Disability and Justice

First published Thu May 23, 2013; substantive revision Tue Jul 2, 2019

Among the topics in philosophy and disability, the relationship between disability and justice has received the lion’s share of attention. No doubt this is in part because justice, often regarded as the “first virtue of social institutions” (Rawls 1971: 3), is central to the evaluation of social policies and public institutions. But it is also because disability has played at least two distinct roles in recent discussions of social justice. First, disability has been seen by many as a paradigm example of unchosen disadvantage. Hence, disability has played a central role in internal discussions of luck egalitarianism, in particular with respect to the “currency” question—equality of what?—and external discussions, in particular with respect to the question of whether luck egalitarianism is disrespectful or stigmatizing. Second, people with disabilities, particularly intellectual or cognitive disabilities, have been seen by many as a “limit case” for contractarian or contractualist theories of justice. Hence, disability has played a central role in discussions about the eligibility conditions for being party to the contractual procedures by which principles of justice are chosen and for being subject to the principles of justice so chosen.

Disability also presents difficult issues as a social or group identity: roughly, a central part of the way an individual understands, presents, or values herself. This aspect of disability has been made salient by the civil rights movement that established disability as an important category in antidiscrimination law. Theories that assess justice in terms of the distribution of resources or opportunities have sometimes been criticized for failing to take adequate account of such identities. But the embrace of social identity as a component of justice can be equally problematic.

Disability is of special interest for justice because of the way in which it juxtaposes two basic and powerful senses of injustice. These two senses of injustice are sometimes expressed in terms of a distinction between the justice of distributions and the justice of recognition, or more recently, between distributive justice and relational injustice. Very roughly, we can think of these labels as denoting a distinction between the injustice of certain outcomes—in particular, outcomes in which there is an inequality of income, wealth, health, or other aspects of well-being resulting from morally irrelevant factors—and the injustice of certain forms of treatment—in particular, the treatment of some people as moral, social, or political inferiors on the basis of morally irrelevant characteristics. Correcting the first form of injustice is thought to require, fundamentally, a change in the distribution of resources, broadly construed, that affect well-being. Correcting the first form of injustice is thought to require, fundamentally, a change in the structure and character of interpersonal relationships, which may in turn require changes to social and institutional norms and practices. Needless to say, the relationship and comparative importance of these two forms of injustice have been the subject of considerable discussion, and there is no canonical statement of the distinction (Fourie et al. 2015; Anderson 1999; Fraser 2001, 1996; Honneth 1992).

This entry is organized as follows: Section 1 will discuss disability in terms of these two broad types of injustice. Sections 2 and 3 will examine the implications of different models of disability for the distinction between redistribution and recognition. Section 4 will then examine the treatment of disability in contemporary theories of distributive justice. It will explain how the environmental and social character of disability has been largely overlooked by contractarian and egalitarian theories, not so much because of their distributive focus, but because of their narrow focus on one aspect of disability—functional limitation—to the neglect of exclusionary attitudes and practices. Section 4 will conclude by discussing recent efforts to rectify this neglect, describing several ways in which distributive justice theorists have sought to take account of environmental and social barriers and to address claims for recognition. These efforts include broadening the metric for just distributions to encompass respectful relationships and social practices; arguing that a just distribution on such broader metrics can be attained more effectively and appropriately by modifying the physical and social environment than by redistributing resources among individuals; and adopting outcome standards that do not require strict equality on any metric but rather the reduction or elimination of disrespectful inequalities. Section 5 will discuss a major issue in the recognition of disability: the relationship of disability identity to various approaches to justice, where “identity” is understood as a part of an individual’s self-understanding or self-presentation.

1. Disability, Recognition, and Redistribution

It is clear that people with disabilities have long been treated as moral and social inferiors, at the same time that they have suffered distributive injustices of various kinds (see generally, Barclay 2018). Routinely, people with disabilities have been denied jobs for which they are highly qualified because they have been considered incompetent, or because employers have not been comfortable with their presence in the workplace. Often, people with certain disabilities have been consigned to segregated institutions and facilities because they have been regarded as incapable of making decisions or caring for themselves, or because others in the community did not want to interact with them.

These forms of relational injustice are associated with very concrete material inequalities. In 2009, almost 20 years after the passage of the Americans with Disabilities Act, the employment-population ratio of people with disabilities in the United States was 19.2%, compared to 64.5% for persons without a disability (Bureau of Labor Statistics 2010). Based on data from 1996–1999, researchers estimate that 47.4% of working-age adults who experienced poverty for a year or more had at least one disability (Fremstad 2009).

Facts such as these have led some to conclude that

in particular, internally diverse ways, people with disabilities have been on the end of a kind of pincer movement between Fraser’s two impediments to parity: “misrecognition” and “maldistribution” (Calder 2010: 62).

In these respects, people with disabilities are in a comparable position to members of other “discrete and insular minorities” with a history of being subject to both distributive and relational injustice. But there is a significant difference. Simply put, there is no reason to think that it need be particularly expensive to eliminate disrespect and misrecognition towards racial, ethnic, and sexual minorities. But insofar as accommodation and reconstruction of the built environment are necessary to eliminate disrespect and misrecognition towards people with disabilities, relational justice for people with disabilities may require diverting significant resources from other causes. In that sense, achieving justice for people with disabilities requires us to directly address the relationship between relational justice and distributive justice to a degree that achieving justice for members of other groups generally does not.

To be sure, the costs associated with accommodation and reconstruction of the built environment need not be understood as compensation for the alleged deficits of people with disabilities. Indeed, they would have to be acknowledged even if disabilities were seen as intrinsically neutral physical or mental characteristics that merely differ from those of a majority of the population. In any society whose physical structures and social practices are designed for average or typical members, people with disabilities will be disadvantaged just because of their minority status. A similar point has been made by feminist scholars, who have pointed out the structural discrimination of workplaces and public settings designed exclusively for men. The expenses of additional restrooms, stalls, or pumping stations do not compensate women for their deficiencies. They simply accommodate differences ignored in a society that saw a woman’s place as in the home (Wendell 1996; Wasserman 1998: 178–179).

Still, the rectification of such structural discrimination may raise more difficult issues for people with disabilities than for women, because there is greater uncertainty and potential for disagreement about the extent of the changes that are required to treat people with disabilities as social and political equals. Indeed, the range and variety of physical and mental differences within a society raise issues of distributive justice that have no obvious analogue for other stigmatized groups. A “gender-neutral” environment can be readily conceived, and achieved at modest cost. In contrast, disability scholars and activists have not specified what it would mean to achieve an “ability-neutral” environment—one that was no more advantageous to people with some physical and mental characteristics than others. And some argued that the ideas of an “ability-neutral” environment is either conceptually incoherent or prohibitively expensive (Barclay 2011, 2018). Moreover, it seems likely that questions about the extent to which justice requires reconstructing or modifying the built environment would arise with respect to people with disabilities even in a society with no history of invidious attitudes or practices toward such persons. By contrast, it seems less likely that such questions would arise in a society with no history of sexism, for example.

