Supplement to Denis Diderot

Biography of Diderot

The arc of Diderot’s long, varied, and eventful life can be summarized by reducing it to four distinct phases:

  1. a period of maturation amidst struggle in the 1730s and 40s as the impoverished young Diderot sought to establish himself as a self-sustaining adult in Old Regime Paris through the pursuit of the highly precarious vocation of writing and publishing;
  2. a period of intellectual ascent after 1749 as Diderot used the new financial stability and intellectual notoriety acquired through his supervision of the epochal Encyclopédie project to build a base for his mature career as an Enlightenment writer, critic, and philosophe;
  3. a period of intellectual celebrity as the new freedom brought about by the final completion of the Encyclopédie project in 1765 allowed Diderot to produce some of his most important, if often unpublished, work;
  4. a twilight period begun in 1773 after his financial burdens were fully eliminated through the lucrative patronage offered by Empress Catherine the Great of Russia, a period when Diderot brought to completion the wider philosophical program established earlier, while adding a new strand of political radicalism to the mix.

Each of these four phases is discussed below, in its own section.

1. Years of Formation and Struggle (1713–1749)

Born in 1713 in Langres, a middling cathedral town in central France about 300 kilometers southeast of Paris, Diderot began life with very little pointing him toward his future as a world renowned writer and intellectual. His father was an artisan cutler who hoped his son would rise above him into a career in the liberal professions, and since Langres possessed a Jesuit college, Diderot’s father enrolled him there in an effort to give him the education necessary for social uplift. His ambitions were rewarded when Denis graduated with prizes in rhetoric and mathematics, an event that Diderot once described as his father’s proudest moment.

While still under the tutelage of the Jesuits, Diderot contemplated an ecclesiastical career, a common method of Old Regime social uplift that would have provided him with a regular, salaried life in the manner dreamed for him by his father. He went far enough to be tonsured in 1726, but stopped short of full ordination, and after his academic success, Diderot’s family supported his move to Paris around 1729 in order to continue his studies and find a professional calling. This led to more education, including the equivalent of a bachelor’s degree awarded in 1732 by the Collège d’Harcourt in Paris, and three more years studying natural philosophy and theology at the Sorbonne. Law was another professional option available to him, but after an unhappy apprenticeship with an attorney, Diderot left this behind as well. Little documentation exists regarding this period in Diderot’s life, but what is clear is that he found in Paris a thriving center of ideas and urban sociability, and out of his immersion in this world as a student, his career began to move on a different track.

1.1 Earliest Career as a Writer

He made his way during these years through work as a piece writer in the vibrant but economically constrained world of Parisian publishing. D’Alembert would later romanticize the life of the poor but fully independent writer as an ideal to which all honnêtes gens de lettres should aspire. But as the illegitimate son of a wealthy aristocrat who provided for him financially, D’Alembert never actually lived the impoverished bohemian writer’s life in the flesh. Diderot did, and during these early years he struggled continuously to eke out a minimal existence through occasional work with his pen. Money came from journalists who paid him by the word to provide content for their weekly and monthly periodicals. In this way, Diderot penned many of the anonymous book reviews that were a staple of these journals even if there is no way to document Diderot’s output today.

Since he was also good with languages, especially English, a talent whose source in Diderot’s biography is unclear (some say he taught himself using a Latin-English dictionary), he also found work as a translator. His first publishing success came in 1744 with his translation of Temple Stanyan’s staid Grecian History, a work that earned him his first published notice in the Journal des Savants as the book’s “rather negligent” translator. It also earned him a meager payment of three hundred francs. He also showed his interest in and expertise with the Enlightenment natural sciences through his translation of Robert James’ dictionary of medical terms. More translation work followed, and while the jobs helped him to increase his public notoriety, they did not make him any more financially secure. His financial hardship was intensified in 1743 when he chose to marry the equally poor Antoinette Champion. The couple gave birth to a daughter soon after their wedding, and while Diderot remained devoted to his wife and child throughout his life, his marriage led his family in Langres to renounce him completely, further increasing his hardship.

1.2 Intellectual Breakthrough and Public Debut in the 1740s

In the 1740s, amid his continuing poverty and social marginalization, Diderot began to build the career as a writer and intellectual that would make him famous. In 1742, he met the young Jean-Jacques Rousseau, a key moment in the genesis of the philosophe movement that Rousseau immortalized for posterity in his Confessions. Etienne Bonnot de Condillac likewise joined their circle at this time, and together these three would-be philosophes shared a bohemian writer’s life looking for public acclaim and patronage (the two often went together) in the bustling circles of lettered Parisian society. In this setting, and without any clear financial return in mind as he made the effort, Diderot also began to write and publish his own books. Through them, and sociable circulation within the urbane society of Paris, he began to establish his name and reputation as a philosophical author, one who from the start, and ever after, was associated with the most radical and controversial ideas.

The diversity of Diderot’s textual output in the 1740s exemplifies the crooked path of his ascent. It also illustrates the eclectic and sharp edged character of Enlightenment philosophie. His first published work, which appeared in 1745, continued in a way his work as a translator since it was not a wholly original text, but a very loose translation of Anthony Ashley Cooper, the Earl of Shaftesbury’s An Inquiry Concerning Virtue and Merit. Diderot’s text included a set of reflections in a prologue, and lengthy footnotes providing further reflection on Shaftesbury’s ideas, which Diderot shared. These included Shaftesbury’s naturalist and loosely materialist and deist leanings. The Jesuit-edited Journal de Trévoux captured the spirit of the book rightly, if not affectionately, when it called it a “discourse on morality as if written by Mr. Locke”. The Locke referenced here was the author of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, a work which to many French readers in 1745 amounted to a treatise on materialist metaphysics. This treatise showed how human consciousness could be viewed as a phenomenon derived from matter and motion alone, or so those worried about such ideas claimed. This materialist Locke, who allegedly wondered whether matter could think, circulated in eighteenth-century France as one of many specters constituting the wider philosophical danger interchangeably called deism, atheism, materialism, and Spinozism. From the beginning, and throughout his life, Diderot willingly cavorted with those who danced with these philosophical spectres.

His second book, published in 1746, which was also his first with no connection to translation, implicated him at the heart of this very coven. Called Pensées philosophiques, it offered, as its title suggested, a series of provocative philosophical propositions that suggested theses and arguments related to questions of matter, motion, nature, science, and philosophy. No single argument unified the book, and while its contents were certainly natural philosophical, it is difficult to find a single theory or hypothesis that ties everything in it together. Instead, it is a book of provocative statements and theses to argue with. As such, it inaugurated an important feature of Diderot’s overall philosophy: its dialogic and intersubjective character.

Diderot’s first two books announced the eclectic approach to philosophie that would be his hallmark, and having launched this pattern his next works only added further diversity to his emerging oeuvre. La Promenade du sceptique, which was written at this time but only published a century later, defies any precise genre classification. A sort of philosophical dialogue, but one that also draws from the emerging sensibilities of the Enlightenment epistolary novel, the text takes its readers on a kind of intellectual journey where the worlds of the various philosophical sects are visited—travel narratives, including those to extraterrestrial worlds, were another intertextual referent used by Diderot. The reader of La Promenade du sceptique encounters Pyrrhonians, Spinozists, deists, idealists (i.e. Berkeley), and more, yet no voice of overarching unification or synthesizing argument is present. Diderot’s next book, published in 1748, was radically different in genre, if no different in its interrogative philosophical intent. Called Les Bijoux indiscrets, it is best described as a work of philosophical pornography since the story involves a Sultan’s magical ring that provokes female genitalia to speak of their experiences. This results in a text that intersperses bawdy sexual stories with discourses on such philosophical topics as the relationship between “Experience” and “Hypothesis” and the merits of “Newtonian” as opposed to “Cartesian” natural philosophy. Les Bijoux indiscrets brought an exceptionally large and welcome financial return to Diderot, and it remains his most published book.

