Notes to Determinables and Determinates

1. One might wonder if (as Johansson [2000] maintains) these relations also differ in that the genus/species relation applies to substances, whereas determination applies to properties. Against this line of thought one might maintain that if there is a distinction here, it isn’t deep, since the relata in both cases are (in the first instance) properties (animal, rational animal; color, red) instantiated in particulars (substances); nor do there appear to be in-principle barriers to taking determination to be a relation between objects, events, or other particulars (see §2.2).

2. See also Cook Wilson (1915), who prefigures this point.

3. Johnson here relies on a number of assumptions, including that the sharing of determinables would be like the sharing of parts, and that parthood conforms to weak supplementation, in which case subtracting determinable from determinate would leave an independent property—contra the usual assumption that determination is non-conjunctive. Against this line of thought one might maintain either that parthood needn’t be seen as obeying weak supplementation (or its conjunctive correlate) or that shared determinables needn’t be seen as shared parts.

4. These features are motivated by the previous historical survey; see Johnson (1921: Vol I, Ch IX), Armstrong (1997: 48–49), Funkhouser (2006: 548–9), and Sanford (2014) for similar presentations.

5. This sort of increase in specificity is in contrast to, e.g., the increase in specificity associated with being in Chicago and being happy and in Chicago; see features 6 and 7.

6. The principle also ensures the incompatibility of, e.g., red and navy, since an object’s being navy entails its being blue, and as per Determinate incompatibility, red and blue are incompatible.

7. Compare the incompatibility of red and blue with that of red and prime (Elder 1996).

8. Note that the relativization to perspective here is not just a matter of seeing different parts of the feather; the latter phenomenon in itself would not support taking the relativization at issue to be indicative of multiple relativized determination per se.

9. As Poli (2004) observes, while Johnson’s discussion is pitched in terms of different kinds of “adjectives” as applied to “substantives”, nonetheless “Johnson reclassifies linguistic data on the basis of ontological distinctions” (Poli 2004: 167).

10. Perhaps not all, however: see Mulligan (2006, 2014: sec. 9.2.2) for arguments that determination is not appropriately applied to certain formal concepts—e.g., negation.

11. For example, realists about determinable properties may take these to be either universals (as per Fales 1990; Armstrong 1997; Elder 1996; Johansson 2004) or tropes (as discussed in Mulligan 1992 and Bacon 1995 and endorsed in Brentano 1887, Segelberg 1999, and Funkhouser 2006).

12. For example, in response to Johansson’s claim that in viewing a patterned colored object, “There is, as a kind of background, a strictly identical something throughout the whole pattern: the color determinable” (2000: sec. 6), Massin says, “It seems to me, on the contrary, that we fail to experience any strictly identical features when we perceive a pattern of colours” (2013: 397).

13. That said (as Massin observed; p.c.) given that there are typically many levels of determination associated with a given determinable, it also remains to explain why we do not see “layers” of, e.g., colocated color determinables.

14. Moreover, in their discussions, both Armstrong and French maintain that the fundamental determinable features at issue are irreducible to determinate features, though not for reasons that are appropriately deemed prima facie (see §5.1).

15. Beyond general considerations about scientific ontology, laws, and explanation, there are cases to be made that irreducible determinables enter into an attractive account of higher-level efficacy (see §5.2) and are needed to properly accommodate metaphysical indeterminacy in (various interpretations of) quantum mechanics (see §5.3).

16. Though common, the supposition that reality is (fundamentally and entirely) maximally precise can be challenged—for example, by, e.g., the scientific considerations discussed above (see also the discussion of metaphysical indeterminacy in §5.3).

17. But see §4.2.

18. As Gillett and Rives say: “[M]any philosophers […] accept what Armstrong calls the ‘Eleatic Principle’ [stating:] Everything that exists makes a difference to the causal powers of something. (Armstrong 1997: 41–2). If determinable properties do not contribute causal powers to individuals, nor otherwise determine such powers, then it appears that they fail the Eleatic Principle and hence do not exist” (2005: 487).

19. This concern is a special case of Kim’s (1989, 1993, and elsewhere) exclusion argument against irreducible higher-level properties. While Kim takes overdetermination concerns to motivate reductionism about higher-level features, others (e.g., Heil 2003 and Gillett and Rives 2005) see these as motivating anti-realism about determinables, on grounds that determinables cannot be reduced, metaphysically or conceptually, to any constructions from or of determinates. See Christensen (2014) for a response to the overdetermination concern according to which overdetermination of powers is pervasive, and hence not a particular problem for the posit of determinables.

20. This concern may be partly inspired by certain attempts to characterize determination as non-conjunctive, as in Stout’s claim: “the point is that red and yellow do not resemble each other in one character and differ in another. The respect in which they are alike, i.e. colour, is also the respect in which they are dissimilar” (1930: 398).