Justice for people with disabilities, then, appears to raise questions about the relationship between distributive justice and relational justice that justice for other stigmatized groups does not. Yet the need for redistribution hardly reduces the importance of recognition in achieving justice. Indeed, the complex, disputed relationship between the two makes disability a significant challenge for theories of justice.

2. Models of Disability and Their Implications for Justice

“Disability” is typically defined in terms of two elements: (i) a physical or mental characteristic labeled or perceived as an impairment or dysfunction, and (ii) a significant personal or social limitation associated with that characteristic. The relationship between these two elements—and the role of the environment in mediating them—is a core issue in the conceptualization of, and social response to, disability. The medical model treats disability as an individual physical or mental characteristic with significant personal and social consequences. In particular, it sees the limitations faced by people with disabilities as resulting primarily or solely from their impairments. By contrast, the various social models see disability as a relationship between individuals and their social environments: physical and mental characteristics are limiting only or primarily in virtue of social practices that lead to the exclusion of people with those characteristics. This exclusion is manifested not only in deliberate segregation, but in built environments and social practices that restrict the participation of people regarded as having disabilities (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience).

In their extreme forms, which treat the impairment or environment (respectively) as the sole cause of personal and social limitation, the medical and social models have few, if any, defenders. Rather, they mark the limits of possible relationships between impairment and limitation. Almost all writers on disability acknowledge some role for both the impairment and the environment in causing limitations; the disagreement largely concerns the assessment of their comparative contribution, and their interaction. Most scholars who embrace some version of the social model acknowledge that impairments—generally but not universally understood as deviations from species-relative statistical norms—can be sources of discomfort and limitation even in the absence of disadvantaging social practices (e.g., Shakespeare 2006, Thomas 2004). These scholars would argue, however, that such adverse effects are far less damaging than social exclusion, are greatly magnified by hostile environments, and could be significantly reduced by more inclusive environments. The medical model is less often explicitly defended than unreflectively adopted—by health care professionals, bioethicists, and philosophers who ignore or underestimate the contribution of social and other environmental factors to the limitations faced by people with disabilities. Even among these groups, however, there is a growing awareness of the environmental contribution to disability and a partial embrace of the social model (Cureton and Brownlee 2009).

To the extent that it is held by anyone in unalloyed form, the medical model of disability would not deny that disability raises issues of justice. Indeed, that model might give support to the view that the disadvantages perceived as inherent to disability raise some of the most urgent claims of justice (Barclay 2011, 2018). But such a model does not recognize any principled rationale for preferring reconstruction of the social and built environment over compensation or correction as a means for correcting disability-related disadvantage, a point made by Wolff (2009a, 2009b), among others. In contrast, the social model strongly supports such a rationale, since it construes many aspects of disability-related disadvantage as essentially connected to various forms of literal and figurative exclusion. Relatedly, the social model construes reconstruction as a public good: more accessible structures and more inclusive practices can be enjoyed by a wide variety of people with and without disabilities (Scotch and Schriner 1997). But such reconstruction also helps to achieve a fairer distribution of tangible and intangible goods, particularly social and economic opportunities.

Some critics accuse social model theorists of assuming that any disadvantage caused by the social environment is ipso facto unjust (Samaha 2007). This assumption would reflect an oversimplified view of the relationship between causing disadvantage and creating injustice. The fact that social structures or practices cause disadvantage does not imply that there is a duty of justice to correct or compensate for the disadvantage. That will depend on the costs of alleviating it, and—under any plausible theory of justice—some comparison with the advantages and disadvantages that would result from alternative social arrangements. Thus, for example, choosing to spend the bulk of a municipal arts budget on a concert hall rather than an art museum may disadvantage those who cannot hear. But that disadvantage, although caused by a social decision, is not necessarily unjust. That will depend, inter alia, on the availability of non-auditory forms of aesthetic experience and the comparative costs of building the museum instead. To take another example, placing ramps and elevators in new high-rise buildings is relatively inexpensive and beneficial to most users, whereas placing them in nineteenth century walk-ups is difficult and expensive; holding public meetings or events in buildings with ramps and elevators has negligible costs, whereas moving an existing business from a building that lacks them to one that has them may be very expensive (Samaha 2007; Wasserman 2001).

The difficulty of inferring injustice from socially caused disadvantage is clear in contexts where greater social provision secures incremental advantage. In such contexts, the question of how much is just will not always have an obvious answer. For example, it would at least marginally benefit wheelchair-users to have additional restricted parking spaces, but we could hardly infer an injustice from the fact that an institution provided N rather than N + 1 such spaces. Intuitively, the allotment should be proportionate to the number of wheelchair users in the community or at the facility, but that number may be uncertain, and a range of spaces would likely satisfy any proportionality requirement.[1] In deciding how many spaces are enough, we would receive no guidance from the indisputable fact that any disadvantage or advantage in this context would have social causes.

Conversely, the fact that social arrangements do not cause or contribute to a disadvantage does not insulate it from claims of justice; the failure to alleviate that disadvantage may be unjust on plausible accounts of justice. Thus, although many “natural” disasters like Hurricanes Katrina owe much of their destructive impact to social arrangements, it is plausible that the state’s duty to support the victims of hurricanes and tsunamis is not contingent on its responsibility for causing or exacerbating them (Wasserman 2001).[2] Indeed, as we discuss below, various forms of luck egalitarianism do not distinguish between disadvantages caused versus merely not corrected by society’s institutions, provided that the relevant disadvantages are equally severe and equally unchosen by those disadvantaged.

Nevertheless, the causal claims made by social-model theorists are relevant to justice in several ways. First, as suggested above, for most theories of justice, the mere fact that the social environment can be modified in ways that alleviate the disadvantages associated with impairment places demands for their alleviation within the scope of justice—as claims that a theory of justice must consider and weigh. Second, the fact that those disadvantages are caused by social arrangements is relevant for those theories that regard society as having a stronger duty not to create or aggravate disadvantages than it has to prevent or correct them (Wasserman 2001, Schemmel 2012). Finally, alleviating the disadvantages attributable to prejudice or stigma will enjoy priority on any theory of justice that treats disadvantage resulting from prejudice or stigma as a greater injustice than innocently-created disadvantage.[3]

Beyond a shared concern with the social causation of disability, different versions of the social model emphasize different features of the exclusionary structures and practices (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience). The minority group model regards people with impairments as a stigmatized minority group. It holds that the main reason people with disabilities encounter special hardships is that they face discrimination akin to that faced by racial or ethnic minorities (Hahn 1987, Oliver 1990). The human variation model holds that many of the challenges faced by disabled people do not result from deliberate exclusion, but from a mismatch between their characteristics and the physical and social environment (Scotch and Schriner 1997). These two versions of the social model differ mainly in emphasis. The discrimination stressed by the minority group model generally leads to, and is expressed in, the societal failure to accommodate people with stigmatized differences. Yet the failure to fully accommodate people with various differences, from extreme height to intellectual impairment, does not necessarily arise from stigma. But often, disparities in access that were initially caused by resource or technological limits are maintained by stigma. For example, an employer’s initial purchase of communications technology inaccessible to blind or deaf employees may be explained by the fact that accessible technology had not been developed at the time of purchase. But those historic facts would not justify the employer’s refusal to include modestly priced accessibility features when purchasing upgrades a decade later, for example.