1.3 Lettre sur les aveugles à l’usage de ceux qui voient

The climax of this decade of prolific literary output occurred in 1749 with the publication of Lettre sur les aveugles à l’usage de ceux qui voient, one of Diderot’s masterpieces and arguably his most sophisticated and complex philosophical text after Le Rêve de D’Alembert and Le Neveu de Rameau. Classifying this work into any single genre is even less easy to do than with the others Diderot wrote in the 1740s. Perhaps the best short description of the book is the one offered by Diderot biographer Arthur N. Wilson, who simply called it “disarming” (1972: 97). Taking flight as a series of reflections on the blind English mathematician Nicholas Saunderson, the Lettre sur les aveugles is written, says Wilson, “with the easy artfulness of someone idly improvising on a musical instrument”. Yet as it gets going, the breeziness of the text subtly becomes more ponderous. “One subject suggests another”, Wilson writes, and soon the reader is “led on and on through a sort of steeplechase over the various metaphysical jumps until finally he gets himself soaked in the waterhole called ‘Does God Exist?’” (1972: 97).

1.4 Success, Scandal, and Imprisonment in 1749

Diderot’s public acclaim as a brilliant writer and philosophical esprit fort increased in step with the advancing acclaim of these books, and by the time that the Lettre had appeared he had become famous enough for Voltaire himself, already the public face of radical philosophie because of his vigorous campaigns on behalf of Newtonianism, to write to Diderot praising his books and inviting him to join him for a “philosophical supper”. The connection with Voltaire would prove fundamental for Diderot in the years to come, but if his arrival as a new philosophical star in Voltaire’s orbit illustrates his rapid ascent after 1745, it also explains the new interest that Diderot was attracting within the French police.

Diderot published all of his initial books anonymously, bypassing in this way the censorship regime that regulated the book trade in absolutist France. Anonymous publication by itself was not illicit, but given the content of his books and his evasion of the royal censors that secured a book’s legality, Diderot’s publications in the 1740s constituted a double provocation. A police file with Diderot’s name on it was opened soon after the Pensées philosophiques appeared, and the Parisian Parlement, the judicial organ of the French state, expressed its support for the new scrutiny of this author when it ordered the Pensées publicly burned in July 1746. As his next books appeared, Diderot became the target of vigorous police surveillance, and by 1749 the evidence pointing to Diderot’s authorship of these subversive works was conclusive. The publication of Lettre sur les aveugles sealed the case, and soon after its appearance a lettre de cachet was issued ordering Diderot’s incarceration in the royal prison at Vincennes. The letter was executed in July 1749, and Diderot spent three months in jail before his release the following November.

2. Ascendance as Writer and Philosophe through the Encyclopédie (1750–1765)

The coincidence of the arrival of Voltaire’s first letter to Diderot inviting him to join him in philosophical camaraderie and Diderot’s imprisonment at Vincennes can serve as the transition point marking the second phase of Diderot’s life. The arrival of Voltaire in Diderot’s life brought two immediate changes that would mark his years of maturity. First, their union constitutes a key moment in the genesis of the philosophe party, an association that would ever after mark Diderot as a subversive thinker at odds with the intellectual establishment. Second, and rather ironically, his association with Voltaire also provided him with a new kind of security since it brought him into the fold of the political authorities sympathetic to controversial thinkers and writers like the philosophes.

Voltaire had established the persona of the radical philosophe as outlaw after 1734 when he escaped his own lettre de cachet by fleeing to the sovereign chateau of an established aristocrat at Cirey in the Champagne east of Paris. Voltaire’s protector in this case was the wife of the said sovereign aristocrat, Emilie le Tonnier de Breteuil, the Marquise du Châtelet, who happened also to be Voltaire’s intellectual partner and a serious scientific intellectual in her own right. Emilie du Châtelet was pregnant when Voltaire wrote to Diderot in June 1749, and she died in September during childbirth while Diderot was serving his sentence at Vincennes. Yet her influence survived her death since, by coincidence, a member of the du Châtelet family was then serving as warden of the Vincennes prison. Thanks to his influence, and that of other royal officials sympathetic to Voltaire, Diderot’s time in prison was made much less onerous than it might have been.

2.1 The Encyclopédie Project

When Diderot was released from prison in November 1749, he was already at work on a new project, the one that would fully launch him to global intellectual fame. The origins of this project went back to the very beginning of Diderot’s life as an author, and especially to his initial work as a translator. In 1745, a Parisian publisher named André-François Le Breton secured an official privilège to publish a complete French translation of Ephraim Chambers’ 1728 Cyclopedia, or Universal Dictionary of Arts and Sciences. In June 1746, Breton gave editorial control of the project to a rather undistinguished member of the Académie Royale des Sciences, the abbé de Gua de Malves, who in turn appointed two assistants: his academic colleague D’Alembert and Diderot. A week after receiving his appointment, Diderot’s Pensées philosophiques was publicly burned by the Parlement de Paris, yet undeterred Diderot began at the same moment to assert his influence over the shape of the encyclopedia project. In October 1747, De Gua de Malves stepped down, ceding complete control of the project to D’Alembert and Diderot. In June 1748, a new privilège for the book was obtained as a result of a change in its conception. Now titled Encyclopédie, ou Dictionnaire Universel des sciences, des arts, et des métiers the work was beginning to lose its character as a translation and starting to become a new and original publication. Diderot pushed the book even further in this innovative direction, and when he took up residence in his cell at Vincennes, the Encyclopédie project was very much on his mind. Among his visitors while in prison, in fact, were D’Alembert and Le Breton, who expressed worries about the impact of Diderot’s imprisonment on the book’s sales.

Within a year after Diderot’s release, in November 1750, Le Breton released eight thousand copies of a “Prospectus” for the work, a text authored by Diderot, which invited readers to buy advanced subscriptions for a radically new kind of compendium. The “Prospectus” promised that the first volume of the new work would appear within six months. In the Prospectus, Diderot began to reveal his conception of what the Encyclopédie would become. No longer a translation of someone else’s book, and even less a staid compendium of already established learning, the Encyclopédie was always imagined by Diderot as a dynamic site of living thought, an engine for changing, not codifying, existing knowledge. Diderot would more fully develop the ideas first articulated in the “Prospectus” in his article “Encyclopédie”, which was published in volume V of the work in November 1755.

