Notes to Decision Theory

1. Our discussion of cardinalizing utilities is quite similar to Resnik’s 1987: 88–91.

2. The further assumptions would need to relate particular options to particular privileged levels of utility; for instance, one would need to argue that a rational agent’s preference ordering should incorporate, say, a privileged zero-utility option, in which case ratios of utility distances from this option would be meaningful.

3. See Heap, et al. 1992: ch. 3, for an accessible discussion of empirical results concerning the Allais Paradox, as well as some empirical models that have been suggested in response to the paradox.

4. Savage himself uses the term consequences rather than outcomes.

5. This problem of nonsensical acts is considered by some to be the main problem with Savage’s result (see, e.g., Joyce 1999: 108). We raise this issue again below when discussing weaknesses of Savage’s theory.

6. To keep things simple, we will assume that the set \(\bO\) is finite, but Savage proved a similar result for an infinite \(\bO\).

7. When the set of outcomes is infinite, the agent needs to satisfy an additional axiom. But to keep things simple, we will assume finitely many outcomes.

8. As some have pointed out (e.g., Zynda 2000), the derived probability function over states and the utility function over ultimate outcomes need not represent the agent’s actual beliefs and desires. Perhaps the agent has preferences over acts satisfying Savage’s axioms that are quite disconnected from her actual beliefs and desires. Moreover, Savage’s theorem does not rule out that an agent with preferences satisfying his axioms can be represented using an alternative functional form that better matches her decision making psychology. These are alternative readings of the theorem. Nonetheless inference to the best explanation would seem to point in favour of regarding the expected utility representation as uncovering the belief and desire determinants of the agent’s preferences.

9. A result similar to Savage’s can however be obtained without the Rectangular Field Assumption, in particular by adding some extra structure to the set of prospects. See, for instance, Bradley 2007.

10. Levi (1991), for instance, criticises Jeffrey’s theory for involving probabilities over acts, which he claims cannot be sensibly interpreted. Joyce (2002) and Rabinowicz (2002) however argue that such probabilities are both meaningful and often necessary for deliberation.

11. Bolker’s proof is rather complicated, and there does not seem to exist any student-friendly introduction to it.

12. This actually follows from the fact that the preferences do not determine a single probability function, given that the domain of the probability function is infinite (this latter point follows from the atomlessness of \(\Omega\)). For if \(P\) and \(Q\) are probability functions on an infinite domain that agree on the ordering of all propositions in their domain, then \(P\) and \(Q\) are the same probability function (Villegas 1964).

13. Of course, the first- and third-person perspectives differ in terms of the evidence available for determining how an agent perceives a decision problem, not least evidence obtained via introspection.

Copyright © 2015 by
Katie Steele <>
H. Orri Stefánsson <>

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