Both versions of the social model require the removal of barriers and practices serving to exclude people with disabilities, and the reconstruction of the environment to more fully include them. Under a minority-group model, these measures are dictated primarily by a demand for recognition and respect, and for the correction of past expressions of disrespect found in the knowing exclusion of people with disabilities from many aspects of social, political, and economic life. The human variation model puts less weight on the expressive or symbolic significance of past exclusion. Rather than construing people with disabilities as a “discrete and insular minority” created by practices of more or less deliberate exclusion, the human variation model construes people with disabilities as simply people who differ in degree from the majority of statistically normal population with respect to one or more physical or mental characteristics. The purpose of reconstruction is not so much to end specific exclusionary practices as to create a more inclusive physical and social environment. Given this difference in emphasis, it is natural to understand the human variation model as appealing principally to norms of distributive fairness, ensuring equal or adequate access to the physical and social environment, in contrast to the minority group model, which appeals more explicitly to norms of respect and recognition.

The demand for greater inclusiveness is less categorical than the demand to eliminate discrimination. Although any environment can be made more inclusive, none can be fully inclusive for everyone (Barclay 2010, 2018). This is not necessarily because, as Barclay, following Shakespeare (2006), claims, the inclusionary features required for one impairment often conflict with those required by another. Such conflicts may be minor, temporary, and remediable. The problem is more general: 1) for many characteristics, from height to mathematical aptitude, one “size” does not fit all; 2) providing different sizes increases fit for a wider range of variation, but at increasing cost (albeit less than often assumed); and 3) it is frequently impractical, and may arguably be unjust, to ensure that everyone is equally well-or ill-fitted; it may, for example, be too expensive to ensure that left-handed or extremely tall individuals suffer no inconvenience in being statistical minorities. Full inclusion, like universal design, is an ideal—one that cannot be fully achieved, and that must be compromised in the partial satisfaction of other legitimate claims.

Even if it would be impossible or unreasonable to achieve full inclusion through wholesale changes in the physical or social environment, modest changes could significantly increase inclusion at little cost. Some examples come from a study of environment modification for autistic individuals (Owren 2013). Some people with autism face significant barriers to taking part in routine social activities: they find such familiar stimuli as applause, light touching, and deodorant as highly aversive; they must be explicitly instructed about social expectations because they cannot “read” most facial expressions or social clues. The study’s author recognizes that the “neurotypical majority” cannot be expected to give up applause, light touching, or even deodorant, let alone nuance in communication:

What would be lost? Large parts of what may be some of the most treasured areas of communication: the art of innuendo, the double meaning at the heart of much comedy, irony, the implied meaning at the heart of so much poetry,… flirtation and “feeling each other out” before committing to something that cannot be retracted. (2013: 23-24)

At the same time, the author points out that the majority could often gain from more modest accommodations.

Many neurotypicals might profit from being more explicit and from others being more explicit, as can be illustrated by the extensive focus in couples therapy on getting partners to state their needs and expectations more explicitly, not relying on other to pick up on “vaguely described, implied, or unspoken behavioral expectations”. (2013: 92)

The author suggests (2013: 111) that it may be feasible to develop “best practices”: “strategies for enhancing accessibility and reducing sensory issues in a larger scale” without unduly burdening the majority:

One strategy might be to incorporate into Universal design the practice of providing access to low stimulation areas in mainstream settings. Another might be to create more public acceptance of autistic behaviors like stimming,[4] which seem to help many autistic people reduce the impact of aversive sensory stimuli.… (2013: 111)

Such strategies clearly involve tradeoffs, but those tradeoffs would involve small economic and social costs for a majority to achieve large gains in inclusion for a minority. The claim that it is impossible to achieve, or even understand, full inclusion for people with autism does not deny that there is significant injustice in their current state of social isolation.

The challenges for social models of disability for justice may seem greatest for intellectual and psychiatric impairments, as well as for complex physical impairments such as fibromyalgia, multiple chemical sensitivity, and other conditions that radically and unpredictably affect energy, stamina, and functioning (Wendell 1989, 1996; Davis 2005). First, these conditions strikingly display both aspects of impairment, as markers for stigma and as sources of functional limitation (see SEP entry, disability: definitions, models, experience). Cognitive and psychiatric impairments evoke some of the strongest prejudice and all present some of the most difficult functional limitations, e.g., on the capacities to engage in practical reasoning, to recognize the intentions and attitudes of other people, or to participate in shared activities.Second, some theorists contend that these conditions pose more of a practical challenge for the social model than even the most severe physical disabilities, in part because the measures required for greater inclusion are not as concrete or tangible, and may demand greater imagination to envision and implement.[5]

Although significant practical work has been done in educational and workplace inclusion, philosophers have been daunted by the challenge of social reconstruction for cognitive disabilities. Thus Jonathan Wolff, who generally favors such reconstruction—which he calls “status enhancement”—as the most respectful intervention, asks

What would it mean to change the world so that people with cognitive disabilities and other people were equally able to find a worthwhile place in the world? Can we even imagine what this would be? (2009a: 407)

Many rights and privileges are thought to require a certain level of cognitive capacity, e.g., the right to vote or contract (Wikler 1979). Similarly, most jobs are structured to require regular hours, uninterrupted activity, undivided attention, and general sociability.

How much should a society modify these requirements or restructure these activities to include people with various intellectual, psychiatric, and complex physical disabilities? A total relaxation of such requirements would impose large, even “unduly burdensome” costs. However, many modifications to promote the inclusion of people with significant cognitive impairments would also benefit people with typical cognitive function: simplified task explanations, warning labels, news copy, and jury instructions. Many accommodations employers are already making to increase flexibility and reduce stress, from individually-tailored schedules to telecommuting, would ease the entry of people with these disabilities into the workplace. There is a growing body of practical and policy work that applies social models of disability to people with intellectual, psychiatric, and complex physical impairments (e.g., Biklen 1992; Block 2006; Connor et al. 2008; Hehir 2002).

As discussed later in this Entry, there is sharp disagreement about whether individuals with the most severe intellectual impairments qualify as subjects of justice. But even if individuals with the most substantial intellectual impairments are regarded as subjects of justice, what justice demands for them, and of them, may be uncertain or disputed. Nussbaum (2009) contends that the equal citizenship of those individuals requires that they be enabled to exercise such political rights as voting and jury service through appropriate surrogates. Wasserman and McMahan (2012) question whether those rights could be meaningfully exercised by surrogates for individuals with the most severe intellectual disabilities.