2.2 The Scandal of the Encyclopédie

1750 saw the full launch of the Encyclopédie project, along with all of the intellectual transformations that would follow in its train, including the controversies that would forever shape its legacy and that of its editors. Diderot’s scandals of the previous year were certainly in readers’ minds as they read his announcement of the new encyclopedia project, and other events were also in the air making 1750 a moment ripe with transformative potential. A series of controversial philosophical books had just appeared, including Condillac’s 1746 Essai sur l’origine des connaissances humaines, Montesquieu’s 1748 De L’Esprit des Lois, and the first volume of Buffon’s l’Histoire naturelle, which appeared in 1749. Looking back, many have seen 1750 as the year when the French Enlightenment battle between orthodox and heterodox thought, and especially between skepticism and faith, truly began. Appearing at exactly this moment, and poking at precisely these fault-lines, the Encyclopédie, and especially Diderot’s work within it, has been viewed by many as the match that ignited these cultural fires. Diderot also played a singularly important role in directing these fires into the historically transformative conflagration of the French Enlightenment.

Whatever its prior preparation, the launch of the Encyclopédie in November 1750 provoked a war between its editors and the religious authorities in France. At the heart of the struggle were the French members of the Society of Jesus. In 1701, the order’s professors at its leading Parisian college began to edit a learned periodical in the provincial city of Trévoux. By 1750 this Jesuit Journal de Trévoux had become a well-respected organ of learned commentary, one with a particular reputation for aggressive critique on matters of religion and faith. When the “Prospectus” for the Encyclopédie appeared, its lead editor Father Guillaume-François Berthier, S.J. continued this tradition by taking up his pen to rail against the new encyclopedia project and its editors. Diderot replied in kind in his Lettre au R. P. Berthier, a pamphlet that deployed the witty, satirical tone that had characterized his books of the 1740. He also defended directly the intellectual programs that he had announced in his “Prospectus”. Accordingly, as the first volumes began to appear they entered an intellectual field already polarized by arguments between public clerics and philosophes.

The rancor intensified when Volume I, containing all of the entries starting with the letter “A”, appeared. Berthier found in this first volume, along with many other provocations, the multi-authored article “Ame” (Soul), which Diderot contributed to significantly. It deployed a full materialist arsenal to lay out the contemporary understanding of this term and its relationship (usually opposed) to traditional Thomist and Christian philosophy, along with its affinities with ancient pagan understandings. While the article on the soul was a masterpiece of serious philosophical reasoning and argument, Berthier also encountered Diderot’s characteristically witty and sarcastic brand of philosophie in other articles in the inaugural volume as well, and overall he found many reasons to worry about Diderot’s orthodoxy and his commitment to upholding traditional canons of thought and morality.

No better illustration exists than the entry in Volume I for “Anthropophagie” (Cannibalism). In the “Prospectus”, Diderot had discussed the organization of knowledge appropriate for a new encyclopedia, and among the themes he stressed was his dynamic understanding of the Encyclopédie as a living work that must incorporate the ever changing character of knowledge in its organization. As Diderot explained, the Encyclopédie would never really be finished. As soon as one article was completed, it would need to be updated, and new articles not already included would need to be added all in an effort to contain all of the new currents of thought coming into being at every moment. With respect to the articles that were included, their relation to one another was often as important as the discrete entry itself, he explained, since the real meaning of any term was often best found in the connection between it and various other words rather than in the single definition itself. Diderot therefore adapted from Chambers’s work an explicit cross-referencing system that used “renvois” added at the end of entries to point readers to other articles that connected with or elaborated upon the material found in each definition. The renvois system was not original to the Encyclopédie, nor was the practice of cross-referencing in and of itself controversial, yet Berthier found much to complain about in Diderot’s general tendency to use these and other aspects of the Encyclopédie to indulge in what he found to be dangerous evasions and sometimes outright subversions of the true foundations of knowledge. The article “Anthropophagie” illustrates well the sort of thing that provoked these worries. After a fairly prosaic summary of the practice of cannibalism as it was described in travelers’ accounts of the known anthropophages extant in the Americas, the article, which was not authored by Diderot and was imported largely intact from Chambers’s work, ended with a renvoi that pointed readers to another article where further understanding regarding the human eating of other men could be found. The article suggested was “Eucharistie”. Berthier did not specifically note this article in his attacks upon Diderot and his encyclopedic agenda, but it was the presence of these and other moments of willful impropriety that defined for the Jesuit the real agendas of the project.

2.3 The Prades Affair

More gasoline was thrown on these erupting controversies a month after Volume I of the compendium appeared when a friend of Diderot’s, and a contributor to the Encyclopédie—he wrote the entry for “Theological Certitude”—successfully defended his doctoral thesis in philosophy at the Sorbonne. No questions were raised by the Parisian Doctors of Theology who examined the thesis submitted by the abbé Jean-Martin Prades entitled To the celestial Jerusalem: Upon what face is it that God has disseminated the breath of life? (Jerusalem in coelesti: quis est ille in facem Deus inspiravit spiraculus vitae?). However, after rumors began to circulate—Diderot was likely behind many of them—suggesting that Prades’s thesis contained overtly pagan and materialist arguments, the Jesuits began to investigate.

In January 1751, after learning that Prades did in fact defend questionable positions, such as that the soul is an unknown substance, sensations are the source of our ideas, and revealed religion is only natural religion in its evolution, the Sorbonne renounced its support for the thesis and revoked Prades’ degree. The Archbishop of Paris also issued a decree, days after the appearance of Volume II of the Encyclopédie, condemning the thesis, and the Parlement de Paris supported the judgment by ordering the text of the thesis to be publicly burned. A month later, the Jesuit Father Jean-Baptiste Geoffroy, a colleague of Berthier, also published a pamphlet fully exposing the connections between Prades, Diderot, and the Encyclopédie project.

On February 7, the crown intervened in what was becoming a very heated public scandal by suspending the publication privilège for the Encyclopédie.Thanks to the favor that Diderot and his partners now enjoyed among those in the upper echelons of the French government, however, the suspension only lasted until the heat of the controversy had subsided. Volume III appeared in early 1753, accompanied by a new advertisement written by d’Alembert reassuring readers about the continuing vitality of the project (subscribers in particular were promised a full return on their payments). Thanks to this settlement, Volumes IV–VI appeared between 1754–1756, and while these were accompanied by ongoing criticism of encyclopedia project by the Jesuits in the Journal de Trévoux, no further threats to the existence of the project appeared.

2.4 The Suspension of the Encyclopédie and its Completion in Exile

The controversies over the Encyclopédie were not over, however, and Diderot’s most difficult years with the project were still to come. The event that triggered the return of unrest had little overtly to do with philosophie unless one believed the stories linking the two that clerics and other members of the parti dévot began to promulgate after the events themselves took place. The drama occurred on 5 January 1757, as King Louis XV walked from the Royal Palace of Versailles to his awaiting carriage. Out of the assembled crowd an obscure house servant named Robert-François Damiens rushed past the royal bodyguards and stabbed the king with a small penknife. The wound was anything but life threatening, but the attempted lethal attack on the sacred body of the sovereign was nevertheless an egregious transgression, one punishable by the most extreme measures.

The subsequent execution of Damiens has since become legendary because of its use for the last time in French history of the traditional method of drawing and quartering the assassin’s body by harnessed horses, an event that has become famous through the grisly description of it offered by Michel Foucault in the opening of his widely read Surveiller et punir. In the context of the discussion here, however, the significance of the attempted regicide is more to be found in the perceived motivations said to have led Damiens to his action. The police interrogation reveals a highly emotional man moved passionately by the contemporary clerical divisions that were pitting Jansenists, Jesuits, and the French episcopacy against one another in battles over proper Church orthodoxy. Yet in a distillation that would prove influential in shaping the fate of Diderot, and the Encyclopédieproject overall, many high officials began to link Damiens’s purported madness to the unchecked spread of dangerous and subversive philosophie in France.