21. As Berkeley said: “[I]t is thought that every name has, or ought to have, only one precise and settled signification, which inclines men to think there are certain abstract, determinate ideas, which constitute the true and only immediate signification of each general name. […] whereas, in truth, there is no such thing as one precise and definite signification annexed to any general name, they all signifying indifferently a great number of particular ideas” (1710: §18).

22. Berkeley’s arguments against abstract ideas might be seen as suggesting another reason to reject determinables; namely, that we are unable to think about them (contra, e.g., G. F. Stout’s [1930] view that we can think of colour without thinking of some special colour); see van der Schaar (1991: 156) and Poli (2004: 179) for discussion.

23. As Searle puts it: “We invent a term (e.g., ‘color’, ‘texture’, ‘shape’) to cover a whole range of characterising terms which are all in the same line of business. But this higher order term (determinable) is not part of an analysis of the lower order terms, it is just a name for the line of business they are all in” (1959: 154).

24. Armstrong allows that “it remains possible that some of these classes are unified in a more direct manner [involving] a determinable property” (1997: 52), and later suggests that this is the case for determinable predicates appearing in functional laws of nature (see §5.1); this (temporary) exception aside, Armstrong is anti-realist about determinables.

25. See, e.g., Fales 1990 for arguments that Armstrong’s account can only handle linearly orderable determinates, and Eddon 2007 for arguments that the account also fails for certain fundamental physical quantities. See Armstrong 1997 and Morganti 2011 for responses.

26. As a referee pointed out, further determinability does not follow just from the continuity of space; for if space is ultimately constituted by points, there could nonetheless be a maximally determinate shape given by the pattern of occupation of points.

27. Antony qualifies: “What I really think is that there is no such thing as a ‘disjunctive property’—rather, there are only disjunctive predicates” (2003: 9); hence she might better be seen as an eliminativist with a disjunctive conception of determinable predicates.

28. In Yablo’s account there is a particularist echo of Fales’s account of “causal essences” as determinable or generic universals which are contained within the essences of specific universals.

29. As a referee noted, one might think that even if red and orange share certain powers, red and blue might share other powers—say, being able to trigger a machine designed to detect those shades. The proponent of a powers-based account might respond that such artificial powers are not clearly to the point of accommodating seemingly orderable similarities between determinates.

30. Fales (1990: Ch. 9.3) suggests that Requisite determination may be explained if the subset of causal relations/powers associated with the determinable is nomologically insufficient for distinct existence.

31. But see, e.g., Jenkins 2011, Schaffer 2012, Wilson 2014, and Rodriguez-Pereyra 2016 for arguments that metaphysical dependence needn’t be a strict partial order.

32. Funkhouser (2006) seems to presuppose that determinables should be disjunctively understood; see 566, note 2.

33. A particular \(a\) falls under \(F\) iff \(F\) is a determinable \(\langle S, f\rangle\) and \(a\) is in the domain of \(f\); a particular \(a\) instantiates \(F\) iff \(F\) is a determinate \(\langle \langle S, f\rangle , Ei\rangle \) and \(f(a) = i\).

34. A particular instantiates a determinate \(\langle \langle S, f\rangle , Ei\rangle \) iff it is mapped by \(f\) to the point \(i\) in the metric space \(S\) encoded by determinable \(\langle S, f\rangle \). To instantiate more than one determinate of that determinable, a particular would have to be mapped to more than one such point. This cannot happen, however, since \(f\) is a function.

35. Each determinate is associated with a specific point in the metric space encoded by its determinable; but a metric space also encodes a distance relation among its points. Hence we say that a determinate \(\langle \langle S, f\rangle , Ei\rangle \) is more similar to determinate \(\langle \langle S, f\rangle , Ej\rangle \) than it is to determinate \(\langle \langle S, f\rangle , Ek\rangle \) iff \(d(i,j) \langle d(i, k)\), where \(d\) is the distance relation encoded by \(S\).

36. Fine’s approach to characterizing determinable-determinate structure takes as primitive a ‘part-whole’ relation on possible states, where which states can ‘fuse’ is sensitive to the incompatibility of co-determinates: states are incompatible just in case there is no whole of which they are both part. This primitive part-whole relation is used to define the notion of a state-space: a set of partially ordered states obeying ‘bounded completeness’, according to which any subset with an upper bound (a state into which states fuse) has a lower upper bound. Next, an ‘\(R\)-space’—regular space—is defined as a state-space satisfying two conditions: Supplementation (if \(s\) is a proper part of \(t\), then some non-null part of \(t\) \(u\) is a state which is disjoint from \(s\)) and Overlap (if the fusion of a set of states \(S\) exists and overlaps with state \(t\), then some member of \(S\) overlaps with state \(t\)). A ‘\(D\)-space’—determinate space—is then defined as an \(R\)-space satisfying two further conditions: Directed Completeness, according to which any states that are pairwise compatible are jointly compatible, and Independence, according to which if one state is disjoint from and compatible with another then any state excluded by the first is also compatible with the second. A \(D\)-space contains a full array of ‘world-states’, corresponding to the possible worlds.