Some philosophical intimation of a social model approach to cognitive disability can be found in Dan Wikler’s 1979 essay, “Paternalism and the Mildly Retarded”. Wikler held that the category of cognitive disability was socially constructed by the competence thresholds set for important social activities, such as signing a contract or voting in an election. But although society chooses, in this sense, who will be cognitively impaired, it does not have unlimited flexibility, since there can be significant social costs in altering those thresholds. The issue, Wikler concluded, was ultimately one of justice; of fairly distributing the burdens of setting thresholds that will be too high for some or too low for others. Yet Wikler questioned whether justice would require, or even permit, the kind of modifications necessary for significantly greater participation. Writing two decades later, Wolff cited Wikler in stating,

the fact is that what makes much of modern life possible now relies on binding and enforceable contracts that in turn assume a certain level of intellectual competence. To change the world so that such a bar is lowered would have tremendous costs. (2009a: 407)

This pessimism has prevailed in the years since Wikler wrote, and there has been little philosophical attention to practical possibilities for the inclusion of people with cognitive impairments. Although there have been interesting discussions of this issue in the context of education (e.g., Howe 1996; Ladenson 2005; Veatch 1986), the general issue has tended to be dealt with in summary fashion. (Exceptions include Kittay and Carlson 2010; Hartley 2009a; Silvers and Francis 2009; Wong 2007, 2009.) Thus, for cognitive disabilities, Wolff emphasizes “targeted resource enhancement” rather than status enhancement, arguing for an entitlement scheme that gives people with cognitive disabilities maximum possible control over an individual budget for personal assistance and social support (2009a: 407–413). He does regard some forms of status enhancement, notably antidiscrimination measures, “as essential”, but he accepts Wikler’s conclusion that broader changes in social practice carry “intolerable costs” (2009a: 413).

In their influential book From Chance to Choice, Buchanan et al. (2000) repeat the assertion that there would be excessive social costs in reconstructing society to permit the full participation of people with significant cognitive impairments. They compare the reconstruction of society for greater inclusion with a family decision to play only the card games that a young child can understand. They contend that just as adults will tire of a constant game of Go Fish, the society will be “dumbed down” if it refashions itself to fully include people with cognitive impairments.

Although the meaning of inclusion is debatable, and different forms of inclusion will have differing value for different people, the card-game analogy oversimplifies the challenge. To present inclusion as a zero-sum allocation is to dumb down the incredibly complex task of rearranging society to respect and nurture all its members. The analogy assumes that every activity must be done by everyone, which is false.

A more apt analogy to organized social activity might be an assortment of games that can be played by different combinations of people in different ways. Some games could be played by everyone; others could be modified to include cognitively impaired people in a way that preserved the interest of non-disabled players; some would be beyond the reach of people with certain cognitive impairments. But even the most cognitively gifted individuals could not participate in all games—the sheer amount of training and practice required to master some of them, and the considerable time and energy many of them require, would preclude participation in many or most. Indeed, society may function better if people have varying aptitudes for, and interests in, different activities. (A similar criticism of the card-game analogy is offered by Wong (2007), who recounts how her brother with Down enriched rather than impoverished family life.) The fact that a smaller set of activities may be available to people with cognitive impairments need not present a problem, if it does not result in their social isolation or deny them intellectual challenges (Parens & Asch 2000: 25–26 [quoting Philip Ferguson, personal correspondence]). But ensuring their participation may require society to refashion itself in significant ways.

It is not clear that such refashioning would impose the “intolerable costs” feared by Wolff. Social inclusion does not require, for example, that individuals with significant cognitive impairments be able to make binding contracts in every domain of law and business; it requires that competence standards be graduated to reflect the complexity of specific tasks so that those individuals are not categorically excluded –a suggestion made more than two decades ago by the authors of the card-game metaphor (Buchanan and Brock 1990). Social model theorists know full well that impairments—physical as well as cognitive—differ from skin color in that they are sometimes relevant to what people can do, as are such other attributes as education and income. But that feature of impairment hardly precludes social reconstruction. Indeed, the most effective rebuttal to the card-game metaphor may be found in the practical work that already has been done in educational and workplace inclusion (e.g., Biklen 1992; Block 2006; Hehir 2002; McGuire et al. 2006). At the same time, it bears emphasis that the social model of disability was originally conceptualized in terms of physical disabilities. And there may be significant limitations on the extent to which it applies to cognitive disabilities. More generally, although it may be useful to speak of “the” social model of “disability”, the diversity of impairments that fall under the extension of “disability” suggests that the aptness of the social model in any given context will vary depending on the nature of the impairments at issue.

3. Justice, Reconstruction, and Reasonable Accommodation

As suggested in §1, the disabling impact of social arrangements may be relevant to the type and scope of interventions that justice requires. In stressing the impact and the malleability of the environment, social-model theorists have shifted the focus from claims for correction and compensation to claims for reconstruction.

Consider a society with much greater height variation than our own. Even if very tall or short stature was neither stigmatized nor functionally limiting, that society would, on any plausible theory of justice, be obliged to construct its public spaces, buildings, and vehicles to accommodate them. They would be treated unjustly if the construction of the physical environment took no account of them, especially if the failure to do so caused them significant disadvantage. Of course, the extent to which their height differences needed to be taken into account would depend on the distribution of height in the society, as well as on its level of resources and competing needs. No plausible theory of justice would require that the built environment be equally accommodating to all heights, if such a thing were possible, but all would condemn some environments as unjustly restrictive. What even this simple case suggests is that the demand for a more inclusive environment need not be seen in terms of compensating individuals, tall or impaired, for their internal deficits, but of accommodating as wide as possible a range of human variation.

Even if environmental reconstruction should not be seen as compensating for deficits, a question remains about the extent to which it should be seen as a matter of redistribution or recognition. This question is raised by the legal requirement of “reasonable accommodation”. Under the ADA and ADAAA, “accommodations” include ramps, elevators, texts in multiple formats, sign-language interpreters, flexible work schedules, and job coaches or assistance. The failure to make reasonable accommodation for disabled employees or users of public facilities constitutes, with some notable exceptions, discrimination (ADA 1990). There is no reference to that concept in the laws banning discrimination on the basis of race, sex, or age; the term was introduced in cases addressing claims of religious discrimination (see, e.g., Karlan and Rutherglen 1996). Like practitioners of minority religions, but unlike women, people of color, or older people, people with disabilities must be “reasonably accommodated”.

For the human variation model, reasonable accommodation requires changes in the physical and social environment, from installing ramps to modifying work schedules and altering the location of meetings and classes. Often, such changes require little more than flexibility and imagination. But some of these changes can be expensive; at some point, the cost may make further change unreasonable. On this approach, the legislative understanding of such accommodation as a matter of distributive justice is reflected in the qualifying use of “reasonable” and the exemption of accommodations that would impose an “undue” burden or hardship on the entity required to make accommodations (Wasserman 1998).