The new climate of opinion was institutionalized four months after the attempted royal assassination when the Parlement de Paris issued a new edict prescribing either the death penalty or service in the galleys for any author or publisher convicted of publishing tendentious or clandestine works. New critics of the Encyclopédie also appeared, writers who joined with the Jesuits in condemning the subversive effects of the compendium and its agendas. Especially virulent was the journalist Elie Fréron who used his journal Année Littéraire to launch a sustained and persistent attack on the project and its editors after 1757. Works with a similar, if less vitriolic, slant also appeared as pamphlets or as articles published in periodicals, such as the future Royal Historiographer Moreau’s assessment, published in June 1757 in the Mercure de France. This piece spoke of an “Encyclopedist party” organized for the purpose of attacking morality, religion and government. When Volume VII of the Encyclopédie appeared in November 1757, not quite a year after Damiens’s attack, the tinder was therefore set for a new eruption of controversy. This time D’Alembert found himself at the center of the cross-hairs for his article “Geneva”, which outraged Genevan pastors because of his overly sympathetic treatment of Socinianism and of natural religion in general, and angered the pious through its defense of the public value of theater. The controversy led D’Alembert to resign as editor in January 1758, and although he returned a few months later, he resigned permanently the following year, putting Diderot in sole control of the project and its public relations.

The final blow against the Encyclopédie occurred in July 1758 when Claude-Adrien Helvétius published On the Mind (De l’Esprit), one of the most overtly materialist and heterodox works of philosophy to be published during the French Enlightenment. Although Helvétius was not technically an encyclopédiste, he certainly moved in the same circles, and his work fit comfortably with the imaginary template of subversive materialist philosophie crystallized after the Damiens Affair. Accordingly, as the officials in charge of securing public order, morality, and the book trade—the three were one in absolutist France—began to crack down on Helvétius and De l’Esprit, the Encyclopédie found itself pulled into the courts as a supposed accomplice aiding and abetting its crimes against religion, morality, and public order.

The publication privilège for De l’Esprit was revoked a month after the book appeared, and three months later the Archbishop of Paris publicly condemned the book. This led the Parlement de Paris to pursue inquiries into a series of works it deemed subversive, including De l’Esprit. These included the Encyclopédie. In January 1759, the Parlement condemned them together along with several other books for their license and impiety. While the judges further ordered the public burning of De l’Esprit, they refrained from issuing the same order for the Encyclopédie, passing the work instead to a committee of theologians, lawyers and scholars who were charged with making corrective revisions. Royal authorities confirmed the condemnation in March, revoking the original publication privilège awarded for the Encyclopédie, an act that in effect turned the volumes into illegal, subversive books.

D’Alembert treated this decision as the death sentence for the project, and he immediately resigned as editor, never to return to the project again. Diderot responded less pessimistically, for his protectors within the monarchy remained, and a deal was struck that allowed the work to be completed. Thanks to an ad hoc and secretive agreement, work on the final ten volumes was allowed to continue after 1759, leading to the publication en masse of the full work in 1765. Each of these volumes carried an imprimatur indicating publication in Neuchâtel as a way of complying with the royal ban. In this under the table way, the technically illicit book continued to be printed and circulated, allowing the subscriber’s advanced payments to be redeemed and their volumes delivered. Meanwhile, during the same years, the volumes of accompanying plates began to appear since their privilège was distinct and had not been revoked in 1759. Between 1765–1772, the final volumes of the plates were published to accompany the seventeen volumes of text that were already in print, and with that the entire Encyclopédie was brought to completion.

Yet even with the text suppressed until 1765, and only the volumes of plates appearing, the controversy for Diderot continued throughout the early 1760s. The public absence of new volumes of encyclopedic text did little to stop the flow of criticism of Diderot and his imagined “Encyclopédiste party”. Charles Pallisot de Montenoy’s satirical play Les Philosophes, staged in Paris in 1760, was one widely noticed example of the wider anti-philosophe campaign, which intensified in this period and placed Diderot at its center. Although focused more on Rousseau and Montesquieu than Diderot and the encyclopédistes, Pallisot’s satire attracted large audiences to the spectacle of philosophers, like those involved in the Encyclopédie project, supposedly behaving badly in ways that undermined religion, civility, and social order. Many other works joined in this chorus during these years, and taken as a whole the public campaign against Diderot and the Encyclopédie provided him with a persistent stream of background noise, and an occasional sting that needed a slap, as he otherwise went about the difficult, and now unaided, work of completing the Encyclopédie project.

3. The Years of Celebrity (1765–1773)

In 1765, after the final appearance of all seventeen volumes of the text of the Encyclopédie, and with only a few volumes of plates still remaining to be printed, Diderot experienced a kind of liberation as his life was freed from the work that had occupied most of his time and energy over the previous fifteen years. A first step in this direction occurred in 1759 with the revocation of the royal permission to publish the Encyclopédie and d’Alembert’s definitive resignation as editor. In one respect, this change increased his burdens by making him the sole editor responsible for completing the project. But it also eased his strain in other ways since the revocation ended the bitter public and political struggle that Diderot had fought throughout the 1750s to keep the project alive. During the 1760s, Diderot continued to do what was necessary to see the Encyclopédie project completed, a job that was by no means easy—he ultimately authored nearly six thousand articles himself. But from 1760 forward he no longer needed to divide his time between doing this work and sustaining the public battles on behalf of Encyclopédie as before.

Accordingly, the years after 1760 brought a new quiet and calm into Diderot’s life as he retreated in some respects to the background of the philosophe movement, and let others, especially Voltaire, who became newly assertive at precisely this moment, move to the front as the public face of philosophie. Since the controversy surrounding the Encyclopédiehad also contributed, as public controversies always do, to improved sales of the books, Diderot also found himself in the 1760s with even more financial security than ever before. He remained anything but rich, but he no longer struggled as before to meet his basic needs. His public acclaim had also created a welcoming place for him among certain sympathetic Parisian elites, and as the burdens of the Encyclopédie project became less heavy—he once called it his hair shirt—he began to enjoy for the first time some of the leisure afforded to well-connected writers like him by Enlightenment Parisian society.

With this liberation, a highly productive period in his life began as new and original books and other writings began to flow from his pen. His previous struggles still influenced this output, for after a stint in prison and two decades of surveillance and harassment by the French authorities responsible for the book trade, Diderot had become far more suspicious of publication than he had been in his youth. His output during these years was great, and his correspondence reveals a lively circulation of his writings among trusted friends and collaborators. Nevertheless, few of Diderot’s writings after 1760 found their way directly into print, and even fewer made it there with his approval. Many of his writings from this period were only discovered and published much later, some as much as a century after his death. Diderot also expressed an awareness of how his continual struggle with censors affected his manner of writing. As he once wrote, “I saved myself by writing laconically and with generalities and obscurity, and by finding the most intricate ironic tone I could find” (OH, DPV XXIV: 409).

