Notes to Deductivism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Notably, abstract algebra, which includes group theory, field theory, and so on, but also (to use a less widespread name) abstract analysis, which includes topology, the study of Banach spaces, Hilbert spaces, and so on.

2. Hellman and Shapiro (2019) is a survey of contemporary structuralism, building on its authors’ individual versions (Hellman 1989; Shapiro 1997).

3. This statement bolts on to eliminative structuralism the usual model-theoretic definition of semantic consequence. There may be some deviations from this scheme in special cases, e.g. in the case of set theory.

4. Previous critical studies of deductivism include chapter 3 of Resnik (1980) and chapter II of Rheinwald (1984), where the view is called “syntactic implicationism” (syntaktischer Implikationismus, 1984: 62); a version of deductivism (called “enhanced if-thenism”) is advocated in Maddy (2022) and criticised in Hellman (2021); and briefer discussions appear in Parsons (2008: 53–6), Linnebo (2017: 48–55), Shapiro (2000: 148–157) and Bostock (2009: 180–183), the last two of which focus on Hilbert’s deductivism.

5. A logic is axiomatisable just when it has a sound and complete proof procedure.

6. As is well known, logical tradition of the past hundred years gives first-order logic a privileged role; and first-order logic is axiomatisable. Although first-order logic is no longer as dominant as it was in the mid-twentieth century, it remains the default logic, especially for metatheoretical investigations, a point stressed in Williamson (2014). For some, such as Quine (1970: 91), first-order logic’s axiomatisability is one of its chief virtues.

7. What flavour of deductivism does Russell have in mind? His use of “formally” in the last quotation gives us a sense. Russell distinguishes formal from material implication (1903 [2009: 14]). Formal implication is characterised by the antecedent and the consequent both containing the same variables. For example, to say “\(x\) is a man implies \(x\) is a mortal, for all values of \(x\)” is to assert a formal implication (1903 [2009: 11]). Material implication, by contrast, holds between propositions without variables (1903 [2009: 14]). For example, to claim that Euclid’s fifth proposition follows from the fourth, neither of which has free variables, is to assert a material implication (1903 [2009: 14]). His claim in the earlier quotation that mathematical statements are of the form “p implies q”, where “p and q are propositions containing one or more variables, the same in the two propositions” shows that he takes mathematical statements to be formal implications. At times, Russell adds that the formalisation of a mathematical claim should be prefaced by universal quantifiers, so that all the variables in the conditional become bound (1903 [2009: 6]). This understanding of deductivism seems closest to what we term unreflexive deductivism in §4, although to firmly categorise Russell’s view as such may be anachronistic.

8. The 1882 edition clarifies that the “certain circumstances” are when “the gap cannot be removed through a change in the deduction” (Pasch 1882: 98).

9. Given his aversion to formalisation, it would not be Brouwer who would later formalise intuitionistic mathematics and logic but his student Arend Heyting, with contributions from others.

10. In John Burgess’s (1983) terminology, an account that captures the meanings of mathematical statements as ordinarily spoken would be hermeneutic.

11. Maddy’s (2022) “enhanced deductivism” is arguably a species of this whatever-it-takes form. See Hellman (2021) for critical discussion.

12. Field adds that there are independent reasons, also available to platonists, for taking logical consistency as a primitive notion rather than reducing it in the standard way to the model-theoretic notion.

13. The objection that deductivism cannot account for unaxiomatic mathematics was raised by Resnik (1980: 131–2). The example of Euler is his.

14. See Robson (2008) more generally for the mathematics of ancient Iraq, and chapter 4 in particular for the mathematics of the Old Babylonian period (c. 1850–1600 BC).

15. Compare the deductivist’s refusal to “deductivise” derivability facts to a recent conventionalist’s insistence that metasemantics is factual and so should not be “conventionalised” (Warren 2020: 334–8).

16. Maddy (2022: 267–272) also discusses applications, which constitute her second challenge to deductivism.

17. For Leng’s fictionalism, see in particular her 2010 book.

18. See Resnik (1980: 124–5), which follows Putnam (1967a [1975: 26]).

19. It is difficult to spell out what it would be for a statement to lack a proof in some absolute sense. But here we are merely describing the usual attitude, not trying to explicate it. Goldbach’s Conjecture states that every even number greater than 2 is the sum of two primes.

20. We assume that relevant deductive systems are recursively axiomatisable and consistent.

21. Benacerraf (1973: 665) mentions the omega-rule in this connection. The rule allows us to infer “for all \(n\), \(\phi(n)\)” from the infinitely many premises \(\phi(0), \phi(1), \phi(2),\ldots\).

22. To be more precise, one might specify that these are all and only the true sentences of first-order Dedekind-Peano Arithmetic; but the point applies to any reasonable system of arithmetic.

23. For example, as is well known, the first-order theory of dense linear orders without endpoints is complete.

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