But it is also possible to see reasonable accommodation as a requirement of equality for people with disabilities without recourse to a theory of distributive justice (e.g., Crossley 2004; Karlan and Rutherglen 1996). Accommodating religious practices may be expensive in various ways, but no one regards doing so either as compensating religions for their deficits. Indeed, such a rationale would appear to violate the state’s constitutionally-mandated neutrality among religions. Rather, because the state is required to treat religions and their adherents with equal respect and concern (Dworkin 2003), it disfavors rules and practices that interfere with religious observance. Somewhat similarly, a state that regards people with disabilities with equal respect and concern will disfavor arrangements that interfere with their participation. With respect to both groups, substantive equality may require unequal provisions. In the case of disability as well as religion, how much additional provision is required is indeterminate, not for lack of a complete theory of justice to specify the amount or proportion, but because the demands of equal respect are indeterminate.

Consider, for example, the question of how much it is reasonable for a small business to spend on an elevator or ground-floor space to be able to employ a talented IT technician with emphysema. To answer that question, we might do better to decide what respect for that person demands, based in part on current social practice and convention, rather than to consult a comprehensive but abstract theory of distributive justice. In any case, it may be unreasonable to expect a determinate answer; it may be appropriate to rely on a fair procedure to select among a range of plausible outcomes. But by the same token, the utter lack of accommodation in many workplaces and public facilities is clearly unjust on any plausible theory of justice.

The debate over the accommodations available for a minority group may often reflect a complex mix of claims concerning redistribution and recognition. For example, people in wheelchairs are sometimes provided restaurant access only through the service entrance. The restaurant owners often claim that such access is quite reasonable, since the service entrances already have ramps—a distributive consideration. Disability advocates claim that however convenient it may be for the owners, such access treats wheelchair users as second-class customers—a claim of misrecognition. In this case, it may seem that the recognition claims clearly trump the conflicting distributional claims. But this will not always be the case.

Again, resolving such conflicts may involve the same kind of judgment employed in debates over accommodating minority religious practices. It may be that some jobs cannot be made available to people whose Sabbath falls on Friday or Saturday, because (in light of demographic considerations) the essential functions of those jobs require working on those days. But although the “essential function” standard appears objective and determinate, it is often subject to distributive considerations, e.g., about staffing requirements and business volume. A refusal to sustain the slightest loss of revenue to accommodate any minority religion might be a distributive injustice; a willingness to sustain greater losses to accommodate Jewish and Adventist employees than Muslim ones might involve misrecognition as well—the failure to treat Islamic practice as having the same value as other religious practices. Similarly, the violation of the ADA involved in refusing to display the same flexibility for disabled as for pregnant employees arguably constitutes both distributive injustice and misrecognition.

The uncertainty about the distributive character of reasonable accommodation suggests that in the case of disability, it may often be difficult to sharply distinguish claims for redistribution and recognition.[6] Recognition may require redistribution, and redistribution should aim at securing recognition. Asch (1989) has gone even further, arguing that recognition must precede redistribution; that if people with disabilities were recognized as equals, capable of significant contributions to others, society would be more willing to adopt appropriate measures for redistribution and reconstruction.

4. Disability in Contemporary Theories of Justice

The resurgence of philosophical interest in justice is often dated to the publication of John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice in 1971. Although that was only two years before the passage of the Rehabilitation Act of 1973, embodying a social model of disability (see SEP entry, disability: definitions, models, experience), it was well before the academic reconceptualization of disability as a social phenomenon. For the 25 years after A Theory of Justice, many justice theorists tacitly accepted the medical model (e.g., Dworkin 1981a,b; Daniels 1985). They treated disability as a physical or mental limitation of the individual, the principal cause of disability-related disadvantage. Disability thus posed a problem for justice theories based on mutual advantage, hypothetical agreement, or material or social equality. People with disabilities did not appear to offer reciprocal advantages; they complicated the task of reaching a hypothetical agreement on the basic structure of society; and they made the goal of equality seem impossibly demanding.

By the late 1990s, some mainstream political philosophers were becoming acquainted with social models of disability, and some disability theorists were gaining a hearing among political philosophers. Some philosophers sought to modify distributive theories of justice to take account of the social and environmental character of disability; others cited the failure of those theories to take appropriate account of disability as one reason to reject exclusively distributive approaches.

Before describing these developments, it is useful to distinguish two types of distributive theories. Modern social contract theories, notably Rawls’ (1971), seek to determine the fair terms of social cooperation to which individuals (generally with limited knowledge of their own situations) would agree; they argue that certain distributive principles would be among those terms (Rawls’ “difference principle” may be the most familiar). Rawlsian theories are procedural in one sense: they regard any distribution as just if and only if it is consistent with the distributive principles that would be chosen by those individuals. Disability-oriented criticism of these theories has focused on their assumptions about the individuals who are eligible to make a hypothetical contract or participate in the cooperative scheme it establishes. Critics have argued for the eligibility of people with disabilities or their representatives to participate in the contract-making processes and resulting cooperative scheme more than about the validity of the principles or rules yielded by that process (Richardson 2006; Silvers and Francis 2005; Stark 2007). The second type of theory is primarily interested in outcomes; in the kind of end state a just society should strive for: either equality on some outcome metric or the reduction of certain kinds of inequality. Here, disability-informed criticism has favored outcome metrics that take account of the social contribution to disability-related disadvantage, and standards for just distributions that are oriented toward disrespectful inequalities (Anderson 1999; Nussbaum 2006a; Wolff 2009b).

4.1 Disability and Contemporary Social Contract Theories

Within social contract theories, a distinction is often drawn between contractarian/Hobbesian and contractualist/Lockean accounts (see SEP entry on contractarianism). One way to characterize this distinction is in terms of the parties’ motivation and interaction. In the former, they are narrowly self-interested and hard-bargaining; in the latter, their self-interest is tempered or balanced by their commitment to justifying themselves to others, and they proceed by deliberating rather than by bargaining. This distinction is often formulated in terms of a distinction between (merely) rational agents, and “reasonable” agents.

A Rawlsian approach might seem more congenial than a Hobbesian approach to people with disabilities. It derives the basic structure of society from a hypothetical choice situation, the Original Position, in which a veil of ignorance precludes reliance on the contractors’ actual limitations—limitations that a Hobbesian contractor might ruthlessly (albeit rationally, if not reasonably) exploit (cf. note 10). Although the parties themselves are motivated exclusively by considerations of self-interest, which Rawls understands in terms of the fulfillment of two higher-order interests (see SEP Entry on the original position), the informational constraints of the Original Position compel the parties to motivate as if they are reasonable, at least in the sense that it compels them to be impartial between the claims of all who will be subject to the principles they choose.