Scholars working with Diderot’s letters and manuscripts have established an imprecise chronology for his output, and that will be followed here. But since this mature period in Diderot’s life also marks his move into a manner of working where he simultaneously developed several distinct, if always related, strands of thought all at once, a chronological approach is not an effective way to capture his thinking and writing during these years. Much better is to group his work thematically according to the broad clusters of thought that his books and other writings contributed to.

3.1 Philosophical Investigations in the Manner of the 1740s

Diderot’s earliest writings from this period, pursued while the Encyclopédie project was still ramping up to full speed, continued the philosophical and literary explorations initiated in the 1740s. Some of these works passed directly into print, while others remained private works that Diderot kept from the public eye for reasons that are often hard to discern. In 1751 he published anonymously and without privilège a continuation of sorts of his Lettre sur les aveugles entitled Lettre sur les sourds et muets à l’usage de ceux qui entendent et qui parlent. At the same time, he also expanded upon his Pensées philosophiques by writing, and perhaps allowing into print (the 1754 print edition of the book is devoid of any indication about its origin), Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature, a work that retains the episodic, propositional structure of Diderot’s original Pensées philosophiques while expanding the explanations within each section.

Scholars have also suggested, though never proven definitively, that Diderot contributed during these years to Baron d’Holbach’s Système de la Nature, ou Des Loix du Monde Physique et du Monde Moral first published in 1770. This book stands alongside Helvétius’ De l’Esprit as one of the great masterpieces of French Enlightenment materialist philosophy and natural religion, a touchstone of Diderot’s thought as well. D’Holbach contributed almost four hundred articles to the Encyclopédieon topics ranging from natural philosophy and religion to mineralogy, and Diderot was also at the center of the coterie that assembled every week in the philosophical salon that the Baron hosted within the secure confines of his hôtel on the rue Royale in Paris, the circle that brought Système de la nature to life. Diderot certainly contributed to the work in this way, but in its dry and programmatic systematicity, d’Holbach’s book also lacks the lively play of Diderot’s best philosophical writing. Whatever his direct textual influence on the book, it is certain that he and D’Holbach were kindred spirits, and that Diderot’s own philosophical work was shaped by the common agendas which both pursued during these years.

Diderot’s Principes philosophiques sur la matière et le mouvement, written about the same time as Système de la Nature, and his Éléments de physiologie and Réfutation d’Helvétius, written in the years soon after the appearance of the treatise, though only published later in the nineteenth century, also explore related themes. Taken as whole, all of these works reflect Diderot’s lifelong preoccupation with materialist questions of life, liberty, purpose, and and the question of order within a cosmos that may not be governed by a providential creator. They also reveal his continuing interest in the epistemological problem of discerning the nature and principles of such a possibly God-less world. These themes run throughout the entire corpus of his work, and if these writings are different it is in his explicit engagement with explicitly materialist philosophical investigation as they related to the emerging biological sciences of the eighteenth century.

3.2 Le Rêve de D’Alembert

One of Diderot’s great masterpieces, certainly written during these years but only published posthumously, should be included as a part of the natural philosophical corpus summarized above even if it engages with the same seminal questions of natural philosophy in an overtly literary manner that draws more on Enlightenment epistolary novels and theater for its construction than the classical philosophical genres of antique philosophy. Called Le Rêve de D’Alembert (D’Alembert’s Dream), the work is in fact a trilogy of dialogues whose centerpiece is a dialogue from which the title is drawn. It narrates a report given to the Encyclopédiste and doctor M. Bordeu of ravings overheard at D’Alembert’s beside by the Parisian salonnière Mlle. de Lespinasse. The reports of D’Alembert’s dreams are situated between two further dialogues, the Entretien entre D’Alembert et Diderot, which precedes and sets up the dream reporting, and the Suite de l’entretien, which reflects on it while broaching “social” topics through imaginings about the possibility of biogenetic engineering of society. The character D’Alembert, who serves as a continuous thread tying the three dialogues together, is treated ironically, given that in the first dialogue his character has a debate with the character Diderot, in which the former defends a kind of Cartesian substance dualism, while in the next dialogue, his dream-utterances reveal a kind of materialist ‘truth’ which D’Alembert has presumably repressed. In this way, Diderot the author moves between conscious and unconscious thought so as to shift perspectives and highlight the different possibilities that follow from these different points of view.

Taken as a whole, these three interconnected dialogues operate at two levels, inquiring at once into serious metaphysical and epistemological questions regarding a materialist understanding of being and order in the world, while at the same time staging a highly self conscious textual performance that brings into focus the style of the conversation attendant to the philosophical exchanges themselves. Diderot’s early published works had this same double quality, both philosophical and artfully literary, yet unlike these earlier works, Le Rêve de D’Alembert was never published by Diderot, and in fact remained buried in his manuscripts until discovered and published in the late nineteenth century. Le Rêve de D’Alembert was nevertheless one of Diderot’s favorite works (along with his mathematical essays), and he gave one copy to Catherine the Great as a gift, together, significantly in terms of his understanding of its place within his oeuvre, with a set of “Fragments” that he presented as belonging to his physiological writings.

The substance of Le Rêve de D’Alembert reveals some of Diderot’s most important thinking about metaphysics as it relates to biology and the life sciences. The first dialogue, between Diderot and D’Alembert, covers traditional philosophical issues such as self and world, matter and thought, the existence of God, sensation and the true properties of objects. The second and longest dialogue involves the somnolent D’Alembert, the doctor Bordeu, and Mlle de Lespinasse, and it contains the dream reporting noted above. This is the central dialogue of the text. The third dialogue is shorter again, and involves only Doctor Bordeu and Mlle de Lespinasse discussing certain issues from the dream reporting at the heart of the main dialogue. Topics here include monsters considered as biological and social problems, the relation between matter and sensation, and the nature of biological reproduction with explicit attention to its sexual dimension. Antique philosophy is also referenced throughout, especially antique atomism, and in an earlier conception Diderot imagined his dialogue as a conversation between figures drawn from antiquity that would have been titled Le Rêve de Démocrite. Diderot’s commitment to modern materialist philosophy was nevertheless the engine driving all of this complex literary and philosophical play, and Le Réve de D’Alembert accordingly contains some of Diderot’s most aggressive materialist explorations. Since it would certainly have been considered a subversive work had it been published when it was written, this may explain Diderot’s suppression of it. Overall, it is still an open question within Diderot studies why he wrote the work the way he did at the time when he wrote it, and how one should interpret the uniquely Diderotian mode of philosophizing present in the text. What is clear, however, is that the creative complexity converges into what is without question one of the great masterpieces of Enlightenment philosophie.

3.3 Diderot’s Plays, Novels, and Literary Essays from the 1760s and 1770s

Le Rêve de D’Alembert continues to puzzle and fascinate readers because of its alchemical fusion of literature and philosophy, textual play and reasoned argumentation, in the pursuit of fundamental questions about the world and humanity. The same mixture is also present in Diderot’s other seemingly literary and artistic writings since these too contain much serious science and philosophy as well.