Fine then characterizes the co-determination relation between states, as follows. First, he defines the ‘occlusion’ relation, where state \(t\) occludes state \(s\) just in case every part of \(s\) overlaps a part of \(t\) or cannot fuse with any part of \(t\). Next, he defines the ‘coincidence’ relation, which holds between states that mutually occlude each other; as Fine says, “this corresponds, intuitively speaking, to two states being determinates of the same determinable” (2011: 163). For example, the state of being red on the left and round is coincident with—is a codeterminate state of—the state of being green on the left and round. Under the conditions of a \(D\)-space, the coincidence/co-determinate relation is an equivalence relation, which can be used to define state determinables [\(s\)], where, e.g., the color of a particular patch would be the equivalence class containing the state of the patch’s being red, the state of the patch’s being green, and so on. More complex state determinables would reflect equivalence classes of fused states—e.g., the color-shape of a particular patch would be the equivalence class containing the state of the patch’s being red and round, the state of the patch’s being green and round, the state of the patch’s being red and square, and so on.

Logical space sensitive to determinable/determinate structure is then the space of equivalence classes under the coincidence/co-determinate relation, where the classes are ordered by a derived part-whole relation, according to which region [\(s\)] is part of region [\(t\)] only if for some state in [\(s\)] and some state in [\(t\)], the first is part of the second. Effectively, logical space is the homomorphic image of \(D\)-space under the coincidence relation. Determinables are regions of logical space, and what it is to have a determinable is to have some state in the region.

One concern with Fine’s approach is that, while advertised as ‘abstract’, it relies on controversial ontological assumptions. To start, while Directed Completeness accommodates Non-disjunctive specification, it does this by ruling out there being any disjunctive states; as Fine says, “Directed Completeness is meant to exclude disjunctive or non-determinate states” (2011: 168), but one might want to allow disjunctive states even if one doesn’t want to identify determinables with such states. Moreover, the assumption that states obey Supplementation—a condition which Fine says is

especially plausible for ‘determinate’ states […] if \(s\) and \(t\) are states, with \(s\) a proper part of \(t\), then there must be a part of \(t\) that is left over once one ‘subtracts’ \(s\) (2011: 165)

—rules out that determinables can be constitutionally shared by determinates in a way accommodating Non-conjunctive specification.

Two further concerns reflect certain limits of Fine’s account. First, his characterization of determinables as equivalence classes of co-determinate states does not accommodate determination as holding between properties, notwithstanding that these are the paradigmatic relata of determination; at best it characterizes state determinables (e.g., an equivalence class of incompatible states pertaining to the color of a given patch). Second, Fine’s account does not have resources for articulating structure associated with distinct levels of determination; in the case of color, for example, the view has resources to characterize the determinable color (as the equivalence class of all coincident—mutually occluding—states), but not the determinable red.

37. As Massin observes, on disjunctivism, “determinates are more fundamental than determinables, since determinables boil down to disjunctions of resembling determinates” (2013: 414).

38. Among other lines of thought here are that various views are compatible with intuitively ‘over and above’ goings-on asymmetrically supervening with the strongest form (i.e., metaphysical) necessity, as on a view of properties as essentially individuated by any laws (including those involving the emergence of fundamentally novel entities or features) into which they enter, or a Malbranchean view on which God occasions mental states upon the occurrence of certain physical states, and where such a God acts consistently, in every possible world. Also relevant here are views on which non-fundamenta asymmetrically necessitate more fundamental goings-on, as in the case of created beings whose existence entails that of God, but where God was under no necessitating compunction to have created those beings.

39. The word ‘natural’, in scientific or other contexts where non-artifactual reality is at issue, covers non-fundamental as well as fundamental phenomena.

40. As mentioned in §3.2, one might also maintain that particulars can exactly resemble in determinable as well as determinate respects.

41. Wilson argues, to start, that no determinate instance seems suited to ground such a constitutive modal fact. Nor does any more complex determinate property—e.g., a disjunction or mereological sum of determinates—provide a ground for such a fact; for even if such disjunctive or other complex combinations of determinates can could do so, such combinations are logically or metaphysically gerrymandered, and so by lights of a ‘naturalness’ criterion are less fundamental than the determinable capable of grounding such a constitutive modal fact in non-gerrymandered fashion.