But even if Rawlsian contractors do not know their specific limitations, they do know that they, or the individuals they represent, are not permanently disabled. Rawls stipulated that the idealized society whose “basic structure” was the subject of hypothetical agreement was restricted to members who would be “fully-cooperating” over the course of their adult lives. Rawls assumed that this restriction would exclude people with severe and permanent physical and mental disabilities (Rawls 1993: 18–20). He did not defend that assumption, nor provide for the representation of those people in the process by which the basic structure of society is to be determined. Instead, he consigned their fate to the later, legislative phase. Rawls also restricted participation in the Original Position to those with two “moral powers”: the capacity to form and revise one’s own conception of the good; and the capacity for a sense of justice, the capacity to act on and apply fair terms of cooperation (ibid.). It is doubtful that these powers can be attributed to people with the most severe intellectual and psychiatric impairments, although some philosophers and disability scholars have argued that a just society should treat all human beings as having the potential to develop such functioning (Wong 2007, 2009).

Disability scholars have been particularly critical of these eligibility conditions for the Original Position. If the deliberators in the Original Position do not believe that they could be representing, or could turn out to actually be, people with “severe and permanent” disabilities when the veil is lifted, they will have no prudential reason to choose a basic structure for their society that will provide for the inclusion of those people. Indeed, insofar as such measures would impose costs on people with non-disabilities, the parties will have prudential reasons not to support such measures, since doing so would undermine the interests of people whom they know they could represent (the able-bodied on whom the costs are imposed) for the sake of those whom they explicitly know they don’t represent (the disabled for whom the costs are imposed).

Several philosophers sympathetic to the Rawlsian framework have suggested modifications that would give people with disabilities a greater and more direct role in the social contracting process. Some have argued that the “full cooperation” requirement, and the kind of reciprocity it involves, can be liberally interpreted so as not to exclude most people with significant physical disabilities (Hartley 2009b; Stark 2009). Henry Richardson has gone even further, maintaining that “Rawls’ arguments making use of the device of the [Original Position] do not essentially depend on any reciprocity premise” (2006: 427). He examines modified versions of the Original Position that drop the assumption that no one has severe and permanent disabilities. He contends that with such modifications, the Original Position can yield principles more sensitive to disability concerns about the continuous nature of abilities, the stigmatization resulting from false dichotomization, and the exclusion of severely disabled human beings.

In response, Martha Nussbaum (2006b: 490–498) concedes that Richardson’s proposed reconstruction of Rawls would largely avoid the exclusionary features of the OP to which disability scholars have objected. But she argues that this reconstruction is a more radical departure from Rawls than Richardson acknowledges. She suggests that the theory loses its contractual character if it dispenses, per Richardson, with the reciprocity requirement and the assumption that the contractors have roughly equal physical and mental powers.

Rawls’ “moral powers” condition has posed further problems. Harry Brighouse (2001) observes that modifying the cooperation requirement still excludes those whose cognitive impairments preclude their possession of the two moral powers. Sophia Wong (2009, 2007) argues that those powers can be acquired by people with severe intellectual impairments, with adequate social support. Leslie Francis (2009) and Anita Silvers (Silvers and Francis 2009) contend that many individuals with severe cognitive impairments can collaborate with others to construct individualized, authentic conceptions of the good. Silvers and Francis (2005) and Christie Hartley (2009a) also maintain that people with severe intellectual impairments can be represented adequately in a contracting process that consists in trust-building more than hard bargaining, even if they cannot participate in it personally.

Others have argued that exclusion from the Original Position need not adversely affect people with disabilities or treat them with disrespect. Adam Cureton (2008) argues that the exclusion of people with severe disabilities from the Original Position is just part of its idealization, and does not diminish the urgency or priority of their claims. Cynthia Stark (2007) proposes lifting the full-cooperation requirement to include people with disabilities at the second stage of Rawlsian deliberation, where the society’s constitution is established and where the hypothetical decision makers acquire some knowledge about the resources, development level, and other characteristics of their society.

The plausibility of these responses to Rawls depends to some extent on which version of the Original Position we consider. Rawls made a change in his presentation of the Original Position in his Restatement (2001) that is especially pertinent to people with cognitive disabilities. He emphasized that the participants in the Original Position are representatives of people in the future society, not people living in the future society denied knowledge of their social position. If representatives were made to take into account the possibility that those they represent might be disabled, this might help to ensure that the interests of the disabled were represented. It would only do so, however, if the contractors have the ability to imagine the very different embodiments of people with a variety of disabilities, an ability feminist critics of Rawls have questioned with respect to men representing women (Young 1990; Benhabib 1992; Okin 1994). The strictly representational role of participants in the Original Position would also avoid the conflict of interest faced by cognitively unimpaired individuals representing themselves and cognitively impaired individuals.

More broadly, philosophers have varied widely in their optimism about the prospects for including people with disabilities in contractarian or contractualist deliberations. On the one hand, Lawrence Becker (2005) suggests that even selfish, hard-bargaining contractarians (his “tough crowd”) would accept an expansive notion of “reciprocity”, one that would ensure adequate provision for people with disabilities in the scheme of social cooperation they adopt. Their acceptance of reciprocity would arise from recognition of the needs and vulnerabilities they and their loved ones have or will likely acquire. That recognition places a premium on social provisions for health.

Even for the tough crowd, health is now ripe for inclusion in the list of basic goods. And it may be that a robust social commitment to health will address questions of justice for the disabled—as long as we are careful to include fundamental aspects of psychological health (i.e., those associated with active rational agency…. (2005: 35)

Members of the tough crowd may not be so careful, however. Indeed, some may not even regard “active rational agency” as a matter of health as they more narrowly construe it, with an emphasis on physical survival and comfort. In contrast to Becker, Eva Kittay (1999) holds that even the most liberal interpretation of Rawls’ scheme will not be sufficiently responsive to the egalitarian concerns that motivate his theory. Rawls’ assumption that the participants in the original position are or represent fully productive members of society neglects the fact of pervasive, inevitable human dependency. “[T]hose within relationships of dependency fall outside the conceptual perimeters of Rawls’ egalitarianism” (1999: 79).

Another debate within contractarian theories that has particular relevance to disability concerns the scope of justice itself: Is justice concerned only with the distribution of social goods, or also with the rectification of “natural inequalities” (Pogge 1989: 44–47). Pogge (1995) argues that in the Original Position, it would be irrational for parties to ignore the contribution of natural advantages to the well-being (understood in terms of the fulfillment of the two “higher-order interests”) of prospective citizens, since from that standpoint, it is just as bad to be disadvantaged by uncompensated disabilities as it is to be disadvantaged (to the same degree) by a small share of social primary goods. But Pogge claims that attempting to eliminate those inequalities would go beyond the scope of justice. Some philosophers argue, however, that many natural inequalities are within the scope of justice, and that health care to mitigate them is a requirement of justice (Daniels 1985; Buchanan et al. 2000).

Other philosophers and disability scholars would deny that the inequalities associated with impairments can be regarded as “natural” (Amundson 1992; Wasserman 2001). In questioning the very notion of “natural inequalities”, they join a broader philosophical debate about whether it is possible to draw a coherent distinction between natural and artificial or social inequalities (see Lippert-Rasmussen 2004; Nagel 1997; Pogge 2004a,b; Aas and Wasserman, 2016).[7] Even if such a distinction can be plausibly drawn, it may turn out that many or most inequalities in abilities are artificial: as with of obsolete skills, those inequalities may be largely attributable to the physical and social environment (Bickenbach 1993).

