Notes to Descartes’ Modal Metaphysics

1. Second Replies, AT 7:149, CSM 2:106. This is of course just a restatement of Descartes’ Fourth Meditation truth rule. See also Fifth Replies, AT 7:350–51, CSM 2:243. We use “CSM” to refer to the pagination in Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch 1984 and Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch 1985. I use “CSMK” to refer to the pagination in Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny 1991. I use “AT” to refer to the pagination in Adam and Tannery 1996.

2. There are three passages in Descartes’ corpus which might appear to reflect the view that some non-intellectual perceptions are clear and distinct. One is in Second Replies, in which Descartes says that a person with jaundice perceives snow “just as clearly and distinctly as we do when we see it as white” (ibid.). This passage is at best neutral on the question of whether or not perceptions of snow are actually clear and distinct; indeed, the passage is immediately followed by Descartes’ claim that if there is any certainty to be had it occurs in the clear and distinct perceptions of the intellect and nowhere else. The second passage is in First Replies, in which Descartes says that just as we can clearly and distinctly perceive part of a chiliagon if we focus our attention, we can clearly and distinctly perceive a portion of the sea (AT 7:113). This passage can be read as reflecting the Second Meditation view that we can clearly and distinctly perceive a body so long as we focus our attention on those aspects of the body that are perceived by the intellect alone (AT 7:30–1). Given the weight of the Second Replies passage, this is presumably how it should be read. The same reading applies to the passage in Conversation with Burman, AT 5:160, CSMK 343. For a contrary view see Rickless 2005, 315–17.

3. Fourth Replies, AT 7:249, CSM 2:173. See also Curley 1986; Garber 1986, 81–97; Cottingham 1988, 43–46; and Cunning 2010, chapter two.

4. See Cunning 2003.

5. Second Replies, AT 7:130–31, CSM 2:94; Principles I:66–74, AT 8A:32–8, CSM 1:216–21.

6. Principles I:72, AT 8A:36–37, CSM 1:217–18; “Preface to the Reader,” AT 7:9, CSM 2:8; Second Replies, AT 7:164, CSM 2:116.

7. There are parallel passages in Second Replies at AT 7:163–64, CSM 2:115, and AT 7:166, CSM 2:117.

8. “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118, CSMK 235; Frankfurt 1977, 43.

9. “For [Arnauld], 29 July 1648,” AT 5:224, CSMK 358–59; Frankfurt 1977, 49.

10. Frankfurt 1977, 50–51. For a similar reading of Descartes on the necessity of eternal truths, see Plantinga, 95–114. Note that Alanen (1991, 74–75) offers a reading of Frankfurt according which which he does not see Descartes as committed to the contingency of all truths.

11. AT 4:118–19, CSMK 235; Curley 1984, 582.

12. For a complete discussion of the objection see Van Cleve 1994, 58–62. See also the more recent discussion in Kajamies 2008. Curley appears to concede the objection in Curley 1988, 42.

13. For another interpretation according to which Descartes takes the term ‘necessary’ to apply in a weaker sense in the case of necessary truths, see Seacord 2015. She argues that Descartes must be using the term ‘necessary’ in a weaker sense if he is to hold that God freely wills truths that are necessary.

14. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 144–46.

15. For additional criticisms of Bennett’s view see Seacord 2015.

16. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 144–45. Kaufman reiterates the view in Kaufman 2002, 37–9. He notes (2002, 33–35) that an alternative version of Curley’s position can avoid Van Cleve’s objection if Descartes has the view that divine freedom and omnipotence are to be understood as supreme independence and indifference and that God is free in creating eternal truths in the sense that nothing outside of God has any bearing on which eternal truths God actually creates.

17. For Descartes, God’s freedom to not create the eternal truth that the radii of a circle are equal is not an ability to create alternative eternal truths about radii – for example that they be unequal. Instead, it consists in his utter independence and in the fact that nothing independent of Him constrains His activity. Another view is that although God’s freedom to not create eternal truths about the radii of a circle is not an ability to will alternative eternal truths – for example that the radii of a circle be unequal – but an ability not to create truths about radii at all. (See Skrzypek 2019.) A problem for this view is that it has to (and explicitly does) say that there was a time “before” God willed the actual eternal truths when he might not have willed them, and it attributes potential reality to God, but Descartes holds that God contains no potential reality whatsoever.