One important cluster concerns the theory and practice of theater. Diderot wrote scripts for plays that were staged in Paris, including Le Fils naturel in 1757 and Le père de famille in 1758, but the character of these works as theatrical productions is less interesting than his theorization of them before and after the actual performance. As works of dramatic art, Diderot’s plays are dominated by his particular ethical sensibilities, which will be discussed in detail in Part II. His fusion of theater with moralizing agendas led to what has come to be called Diderot’s drame bourgeois, a label that suggests Diderot’s valorization of a morality rooted in the supreme ethical value of the conjugal family and the virtues of thrift, domestic love and piety. Diderot’s plays were moralizing melodramas that celebrated this ethic, and the same impulses were present in his art criticism in his praise for the moralizing paintings of Jean-Baptiste Greuze, an artist who publicly visualized drame bourgeois in oil upon canvas. His ethics were also present in his vigorous condemnation of the rococo painter François Boucher, who he once described as a man “who takes up his brush only so that he can show me breasts and buttocks” (quoted in Kavanagh 2010, p. 81). Diderot also expressed these same ethical principles as an economic theory when he defended the abbé Galiani’s critique of the pro-luxury theories of the Physiocrats, and in his moralizing dialogue Entretien d’un père avec ses enfants, published in Grimm’s Correspondance Littéraire in 1781, which describes a father teaching his son about modesty and the value of family devotion.

Diderot’s drame bourgeois tends toward melodrama, and as such his plays are not major touchstones in the history of theater. His meta-theoretical writings about theater itself, however, provide many interesting points of departure for his philosophy, and these will accordingly be discussed in Part II. Diderot’s novels and other works of overt fiction also partake in the aesthetic explorations that mark his best work on the theater. Jacques le fataliste et son maître, for example, is a kind of anti-novel, modeled on Laurence Sterne’s Tristram Shandy. It strives to expose the novelistic conceit of bringing its readers into a staged world of realistically represented yet fictional human experience. In this, it shares with Diderot’s writings on theater an interest in the nature and limits of representation itself. Diderot’s story Ceci n’est pas un conte also operates in a similarly self-conscious and critically subversive way, and in these and other ostensibly literary works, as with his theater and art criticism, the explicit play with form and content, and the self-aware consciousness about the often unstable interaction between language, experience and their capacity to merge (or not) into coherent representations, points to a theme present in all of Diderot’s most sophisticated thought.

3.4 Diderot’s Invention of Public Art Criticism

Another site where Diderot manifest these same philosophical-literary tendencies was in his art criticism. His work in this area began in 1759 when the journalist Friedrich Melchior Grimm invited Diderot to contribute to his monthly journal Correspondence Littéraire by offering his reflections on the art displayed at the biennial Parisian art salon. Staged in the Louvre, these shows allowed painters and sculptors to showcase their work in a setting that gave a broad public audience unprecedented access to the work of the best artists of the day. The Académie Royale de peinture et de sculpture had been staging these shows for over two decades when Diderot went to work, and while others had written commentaries about the exhibitions before, no one before him had provided anything like the critical philosophical assessment of the art of the salons, its meaning, and its place in the world of Enlightenment thought and culture more generally that he began to provide.

A new academically centered art theory had developed in the seventeenth century, and by 1700 this was starting to be transformed into a new philosophical science of aesthetics that spoke in general terms about ideal theoretical concepts like artistic truth and beauty and their manifestation through the work of practitioners of the fine arts. A new persona, the connoisseur, had also become visible by 1750, a knower who helped collectors to hone their judgment in discerning truly great art while offering others the skills necessary to isolate real art from the mere craft of ordinary artistic production. The bi-annual Parisian salons had already become a site of Enlightenment aesthetics and connoisseurship by 1750, yet before Diderot no one had brought together the job of the connoisseur and the aesthetician with that of the public writer reflecting on art in relation to ordinary human experience. In his “Salons”, as they came to be called after they appeared in the Correspondance litteraire, Diderot brought all of these agendas together into one discursive program. In doing so, he invented a new identity defined by a new genre: the art critic sustained through contemporary art criticism.

The social invention itself was transformative, but even more significant was the character of the art criticism that Diderot developed in his pioneering new role. Here Diderot worked through the medium of the painted image to explore exactly the same dynamics between form and content, author and interpreter, subject and object—in short, the very problem of artistic representation itself—that he also explored in his theater, literary fiction, and often in his philosophy as well. The result was a general understanding of aesthetics and its relationship to ethics that was also integrally connected to his philosophy, and these ties will be discussed in detail in Part II.

3.5 Le Neveu de Rameau

Diderot’s art criticism joined with his theater criticism, his novels, and his other literary and philosophical writings in offering readers reflections on deep metaphysical and epistemological questions as they relate to the power and limits of representation. His explicitly metaphysical and epistemological writings about nature, its character, and its interpretation also join with this other work in forefronting writing and representation as an empowering act of conscious human being and knowing, but also as a fraught and frail human capacity full of limitations. His best works are those that engage in both sides of this dynamic simultaneously in the manner of his literary and dialogic metaphysics and materialist natural philosophy.

From this perspective, it is appropriate that arguably Diderot’s greatest and most influential text is a work of both literary fiction and a semi-autobiographical psychological memoir, and a work that is at once a theatrical send-up of Parisian society, an intimate portrait of contemporary social mores, and a highly original and complex study of the nature of human perception, being, and their interrelation. Called Le Neveu de Rameau, the text ostensibly narrates Diderot’s meetings and then conversation with the nephew of the renowned French composer Jean-Philippe Rameau. Yet once introduced, the dialogue unfolds through a back and forth between characters named “Moi” and “Lui”, or me and him, continually turning a discussion between two discrete subjects into an inner monologue of one subject dialoguing with himself. And as the exchange carries on, one also comes to see the two characters as different sides of a deep existential dynamic that generates both the differences that sustain the banter and the never ending circle of their debates. At this point the external reality of the characters begins to dissolve, and “Moi” and “Lui” start to become two competing principles within an intractable universal ethical and metaphysical struggle.

Diderot did not publish Le Neveu de Rameau in his lifetime, but the text found its way to Germany after his death, where it was read by Friedrich Schiller and passed on to Johann Wolfgang von Goethe who then published a German translation of the text of his own making in 1805. From there, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel found the text, offering it as the only external work explicitly cited in his Phenomenology of Spirit first published in 1807. Diderot’s dialogue in fact exerted an important influence on the formation of Hegel’s own dialectical understanding of metaphysics and the nature of being. In drawing these insights from the text, Hegel was also following the deeper metaphysical understanding, which Diderot himself developed in all of his writings and incorporated into the book, no matter how different in genre and idiom Diderot’s dialogue was when compared with Hegel’s ponderous and recondite treatise. A line further connects Diderot and Le Neveu de Rameau with all subsequent metaphysical understandings of the self as a singularity caught in a constant struggle with universal forces pulling the unity of being apart. It also connects the book with all metaphysical thinking after Hegel that posits being as a unity riven with dialectical oppositions striving to reconcile competing oppositions within being itself. That Diderot never produced anything like a metaphysical treatise in the manner of Hegel’s work in no way softens his influence on this tradition.

4. Twilight Years (1774–1784)

In October 1773, Diderot celebrated his sixtieth birthday in a coach headed for the Russian imperial capital of St. Petersburg. The journey was provoked by a series of events begun in 1765 that radically altered Diderot’s social position, if not necessarily the contours of his philosophy. Although the Encyclopédie project and other developments after 1750 had created a stable material foundation for him, making possible his intellectual production over the subsequent decades, in 1765 he was still a man living a very modest life in Paris with little by way of riches. His international renown, by contrast, was enormous, and he was known and admired by many who had both wealth and political power.