4.2 Disability, Outcome-Oriented Theories, and the “Currency” of Justice

Other distributive theories of justice take a less procedural approach than Rawls. They are directly concerned with the kinds of outcomes a just society should pursue. These theories differ in the outcome metrics they adopt—the “currency” of distributive justice (Cohen 1989). Some adopt a resource metric (Dworkin 1981b); still others, a metric based on opportunities for welfare (Arneson 1989) or access to advantage (Cohen 1989). Finally, capability theories assess outcomes not only by the goods or resources that people have, but also by what people are able to do with what they have (Nussbaum 1990; Sen 1980). Such outcome-oriented theories may be more or less demanding, depending on whether they require equality or merely priority for the worst-off, and on whether they support equality of a sort that may not require the significant redistribution of goods or resources.

The most prominent family of outcome-oriented approaches has been called “luck egalitarianism” (see, for example, Arneson 2000; Dworkin 2003; Lippert-Rasmussen 2015). According to the dominant characterization of that position, its central claim is that it is unjust when there are unfair inequalities in the distribution of “brute luck”—an advantage or disadvantage with respect to the relevant metric that is not attributable to an individual’s fault, choice, or assumption of risk. “Option luck”, in contrast, refers to an advantage or disadvantage an individual acquires through the foreseeable consequences of his or her actions. The stronger versions of luck egalitarianism (e.g., Dworkin 81b) deny that any inequality resulting from option luck generates claims of justice. On those versions, only some disabilities generate justice claims—those that resulted from brute bad luck (e.g., congenital impairments)—whereas others, which may involve the same or greater disadvantage, do not, simply because they resulted from a free choice (e.g., reckless pastimes or an unhealthy lifestyle).

Some philosophers have taken these implications as a reductio ad absurdum of luck egalitarianism (Anderson 1999), and they would no doubt be rejected by many writers on health care, who have questioned the moral and policy relevance of individual responsibility (Cavallero 2011; Feiring 2008; Galvin 2002; Wikler 1987). The greater concern for disability scholars may be with the conflation of disadvantages resulting from unchosen impairments with disadvantages resulting from unchosen social conditions under the one heading of “bad brute luck”. Luck egalitarianism does not, as such, provide any principled rationale for distinguishing between equally severe setbacks to the well-being of people with disabilities that result from the “bad luck” of being born in a society with disability discrimination and the “bad luck” of being born with an intrinsically disadvantageous set of physical abilities. Both are equally unchosen from the individual’s standpoint, and it is individual responsibility, rather than some combination of individual and collective responsibility, that determines whether a given disadvantage generates a valid justice complaint. This is not to deny that luck egalitarianism can be supplemented to account for the intuition that the “bad luck” of being born in a disabling environment (Fine and Asch 1988) differs morally from less socially mediated forms of bad luck, as we will see in our discussion of the capabilities approach.

4.3 The Appropriate Metric for Distributive Justice

The implications of outcome-oriented theories for disability depend on two features of those theories. The first is the metric, or “currency” of justice they adopt—welfare, resources, primary goods, or capabilities. The second is the distributive standard they impose—strict equality, priority for the worse off, or merely some minimum for everyone (sufficientarianism). We will consider these two features in order, although they are sometimes intertwined.

Rawls and other social contract theorists adopted a broad outcome metric for assessing the comparative advantage of the individual in a society: “social primary goods”, which include opportunities, basic liberties, income, and the social bases of self-respect. This breadth is intended to achieve neutrality between competing substantive conceptions of the good, since the social primary goods are construed as “all-purpose means” that are valuable to have irrespective of the content of one’s particular conception of the good. For many disability scholars, the difficulty in this approach does not concern its neutrality, but its failure to take account of the environment in which those goods must be utilized, which may profoundly affect their value to those receiving them. Two persons might be alike in their share of social primary goods, and have similar projects, aims, commitments, and values, but nonetheless differ in the value they can derive from those goods, if one person is disabled and the other is not. As we shall see below, the capabilities approach takes into account this objection, when the difference between the uses to which each person can put her primary goods is construed as the result of differences in “internal resources”, or the rate at which the individual can convert resources to “functionings”.

A failure to take adequate account of the environment may also be found in directly-egalitarian resource-based approaches. Dworkin (1981a,b), for example, appears to take the social environment for granted in proposing a hypothetical division of resources into individual bundles. Giving people with impairments equal material shares in a society like our own would hardly satisfy the demands of equality in a physical and social environment designed exclusively for people with standard endowments. Dworkin is aware of the problem, but his solution is to adjust individual shares to include insurance payouts against poor environmental fit, rather than to redesign the environment to reduce inequalities in fit. To that degree, Dworkin appears to tacitly assume a medical model of disability, according to which limitations resulting from impairments are solely attributable to the impairment itself, and, if not correctable, compensable only by the redistribution of resources to people with such impairments. Such compensation may ensure survival, but it does little to enhance or equalize participation, and may in fact hinder participation if Anderson (1999) is right that compensating for disabilities expresses disrespect. Moreover, the size of the insurance payout for a given disability is determined by the amount by which able-bodied people would be willing to insure themselves against the prospect of incurring that disability. Insofar as the judgments of able-bodied people don’t always track the intuitively relevant facts about disability-related disadvantage, such an approach threatens to “bake in” flawed assumptions about the experience of disability into its account of just entitlements for people with disabilities (Bodenheimer 1997a,b).

Several alternatives for assessing outcomes for purposes of political and social equality seem more responsive to the disabling role of the social environment. The most familiar and influential of these alternatives is the capabilities approach, developed in different ways by Martha Nussbaum (2006a) and Amartya Sen (1980). Their accounts are concerned not only with the resources an individual has but also with what she can do with them; with her “capability” of engaging in a number of valuable “functionings”, such as forming intimate relationships and having rich sensory and aesthetic experiences.

Nussbaum’s earlier formulations of the capabilities placed considerable emphasis on species-typical functioning. For example, she initially treated “the exercise of the five senses” as a necessary constituent of human flourishing. More recent formulations are more congenial to social models of disability, in part because of Nussbaum’s encounter with disability scholarship. She now makes room for the social contribution to “natural” deficits (see Wasserman 1998; Terzi 2009), recognizing that most capabilities bear only a contingent, environmentally-mediated relationship to people’s “natural endowment”. She abstracts from differences between people with impaired and normal limb function to find a common claim to the means of moving about from place to place. Such means may be architectural, vehicular, mechanical, or prosthetic; they may involve making places more accessible or making the individual more mobile. Similarly, a person lacking sight or hearing can achieve aesthetic satisfaction by other means; a person with intellectual impairments can participate in activities structured to include individuals of varying cognitive skills. An individual with emphysema could increase his capacity for affiliation and control over the material environment (two capabilities from Nussbaum’s 2006a list) not only by measures to increase his lung capacity but also by measures to increase his access to social and business venues through better transit and architectural design.

