considered social ends became an unfailing index of the child’s progress toward maturity. (Mayhew & Edwards 1936: 423–424)

Communities of inquiry are also a feature of the Montessori method described by Thayer-Bacon (2000) and of the Philosophy for Children program developed by Matthew Lipman (Splitter 1987). Lipman (2003) examines theoretically what is involved in creating communities of inquiry. Hitchcock (2021) argues that the most obvious way for schools to develop critical thinking is to foster development of communities of inquiry.

Anchored instruction: In anchored instruction, whose advocacy goes back to Rousseau (1762) and Dewey (1910), there is an effort to present students with problems that make sense to them, engage them, and stimulate them to inquire. Simulations, role-playing and presentation of ethical or medical dilemmas are methods of anchoring.

Mentoring: Mentoring is a one-on-one relationship in which someone with more relevant expertise (the mentor) interacts with someone with less (the mentee). The mentor acts as a model and as a critic correcting errors by the mentee. Examples of mentoring are an advisor talking to a student, a physician modeling a procedure for a medical student, and an employee correcting an intern. Abrami et al. (2015) identified three kinds of mentoring in the studies that they analyzed: one-on-one teacher-student interaction, peer-led dyads, and internships.

Abrami et al. (2015) also compared educational interventions with respect to whether they were part of subject-matter instruction. For this purpose, they used a distinction among four types of intervention articulated by Ennis (1989). A general approach tries to teach critical thinking separately from subject-matter instruction. An infusion approach combines deep subject-matter instruction in which students are encouraged to think critically with explicit reference to critical thinking principles. An immersion approach provides deep subject-matter instruction with encouragement to think critically, but without explicit reference to critical thinking principles. A mixed approach combines the general approach with either the infusion or the immersion approach; students combine a separate thread or course aimed at teaching general critical thinking principles with deep subject-matter instruction in which they are encouraged to think critically about the subject-matter. Although the average effect size in the studies using a mixed intervention (+0.38) was greater than the average effect sizes in the studies using general (+0.26), infusion (+0.29) and immersion (+0.23) interventions, the difference was not statistically significant; in other words, it might have been due to chance.

Cleghorn (2021), Makaiau (2021), and Hiner (2021) make specific suggestions for fostering critical thinking respectively in elementary, secondary and post-secondary education. Vincent-Lancrin et al. (2019) report the results of a project of the Organization for Economic Cooperation and Development to develop with teachers and schools in 11 countries resources for fostering creativity and critical thinking in elementary and secondary schools.

Ennis (2013, 2018) has made a detailed proposal for a mixed approach to teaching critical thinking across the curriculum of undergraduate education. Attempts at implementing such an approach have faced difficulties. Weinstein (2013: 209–213) describes the attempt at Montclair State University in Montclair, New Jersey, from 1987 through the 1990s. He reports that the university’s requirement to include critical thinking in all general education courses led to the use of the concept in identifying topics and tasks in course syllabi, but without a unifying theoretical basis. The committee that approved courses as satisfying a general education requirement ignored the relation of curricular outcomes to critical thinking, and focused instead on work requirements with a prima facie relation to reflective thought: term papers, projects, group work, and dialogue. Sheffield (2018) reports similar difficulties encountered in his position from 2012 to 2015 as the inaugural Eugene H. Fram Chair in Applied Critical Thinking at Rochester Institute of Technology (RIT) in Rochester, New York. A cross-disciplinary faculty advisory group was not ready to accept RIT’s approved definition of critical thinking, but never reached a consensus on an alternative. Payette and Ross (2016), on the other hand, report widespread acceptance of the Paul-Elder framework, which involves elements of thought, intellectual standards, and intellectual virtues (Paul & Elder 2006). Sheffield (2018) reports that many colleges and universities in the United States have received funding for so-called “Quality Enhancement Plans” (QEPs) devoted to critical thinking, many of them written by Paul and Elder or developed in consultation with them. He faults the plans for having a typical time frame of five years, which he argues is probably too short for meaningful results, since lasting institutional change is often extremely slow.

Copyright © 2022 by
David Hitchcock <>

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