4.1 Diderot and Empress Catherine the Great of Russia

One admirer was the Empress Catherine the Great of Russia, who had watched the development of the Encyclopédiewith great interest and expressed her affection for French Enlightenment philosophie overall. In her so called “Nakaz” or “Instruction” circulated to those below her in the hierarchy of the Russian state, she laid out a program for governing the Russian empire that was saturated with French Enlightenment ideas and principles. She was particularly attracted to Diderot’s writings, and fate provided her with an occasion to express her appreciation directly when a financial burden forced Diderot to make a difficult decision. The dilemma was how to provide a suitable dowry for his daughter so that she could contract the kind of favorable marriage for her that he never experienced with his own wife. He did not possess the resources to provide such a dowry, so in 1765 he announced that he would sell his entire library to the highest bidder as a way of fulfilling what he saw as his parental obligation. When Catherine learned of the sale, she immediately made a lucrative offer, and after her bid was accepted, she also told Diderot to set up her new library in Paris, and to appoint himself as its permanent librarian. This in effect allowed Catherine to give Diderot an annual pension that made him a very wealthy man. From this date forward he was able to live with an affluence he would never dreamed possible thirty years earlier.

The journey to St. Petersburg followed seven years later as an opportunity for Diderot to consult directly with the empress, and while his health was in decline, making the voyage difficult for him, he described the encounter pleasantly, saying that he spoke with the Russian Tsarina “man to man”. He also offered her his own Observations sur le “Nakaz”, a document that offers, along with his article “Droit naturel” (“Natural right”), one of the clearest statements of Diderot’s political views. He urged Catherine to promote greater equality, both politically and economically, and to encourage less attachment to the Church. Catherine reported to a French aristocrat afterwards that if Diderot’s suggestions were ever to be enacted, chaos would ensue. Diderot also gave Catherine a plan for creating a new university, one organized according to the latest thinking about modern scientific knowledge. This document offers revealing insight into Diderot’s thinking about the organization of knowledge and the state of the disciplines two decades after his theorization of them for the Encyclopédie.

4.2 The Late Writings

Diderot spent his sixty-first birthday in 1774 in a stagecoach heading back home from St. Petersburg, and once re-installed in Paris in the new comfort that Catherine’s library endowment made possible, he began a kind of retirement where he continued to write while turning his attention to a new topic: history. One example was his Essai sur les règnes de Claude et de Néron, which reflected the turn of his continuing long standing interest in ethics and morality toward questions of politics, justice, and history. Also reflective of this new union was his intervention in the final editions of the abbé Guillaume Thomas Raynal’s massive global history entitled Histoire philosophique et politique des établissements et du commerce des Européens dans les deux Indes. This book, which ran to nineteen volumes, was produced by Raynal in a manner akin to the Encyclopédie, with numerous authors contributing and Raynal massaging the various contributions into a coherent whole. The history overall was pioneering. Opening with the claim that no greater change had occurred in all of world history than the one that ensued when Columbus arrived in the Americas in 1492, opening up the Western hemisphere for European global expansion and conquest, the book then narrated the history of European globalization and empire since the fifteenth century, ranging across India, China, Africa and the Pacific along with a history of European exploration and conquest in the Americas.

No history like this had ever been written before, nor had any compendium of this sort documenting European global expansion and imperialism ever been assembled. The book lacks a single narrative voice, and overall it is a loose baggy monster combining chapters full of quantitative trade data and empirical natural history of the world’s material resources together with theatrical speeches delivered by the book’s historical actors and moralizing narratives of the calamities and triumphs of European imperial history. Overall, the book does not offer a coherent, unified world history in our modern sense, even if Diderot often used his contributions to advance broad conceptual theories that prefigured the later world-historical theorization of Hegel and Marx. It is better described as the Enlightenment’s Encyclopédie of early modern globalization and empire.

The analogy to the Encyclopédie project also fits with Diderot’s role in the project, for having watched as his friend Raynal brought out the first two print editions in 1770 and 1777, Diderot intervened in the final print edition of 1780, offering a largely new set of dramatic narrations and normative arguments about the book’s contents that gave the treatise as a whole a new political edge.

Although it is difficult to summarize the variety of Diderot’s contributions, one dominant theme was his exploration of the power of commerce, conceived as an autonomous natural historical force, to drive political and social change. On some occasions he celebrates the power of commerce to bring about the progress of civilization that he wants readers to see, a position that makes him emblematic of what A.O. Hirschman has called the “doux commerce” strand of Enlightenment political economy, a thread crucial to the formation of modern liberalism. On other occasions, however, Diderot decries the way that commercial greed and profit-seeking produce outrageous violations of human decency and violence. These are moments when his writings do not prefigure liberalism, but its opposite, the anti-liberal critique of political economy that would later become the basis of Marxism in the nineteenth century.

The Atlantic slave trade in particular attracted Diderot’s attention, and some of his most passionate contributions to Raynal’s work involve imagined dialogues about the horrors of the European imperial slave system spoken by oppressed Africans. Diderot also exploits the global frame of the book to situate his gaze in alien and non-European ways so that he can assess and critique the history he is narrating. The result is a kind of pioneering, if ad hoc and personal, universal anthropological viewpoint that aspires to understand human life at the intersection of history, culture and material existence as viewed from every point of view. The Histoire philosophique des deux Indes which contains these passages was a massive bestseller, translated into many languages, and it was a direct influence on Hegel, and through him Marx, and through both on modern world history more generally. Diderot’s contribution to this influence was as important as any.

Diderot used the same proto-anthropological approach in another provocative work from his later years, his Supplément au voyage de Bougainville. This text offers an imagined dialogue between Tahitians and Europeans about the different sexual, marital and familial mores of the two cultures. In this dialogue, Diderot anticipates the figure of the native ethnographer who asks comparative questions about the foundations of morality and civilization so as to generate universal cultural understandings through comparison. In the Histoire des deux Indes, Diderot adds a political charge to such thinking by using the native stance to indict the crimes of the European imperialist, but both this text and the Supplément show Diderot’s interest in creating a reflexive universal understanding of human values, society, and culture through the perspectival exploration of the many different ways that perceiving subjects and natural objects join together to produce one another.

In his Supplément, his contributions to Raynal’s Histoire, and his Observations sur le “Nakaz”, Diderot appears in a newly radical political guise as an aggressive egalitarian and democrat who has little patience with traditional justifications for hierarchy and top down distributions of power. He is also a passionate abolitionist with no tolerance for the crimes of the Atlantic slave trade. These views connect him with Rousseau, who would be canonized as the philosophe prophet of revolution by the radical Jacobins who established the first French Republic. Several authors including Michelet and Hugo exploited the trope “from Diderot sprang Danton”. As Hugo wrote, “one can see Danton behind Diderot, Robespierre behind Rousseau … the latter engendered the former” (Hugo 1876, vol. 7: 76, translation C. Wolfe). Yet while Hugo saw a revolutionary link between the two Enlightenment philosophes, Diderot was not canonized like Rousseau as a founding father of the French revolutionary tradition. His ideas nevertheless pointed in many of the same directions, and they also stem from his wider philosophy, especially his metaphysics, in ways that make his political philosophy a more direct precursor for the radical political philosophy of the next two centuries.

