Notes to Decision-Making Capacity

1. Philosophers who theorize about autonomy rarely seem to recognize how idealized their accounts are, nor do they typically feel constrained in their theorizing by the desire to ensure that on their theory most people (and most decisions of most people) turn out to be autonomous. An interesting exception can be found in S. I. Benn (1975), who argued that we need a much more widely recognized distinction between autonomy (an ideal) and basic features of effective agency (what he called “autarchy”). Effective agency is not just the ability to make choices, but requires a very basic kind of orientation to the world that most of us have, an orientation that includes (a) grasping that one can affect the world, (b) some minimal ability to delay gratification and plan for the future, (c) the ability to form mostly true beliefs, (d) the ability to use one’s beliefs effectively to guide the pursuit of one’s desires, and (e) the ability to act on the decisions one makes once they are made (i.e., freedom from internal compulsions).

2. There are tensions within existing law relating to capacity and mental illness that should be made clear. Although one is not supposed to be declared incompetent simply on the basis of a diagnosis of mental disorder, the determination of competence in these cases doesn’t always play the same powerful role in the determination of treatment that it plays in other cases. In non-psychiatric cases, if a person is competent and refuses a treatment, her refusal must be honored. But individuals with psychiatric conditions can be involuntarily hospitalized regardless of capacity if they are deemed to be a threat to themselves or others. Moreover, once hospitalized, it is often true that the patient can be treated against his or her will regardless of capacity (though this varies quite a bit. In some cases involuntarily hospitalized patients are allowed to refuse treatment in hospital). However, clinicians for all sorts of reasons are often reluctant to force treatment on a patient who has decision-making capacity. Thus even among the hospitalized psychiatric population, the issue of DMC remains important for many treatment decisions. For the situation in the UK see Craigie (2013b) and Richardson (2013). For overview of U.S. law on this matter see Appelbaum and Gutheil (2007: 81–85).

3. Two of the subjects did appear to have trouble with appreciation, as one woman refused to believe she was sick, and another, though believing she was sick, refused to believe what her doctors had told her, namely, that she was in serious danger of dying from starvation (Tan, Stewart, Fitzpatrick, & Hope 2006a: 270).

4. In 2016 MAID became legal in Canada. Currently, both self-administered and clinician-administered medical assistance in dying are legal and available to anyone with a “grievous and irremediable” illness or disability that brings “unbearable physical or mental suffering.” The law defines “grievous and irremediable” as a serious condition that is incurable, that is accompanied by “an advanced state of irreversible decline in capability”and that makes “natural death reasonably foreseeable.” Persons suffering from mental illness are explicitly excluded from the current law, and at the time of writing the government of Canada is assessing arguments for and against this option. There are some important ethical and legal reasons for arguing that MAID ought to be extended to persons suffering from mental illness, as well as popular support for the idea. However, many also believe that it is doubtful mental illness can satisfy the current criteria for inclusion. A new bill would remove the “reasonably foreseeable death” criterion and expand the law to chronic illness and disabilities, but explicitly states that “mental illness is not irremediable.”

Currently only self-administered medically assisted dying is available in the United States in Colorado, Hawaii, Maine, New Jersey, Oregon, Vermont, Washington, Montana, California and the District of Columbia. These laws limit assistance to competent patients with a terminal illness, so the issue of mental disorder and competence is far less pressing as mental disorder itself cannot be the reason for requesting MAID. As of this writing no form of MAID is legal in the UK, and very liberal policies on MAID exist in The Netherlands and Belgium.

Whether or not mental illness will ever be seen as potentially meriting access to MAID (in Canada, the US or the UK), issues of capacity and mental illness are still highly relevant to MAID debates. For example, many people in the U.S. think that MAID should not be available for those who are depressed or have any other mental disorder, even if they satisfy the other criteria, such as having a terminal illness. The U.S. laws are restricted to competent patients, and most people simply assume that this rules out depression and mental illness, because they assume that these conditions are sufficient to deem someone incompetent. They are unaware of what, earlier in this entry, was called the “independence from diagnosis” criterion (§4.5). If that condition has moral force, however, then a policy excluding patients who otherwise qualify but have depression or some other mental illness simply on that basis would not necessarily be appropriate. Clinically these issues can only ultimately be settled on a case by case basis. There are also practical and theoretical issues that arise regarding what counts as competence, how it is to be assessed, and by whom, in the context of MAID (Charland 2016). These vary tremendously across, and even within national jurisdictions.

Copyright © 2020 by
Jennifer Hawkins <>
Louis C. Charland

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