42. Among the many philosophical applications of determination that we do not have space to treat here include the view (endorsed in Hurley 1992 and Tappolet 2004, with some qualifications) that thick moral values are determinates of thin moral values rather than (as on the ‘two-components’’ analysis) species of thin moral values; the ‘Lockean’ suggestion that belief and relevantly high degrees of belief are related as determinable to determinate, in a way that unifies traditional and formal epistemology (see Sturgeon 2008, Lee and Silva Jr. 2022); an account of epistemic grounding (extending typically causal accounts of epistemic basing of an agent S’s justified belief in reasons or evidence) in terms of determination, such that, e.g., S’s knowing that p may cotemporally metaphysically depend on S’s seeing (qua determinate ‘way of knowing’) that p (see Kallestrup 2019); the ‘proportionality strategy’ for responding to the problem of profligate causal omissions (endorsed by Dowe [2010] and rejected by Bernstein [2014]), which “employs the determinate/determinable relationship to restrict which among many putative causes is the cause” (Bernstein 2014: 429); an account of quantities (endorsed by Johansson [2000]; Bigelow and Pargetter [1990]; Armstrong [1988], and rejected by Wolff [2020]) according to which a quantity such as mass is a determin­able requiring further determination by determinate magnitudes; and the view that key to understanding the interpretation of Dao offered by Wang Bi (226–249 CE) lies in realizing that “Wang Bi, as well as Laozi, thinks that it is possible for something to have a determinable without having a corresponding determinate, provided that it has the determinable to the infinite degree”—since, e.g., if something with infinite size were to have a determinate size x, the latter would constrain the size to x, implying that it was not infinite, after all (Hong 2019: 226). See note 49 for two other applications expanding on one discussed in the main text.

43. More specifically, Kistler argues, by attention to the ideal gas law \(T = P V /nR\) (\(T\) being temperature, \(P\) pressure, \(V\) the volume occupied by the gas, n the number of moles, and \(R\) the universal gas constant), that it is plausible to take \(T\) and \(P\) to be two determinables with respect to the same set \(D\) of determinates—namely, the set of states of motion of the molecules composing the gas that share the mean kinetic energy specific for \(T\) and \(P\), given a fixed volume \(V\). In that case, “it follows from general properties of the determinate/determinable relation that the law is necessary if true” (Kistler 2005: 217). That said, the supposition (following Hooker 1981: 497) that macro-property determinables can be determined by micro-physical properties is not uncontroversial; this issue will be revisited in §5.2.

44. MacDonald and MacDonald (1986) take the relation between mental and physical properties to be analogous to, though not the same as, determination; the analogy is in respect of a supposed identity of determinable and determinate (mental and physical) property instances, which is offered as avoiding causal overdetermination.

45. For example, neuroscience and psychopharmacology treat certain mental properties in a way sensitive to physical variations.

46. Either a powers-based account or Funkhouser’s property-space account can accommodate the metameric morals: on a powers-based view, science-relativity of determination dimensions reflects that higher-level sciences associate fewer powers with determinables than do lower-level sciences; on Funkhouser’s view, science-relativity reflects that what looks like a point relative to one property space can, when “magnified”, be an extended space, with further (possibly physical) determination dimensions.

47. As Worley says, “One of the essential constituents of at least intentional mental properties is that they have content. […] If mental properties determine physical properties, then, each realizing physical property must have content as one of its constituents. But physical properties don’t have content as one of their constituents” (1997: 294).

48. Wilson argues that a determinable-based (‘object-level’) account of MI has several advantages over its main competitor – a metaphysical supervaluationist (‘meta-level’) account of the sort endorsed by Akiba (2002), Barnes and Williams (2011), and others. These include that a determinable-based account is reductive (unlike supervaluationist accounts, on which MI is primitive), fully compatible with classical logic and semantics (unlike supervaluationist accounts, which introduce propositional indeterminacy and an associated indeterminacy operator), and such as to make systematic sense of MI in an appropriately wide range of cases (see below).

49. This treatment of macro-object boundary indeterminacy suggests an answer to the ‘problem of the many’ (Unger 1980), according to which in cases involving Mount Everest and its realizers, or Tibbles the cat and its cat-constituters, too many mountains or cats are on the scene. Instead, in such cases we can say that there is only one mountain, only one cat: the one with the determinable boundary (see Wilson 2013). In addition, the possibility of multiple relativized determination provides a plausible basis for interpreting the Chinese Madhyamaka Buddhist tenet that the world is indeterminate in all respects, in that (in particular) for any given thing there are multiple equally plausible yet incompatible determinations of the way it is (see Ho 2020).

50. See Bokulich (2014) for further discussion of determinables and quantum MI.

51. See Calosi and Mariani for a recent overview; see Torza 2020, Glick 2020, and Fletcher and Taylor 2021 for some concerns with there being genuine quantum MI or with a determinable-based treatment of such; see Calosi and Wilson 2021 and Schroeren 2022 for some responses.

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