Nature does not work through hierarchy in Diderot’s understanding, and the absolute demarcation of distinct species and beings is not possible in Diderot’s conception of nature. The politics that such a natural philosophy suggests is one rooted in a need for a radical decentralization of power and authority, and a fully bottom-up and egalitarian understanding of social order. Also crucial is a fluid and flexible understanding of social structures as entities forever changing and modifying through the ever flowing movement of time. Although he never laid out a single utopian vision of his model society, nor offered a fully elaborated statement of his political philosophy, one sees it at work in his writings in his ever-persistent critique of the necessity of established tradition and the institutions that uphold it. It is also present in his continual return to a universal and all-inclusive democratic base as the only foundation for any true conception of the social order.

His deep convictions about the universal oneness and equality of humanity is also manifest in his thinking about race and slavery, where he rejected altogether the new anthropology promulgated by Kant and others that spoke of biologically and civilizational distinct races of men scattered around the world through a natural climatological division. Diderot offered instead a monogenetic understanding of humanity composed from beings whose differences were a matter of degree rather than kind. This made him not only a critic of slavery and of racialized understandings of history and politics, but a full-fledged abolitionist, one whose sensibilities suggested, even if he never stated his explicit political commitments directly, the proto-democratic positions that sat at the radical edge of the political spectrum in the 1780s. Diderot nevertheless rarely sought to connect his materialist metaphysical commitments with his political thinking, not least due to his distaste for the way that his fellow materialist La Mettrie produced an “immoralist” ethics and a cynical social theory. Ultimately, Diderot was by nature a writer and thinker, not a political activist, and his political philosophy stands in his writings as the least developed aspect of his thought.

4.3 The Posthumous Legacy

In his relation to politics, as in so many other ways, Diderot was different from Voltaire, who always sustained his philosophy through his politics, and who became more politically active as he aged. Diderot’s egalitarian and proto-democratic political vision is best understood as part and parcel of his life spent in pursuit of philosophical naturalism, and politically he was akin to Rousseau, who also spent his twilight years in writerly philosophic retreat. Yet when revolution erupted a decade later, the memory of Voltaire and Rousseau was forged into a link tying the French Enlightenment philosophes to the cause of revolutionary democracy. In 1792, when the First French Republic created the initial pantheon of revolutionary heroes worthy of immortal commemoration, Voltaire and Rousseau were chosen as the first inductees, while Diderot was at best forgotten and at worst treated as a figure hostile to the new political movements afoot.

This combination of neglect and outright hostility pushed Diderot to the margins of French culture in the nineteenth century, and it would take another century before retrospective interest in his work would be renewed. A host of cultural forces conspired to make Diderot the least interesting of the French Enlightenment philosophes in the minds of nineteenth-century thinkers. Too systematically committed to his materialism, too vigorous in his irreligion, and too passionate and principled in his embrace of egalitarianism and universal democracy to be acceptable to anyone with the slightest worry about the rising tides of radical socialism and materialist freethought, Diderot became a pariah within the nineteenth-century conservative reaction of the Victorian era in Europe.

Unlike Spinoza, who famously had a complicated posterity in which he was both the despicable atheist and the ‘God-drunken’ Romantic, Diderot was viewed with suspicion for being some version of an Epicurean materialist with immoralist tendencies. Goethe, who was fascinated with Diderot and translated the Neveu de Rameau into German, nevertheless spoke in these terms when he decried Diderot’s lack of bourgeois morality: “Oh wonderful Diderot, why do you always use your considerable intellectual powers in the service of disorder rather than order?” (1799 notes on Diderot’s Essai sur la peinture, in Goethe 1799 [1925: X, 144–145]). Such reductions of Diderot to nothing more than a superficial and reckless subversive lasted a surprisingly long time, and a continuous thread connects the French critic Jules Barbey d’Aurevilly’s mid-nineteenth century declaration that Goethe was a genius while Diderot was a shallow imitator with the characterization of Diderot found in the Lagarde et Michard French literature textbook, a standard in French high schools as late as the 1970s, which described his writing as “very material”, which is to say coarse, physical, and bodily in nature, a trait that made Diderot, and by extension his affectionate readers, predisposed to materialism and base morality. Given his impropriety when judged by nineteenth-century bourgeois values, it was perhaps not surprising that after 1900 Soviet Marxists played a key role in reviving Diderot scholarship (a process in which Lenin’s favorable discussion of the Rêve de D’Alembert played a role). This was not merely through an attempt to present French Enlightenment materialists like Helvétius or Diderot as heroes of a kind of class struggle in philosophy avant la lettre, but also through a serious and positive engagement with Diderot’s writings.

Diderot’s brilliant eclecticism, which made him neither a pure philosopher, nor a straightforward litteraire, also made it hard for him to find a place in the newly specializing terrain of nineteenth century thought. Too innovative and idiosyncratic in his intellectual style to fit neatly into the rigid grid of the new university-based disciplinary system, he failed to find a home in this setting as well. Only after 1870 was interest in his work revived, thanks in part to the new critical editions of his writings, which made him newly available to scholars and readers, and to the changing cultural and political climate, which made him newly relevant to contemporary concerns. Contemporary Diderot studies, which is thriving today, was the result of that turn, and it is really only about a hundred years old, with most of the foundational studies even younger than that. The bulk of this work was accomplished by literary scholars, who tend to treat Diderot as an avant-garde writer first and foremost, and only as a philosopher in name and self-definition. Recently, however, scholars attuned to the very different character of philosophy and science in the eighteenth century have begun to return to Diderot’s work, and to find in it the complex and sophisticated thinking that was his hallmark.

There was even a movement afoot as recently as 2013 to enshrine Diderot alongside Rousseau, Voltaire, and Condorcet in the Panthéon of French national heroes. Headlines worrying about “un homme dangereux au Panthéon?” revealed the continuing influence of his alleged infamy, and in other ways Diderot’s materialist philosophy continues to shape his posthumous legacy in direct ways. The Diderot scholar Jacques Chouillet recounted, for example, that during the discussions of this Pantheonization it was suggested that Diderot’s remains be obtained in preparation for his possible consecration in the French national monument. Chouillet, however, explained that this was not possible because in the 1820s, when structural repairs had been made to the Chapel of the Virgin in the Église Saint-Roch, where Diderot was said to have been buried, workers found no remains of Diderot in his grave. Further inquiries revealed that Diderot had in fact been buried in this spot in a lead coffin in 1784, and that his absence in the 1820s was the result of looting in 1794 during the widespread search for lead needed to make bullets for the French revolutionary armies then fighting to defend the First Republic from anti-revolutionary invaders. With no extant material remains of Diderot to consecrate, his Panthéonizaion was hindered, but in other ways, this predicament might have been an appropriate end for a man who was fond of distributed understandings of the relation between matter and life. What better commemoration for Diderot, commented Chouillet, than the dispersion of his material ashes into the revolutionary tumult that he did so much to stimulate? The material body of Diderot may be gone for ever, but perhaps the most fitting remembrance for him, especially from the perspective of his own materialist philosophy, is the memory of him dissolved after his death into the spirit of his times (Chouillet 1991: 42).

Copyright © 2019 by
Charles T. Wolfe <>
J.B. Shank

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