Notes to Desert

1. Perhaps because so many typical desert claims mention a deserver, the desert that the deserver is said to deserve, and the desert base in virtue of which the deserver is said to deserve the desert, some have concluded that desert is a three place relation relating these three items. This idea is discussed in Olsaretti (2003, 4) as well as in McLeod (1999, 61–2). However, it is important to keep in mind that well-formed desert statements may involve more than, or fewer than, three relata. Consider, for examples, these statements (with related terms italicized and enumerated):

D1: You [1] deserve a raise [2].

D2: In virtue of your hard work [1], you [2] deserve to get a raise [3] on September 1 [4].

D3: In virtue of your hard work [1], you [2] now [3] deserve to get a raise [4] from your boss [5], on September 1 [6].

Each of these sentences is well-formed and seemingly “complete”. Each of them suggests something different about the number of terms related by the desert relation.

The kinds of question about desert that are typically of interest when we consider desert claims in ethics or in social and political philosophy can be discussed without making any assumptions about the desert-relation’s number of argument-places. In such contexts, we may want to know (a) who is the deserver; (b) what the deserver is said to deserve; (c) upon what basis the deserver is said to be deserving of that desert; (d) from whom the deserver is said to deserve that desert. We may also want to know (e) the time at which the deserver is deserving of this desert; and (f) the time at which the deserver deserves to receive this desert. We proceed here on the assumption that can profitably discuss these questions without committing ourselves to any view about the metaphysical complexity of the concept of desert.

2. There are a few passages in Rawls’ A Theory of Justice in which he suggests something like this view. See, for example, the passage on p. 103 where he is talking about a just system of cooperation. He imagines that someone has followed the rules and is therefore entitled to some reward. Rawls says, ‘But this sense of desert presupposes the existence of the cooperative scheme…’ thereby suggesting that there is some sense of ‘desert’ in which it means the same as ‘entitled (by a just scheme)’.

3. The multiplier view might be more plausible if we say that Jones is ‘more deserving’ than Smith, but deny that this means that the welfare level Jones deserves is higher than the welfare level Smith deserves. Then no sense can be made of the question whether Jones, or Smith, was getting more, or less, welfare than he deserves; and so one could not object that to augment Jones rather than Smith is to augment the person who is already getting more than he deserves, rather than the person who is getting far less than he deserves. (Understood this way, we could not take the number by which we multiply someone’s welfare level to compute their contribution to the value of the world to be their deserved welfare level. Instead we would have to take that number to represent, in some more vague sense, ‘how deserving’ that person is.) The multiplier view, understood this way, still faces objections: it entails, for example, that if someone deserves to suffer, then no matter how bad his life is (how negative his welfare level), it would always be better for him to suffer more (have an even more negative welfare level). (This is essentially Kagan’s reason for rejecting the multiplier view; see his 2012, 73.)

4. Aristotle: ‘…all men agree that what is just in distribution must be according to merit (axian)…’ (Nicomachean Ethics, V, 3). Sidgwick: ‘Men ought to be rewarded in proportion to their deserts’ (1907, Bk III, Ch. 5). Ross: ‘The duty of justice is particularly complicated, and the word is used to cover things which are really very different – things such as the payment of debts, the reparation of injuries done by oneself to another, and the bringing about of a distribution of happiness between other people in proportion to merit. I use the word to denote only the last of these’ (2002, pp.26–27).

5. When stated in this way out of context, the passage is misleading. Mill did not endorse this view; he was just saying that this is what the ‘general mind’ believes.

Copyright © 2020 by
Fred Feldman <>
Brad Skow <>

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