18. Most commentators tend to do this. For the most recent instances, see Walski 2003, Ragland 2005, Wee 2006 and Pessin 2010. For an interesting (but speculative) discussion of why Descartes is happy to identify divine freedom and supreme indifference, see Sperling 2021.

19. It might have been helpful if Descartes had somewhere offered the equivalent of Spinoza’s scholium to Proposition 17 of Part I of Ethics. But the fact that he didn’t might reflect his own ambivalence about the matters in question.

20. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, and Walski 2003. Walski argues that Descartes arrives at the view that the eternal truths are necessary, and that Descartes arrives at this view by way of his doctrines of divine simplicity, divine indifference, and divine omnipotence (24, 40–1). Walski insists however that Descartes holds that God could have made the current eternal truths false (30, 43–44), and concludes that Descartes’ overall view of the eternal truths is incoherent (44).

21. These texts will be considered below in sections four, five, and six.

22. It may be that Descartes equivocates in his use of eternal. He holds that God exists from eternity and that He wills everything from eternity, yet he holds that eternal truths have no existence outside of our thought. His view might just be that eternal truths exist in non-eternal finite minds and are eternal in the sense that their truth values do not change. This reading squares with the passages (AT 1:145, CSMK 23; and AT 2:138, CSMK 103) in which Descartes distances himself from the view that eternal truths are eternal in any robust sense.

23. Broughton (2002, 120–21), Menn (1998, 245–47), and Frankfurt (1970, 119–20) point out that one of the benefits of the First Meditation thought experiments is that they help the meditator (in the Second Meditation) to converge on what is perhaps the first clear and distinct perception he has ever had.

24. “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118, CSMK 235. See also Conversation with Burman, 16 April 1648, AT 5:160, CSMK 343. The passages in the latter are tricky because they are Burman’s reports of one of his discussions with Descartes.

25. See also Mattern 1984, 475, 486–87; Alanen 1991, 78–79; and Wilson 1978, 120–31.

26. Wilson 1978, 185–98. A discussion of Wilson’s view is in section five.

27. Normore 1991, 68. For Descartes’ view that even possible reality is a created by God, see “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118–19, CSMK 235, and Alanen 1991, 182.

28. Principles I:48, AT 8A:23, CSM 1:208. Descartes mentions in the first line of this section of Principles that “eternal truths” are part of his ontology as well. These are beings which, as he puts it, “have no existence outside our thought.” A discussion of eternal truths is in section three below.

29. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 141–43.

30. See Ethics Part I, Proposition 17, scholium. See also Nelson 1993, 685–88, and Nelson and Cunning 1999.

31. Wilson 1978, 185–198, and Curley 1978, 193–206. See also Gueroult 1984, 47–57.

32. “To Regius, June 1642,” AT 3:567, CSMK 214. See also “To Gibieuf, 19 January 1642,” AT 3:475–76, CSMK 202.

33. Fourth Replies, AT 7:228–9, CSM 2:160–1; “To Princess Elizabeth, 21 May 1643,” AT 3:665, CSMK 218; “To Princess Elizabeth, 28 June 1643,” AT 3:693, CSMK 227.

34. Similar Cartesian reminders (to the effect that we should not doubt a clear and distinct perception just because we do not understand how it could be true or how it squares with something else that we clearly and distinctly perceive) are in Principles I:41 (AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206), Principles II:35 (AT 8A:60, CSM 1:239), and Sixth Replies (AT 7:436, CSM 2:294).

35. See Nelson and Cunning 1999, 148.

36. Note that Spinoza appears to analyze some possibility claims in terms of actual events that occur in the immutable series that God wills. See Koistinen 2003.

37. See also Almog 2002, 4, and Cunning 2010, chapters seven and eight.

38. See for example Appendix to Fifth Replies, AT 9A:205, CSM 2:271; Principles I:43, AT 8A:21, CSM 1:207; The Fifth Meditation, AT 7:69, CSM 2:48; “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:116, CSMK 233; and Second Replies, AT 7:144, 166, CSM 2:103, 117.

39. Of course, everything here depends on the proper Cartesian analysis of ‘could not do otherwise’, but see Alanen 1999 for a reading that builds on the Principles I:37 passage. For a compatibilist reading of the passage see Cunning 2023, chapter six.

40. See also Nelson 1997.

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