Supplement to Descartes’ Life and Works

Descartes’ 1616 Law Thesis – English Translation






René Descartes I.V.Q. License, S.P.D.

I delight to come to pure well-springs, and to drink them in; I delight to pluck new flowers. [Lucretius, On the Nature of Things, Book 4, ll. 2-3]

Indeed, when I flee to you, uncle, you whom I should most esteem, it seems as if I have come to the agreeable well-spring of integrity itself, where, not only will I be adorned with the most fragrant flowers of your fame, so that I myself do nothing of future glory [variant of Juvenal, Satires, Book VIII, l. 75], but I also do not despair that if my youth itself, unripe until now and green, is irrigated by the most sweet well-springs of your virtue, it can at length bloom. For as with the tender meadows, the more they are moistened with fruitful waters, the more they are covered with the ornamental beauty of flowers, so surely human talents, the more they drink the sweet draughts of knowledge and virtue, the more they flourish.

Because when, a short time ago, with a peculiar felicity I began learning, almost from the tender conclusion of a squalling young age until now, I attached my little lips to the delicious well-springs of the liberal arts with the foster-mother’s moist milky dew. And indeed gently at first, exceedingly delighted by the pleasing murmur of a roaring wave, I eagerly desired to drink in the poetical waters, dripping with honey. Soon, struck with wonder at a deeper rumbling and rushing sounds like a torrent, I thirsted with great longing for the wider rivers of eloquence. But in truth, not satisfied with these, which of course excite a thirst for knowing without in any way assuaging it, I searched finally with keen application for that most immense ocean of the sciences and from that ocean all the streams flowing most abundantly in different directions. Indeed [I was] not so carried away by vainglorious folly that I, not thinking about the chains of my poverty, supposed that I could drink up even the single streamlet of any discipline, but when I was to have chosen some stream before the rest, by whose sweetest dew the thirst of my natural talents would be assuaged for the future, I longed to discern everything by experience.

Nor did the laborious desire for knowledge weary me, until at last I perceived that the very pure well-springs of virtue and learning flow from you, so that thereafter I began to loathe the rest and only to value and pursue what is yours. That is to say (lest my discourse perhaps gets a bit murky), I set you forth as the one thing out of all that I should admire and imitate. For so great is the purity of your life, so great the integrity of your customs, the sweetness of your conversation, the richness of your teaching, the brightness of your virtue, that nothing more could be desired to complete that most pleasant well-spring. For what else is there? Or rather so that it may roar gently — does the swift river quiver because of a meandering brook? [Horace, Odes, Book II, Part 3, ll. 11-12] Yes, when it is compelled to allow those well-springs of your virtue, flowing around with the most agreeable buzzing of public opinion, and the meandering judgments of the envious. And yet not that especially, nor the purity of its silver fruitful water, nor the golden splendor of its rich sand, has so much allured me to it. But a most beautiful nymph appeared here to me, not Artemis, such as the unfortunate Actaeon once saw, but Themis, who changed me also, but for an utterly dissimilar reason; indeed she did not bury me in a stag, so that once and for the future I would, with frightening speed, avoid the presence of the one gazed at, but she tamed the wildness from [my] former inborn freedom into a slave, so that I would pursue her constantly with burning desire all of my life. Since indeed now especially I greatly wish that I be proved not unworthy to be her lover and worshipper, it has pleased you, doubtless not undeservedly, you who reside in your pure well-springs as if in their own shrine, to assemble, so that you may deign to unite to me the favor and benevolence of so lovable a goddess.

Theses according to both sides of the law concerning the settling of last wills

  1. A last will can generally be defined as the final clause of a will, according to which an inheritance is granted.
  2. Its most important division, not fully observed everywhere, is in that which is of the civil law and that which is of the law of the nations.
  3. For the latter [the law of the nations] receives powers from someone’s private ordering;
  4. The former [civil law] from public authority.
  5. The latter is executed by an adequate declaration alone;
  6. The former by observation, of all kinds, of the law.
  7. Finally the latter everyone, who has anything to dispose of, can make;
  8. The former indeed those only to whom the law or the prince will have allowed.
  9. We distinguish these therefore because the last will of the law of the nations is valid by pontifical law.
  10. Nor is any custom considered in that, but only natural justice.
  11. However, that of civil law is righty defined by Modestinus by a just determination of our will concerning that which someone wishes to happen after his death.
  12. Those under age do not have the power to do this.
  13. Nor the servants of a son, not even concerning merely unusual goods, with the exception of the castrated, or those who are like the castrated.
  14. Nor those wavering concerning their own estate, or those in error.
  15. Nor the insane, or those in a passionate rage.
  16. Nor the prodigal, the management of whose goods is prohibited.
  17. Nor those condemned by capital judgment, unless an appeal is pending.
  18. Nor anyone who is a servant.
  19. Nor finally anyone whom the law has judged to be dishonest and incapable, by reason of misconduct, of making a will.
  20. Such are heretics, and those who promote them, if they disdain to make amends within a year from the time when they are excommunicated.
  21. Moreover, this last will, which is of civil law, is made either by common law or singular law.
  22. That made by common law is either pronounced publicly or in writing.
  23. Which division arises from a different custom in each case.
  24. To be sure, that all the witnesses hear it publicly pertains to the custom of the former one.
  25. And therefore in those words understanding is altogether required.
  26. For the custom of the latter, that they sign at the same time and seal it with a seal-ring.
  27. Likewise as to written documents, that they were not written in marks.
  28. And indeed for both, that seven suitable witnesses are summoned.
  29. Who are questioned for the sake of this matter.
  30. And the unwilling would not continue all the way to the end.
  31. And in one continuous time the entire last will is completed.
  32. Moreover, a legatee also, for a will declared orally [not in writing], is a suitable witness.
  33. An heir in neither of the two.
  34. Whence it appears here that seven witnesses are required, not for simple proof, but most of all because of custom.
  35. These to be sure although after the completed testament, or immediately [missing text] cease to offer testimony.
  36. Or also [missing text] the suitable witnesses were not there at the making of the testament, yet the law does not fail in that [situation].
  37. But if it can be proven sufficiently anyplace, just as [missing text].
  38. By singular law a last will is made in which custom [missing text] of a soldier, or countryman, or added over and above [missing text].
  39. Also at the time of a contagion, the witnesses [missing text] is relaxed: of the rest moreover [missing text].
  40. That finally which avails only [missing text] last will.

René Descartes will try to defend the truth of these things (with God leading) [MISSING TEXT]

In a public examination of the law at Poitiers, confirmed for the day 21 December [MISSING TEXT]

Poitiers, Typis IVLIA [MISSING TEXT]

Further Documentation

Descartes’ 1616 Law Thesis – Latin Translation

Descartes’ 1616 Law Thesis – Copy of Original Document


Holly Johnson (Mississippi State University) and I translated the above from the Latin text. Holly gets credit for finding all of the passages cited by Descartes. We deliberately kept the flowery language and complex sentence structure in order to preserve Descartes’ style of writing as a young man. We thank Joan Sampey for help with a few tricky passages. We are indebted to Daniel Garber for providing a copy of the original Latin Law Thesis, and to Jean-Robert Armogathe, Vincent Carraud, Robert Feenstra, who in their 1988 Nouvelles De La Republique Des Lettres article provide a clean Latin transcription—the original document being difficult to read in places.

Copyright © 2023 by
Kurt Smith <>

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