Nussbaum’s broader framing enables her to recognize the prospects for flourishing of people with severe impairments. The plausibility of the capabilities approach for disability critics of distributive accounts lies in the way the capabilities are individuated. A basis for individuation might be found in a comprehensive account of human nature and human flourishing, such as the Aristotelian account that informs Nussbaum’s work. As Becker notes, however, such a comprehensive account would have limited appeal in justifying a distributive scheme in a pluralistic society (2005: 35). Despite its promise, considerably more work is needed to clarify her approach. Another feature of Nussbaum’s theory that some disability theorists find congenial is her incorporation of recognition and respect into her set of basic capabilities. Thus, the capability for “affiliation” encompasses not only intimacy, but self-respect and dignity; the capability for “control over the environment” includes both the material and political environments.

Less ambitiously than Nussbaum, Jonathan Wolff (2009b) classifies equality-enhancing measures for people with disabilities by the extent to which they address recognition as well as redistribution. Thus, the individual limitations of people with disabilities can be addressed with either cash compensation or “personal enhancement”, medical, surgical, or rehabilitative measures to correct those limitations. “Targeted resource enhancement” offers an intermediate option, which tries to improve the fit of the individual and the environment with a range of restricted resources such as personal assistance and assistive technology. Finally, “status enhancement” alters the built environment and social practices to reduce the impact of individual differences in abilities on social equality. Wolff generally favors status enhancement as the most respectful intervention, because it shapes the environment to the needs of all members of society. It is also the most stable intervention, because it protects the social equality against sudden changes in individuals’ levels of functioning.

Although Wolff does not adopt the device of hypothetical decision making to justify a preference for status enhancement, that preference could be underwritten by a suitably modified Original Position. As Richardson (2006) suggests, hypothetical decision makers who know that they may represent individuals with severe impairments are more likely to be concerned with capabilities than with primary goods, since the latter by themselves may be of limited value to those they represent. Further, those decision makers would recognize that capabilities often can be increased more respectfully, as well as more effectively, by status enhancements than by other measures.

Yet doubts remain about the extent to which concerns about recognition, respect, and social equality can be captured in any outcome metric of individual well-being, however broad. Thus, Christian Schemmel (2012) argues that the treatment of people as equals must be understood in terms of respectful relationships among individuals and institutions, and that the presence of such relationships cannot plausibly be regarded in what Pogge (2004a,b) calls “recipient-oriented” terms, as components of individual well-being. The moral significance of respectful treatment is neither exhausted by, nor derivative of, its contribution to individual well-being. As Schemmel argues (2012: 19), people may need some forms of affiliation to flourish but do not necessarily require social and political equality for their own well-being. The plausibility of these claims depends to some extent on how narrow or broad a conception of well-being one adopts. A conception that encompasses virtually all that a person has reason to care about will more easily accommodate social equality and respectful relationships.

4.4 The Appropriate Standard for Distributive Justice

Two approaches seek to moderate the ambitions of distributive justice in ways that may be more inclusive of people with disabilities. One takes the end-state of justice not as equality or priority but sufficiency: it requires that every member of society reach some minimum in the appropriate “currency”. This approach, labeled “sufficientarian” by one critic (Arneson 2006), is suggested but not endorsed by Nussbaum, and it serves to make capabilities a less demanding metric for distributive justice. (Nussbaum notes that certain capabilities must be distributed equally if anyone is to have a sufficient level of them, e.g., voting rights.) The requirement that a just society ensure that every citizen reaches a minimum level of each capability may be far less demanding than the requirement of equal capabilities. One way of setting the minimum appeals to the requirements for participation in a democratic society (Gutmann 1987; Anderson 1999).

Although sufficientarian approaches claim to make the demands of justice less oppressive, they have been criticized as demanding both too much and too little. They demand too much if the minimum for every capability must be met in the face of recalcitrant impairments or environments. They demand too little if attaining the minimum could still leave the individual with a miserable life (Arneson 2006; Wasserman 2006; Wolff and de-Shalit 2007). Those approaches have also been criticized for lacking a mechanism for prioritizing capabilities (Wolff and de-Shalit 2007) and for assessing whether the minimum has been reached for any one capability (Riddle 2010). Clearly, the extent to which justice is achievable on such approaches for people with severe disabilities will depend on where the minimum is set, how its satisfaction is assessed, and how the capabilities are defined.

A second approach would replace equality on a specific metric of advantage with social equality or equality of respect (Anderson 1999; Miller 1999; Norman 1997, 1999). This approach would involve a more radical departure from luck egalitarianism than a sufficiency account, since it does not lower the standard for a just distribution so much as propose a non-distributive standard for justice. That standard would see justice in terms of recognition rather than, or as well as, redistribution. Although this approach may demand strict equality of a sort, it is a sort that does not appear to set determinate distributive requirements. A society of social equals, abounding in mutual respect, can arguably tolerate significant disparities in welfare, resources, opportunities, or capabilities.

Underlying this approach is the more fundamental distinction between relational and distributive theories of justice. Although this distinction can be drawn in different ways (see, e.g., Lippert-Rasmussen 2015, Fourie et al. 2015), it identifies two critical dimensions of justice. One concerns how well-off individual people are, both absolutely and in comparison to each other. The other concerns the kinds of social relationships people stand in to one another. As discussed in §4.3, it is a difficult question to what extent either dimension of justice can be reduced to, or expressed in terms of, the other.

Against the claim that relational justice can be understood as an instance of distributive justice, one may observe that at least with respect to equality, there seems to be an important structural difference between two people standing in some relation to some third thing (i.e., some good) to the same degree and two people standing in some relation to one another to the same degree (e.g., the relation of being respected, recognized, and so on). Insofar as interpersonal equality has a different structure when construed as relational, it is a mistake to think that it can be reduced to a species of distributive equality, for “equal” means something different in each case. For example, it is one thing for any two people in society to have equal respect from others; it is a different thing for any two people in society to have equal respect for one another. This distinction is relevant to debates about disability in particular, because one way to understand the social model is in terms of the relational view—its core insight is that disability is not a one-place property of individuals, defined in terms of some welfare deficit, but an n-place relation between individuals (n>2) defined by stigmatizing or excluding attitudes, dispositions, practices, and forms of treatment.

Some of these issues have taken center-stage in a recent debate over the expressive significance of different measures to remediate the disadvantages associated with disability. Pogge (2002) and Anderson (1999) have claimed that it is disrespectful to attribute a person’s disadvantage to features of his or her natural endowment because it treats her as needy, deficient, or inferior. For this reason, they argue against justifying redistributive measures to achieve inclusion on the grounds that they correct natural inequalities in skills, talents, or the ability to convert resources into welfare. Instead, they contend that such measures can and should be justified as redressing discrimination, and conversely, that failures to achieve inclusion should be recognized as unjustly discriminatory.

Barclay (2010, 2018) challenges the argument that a claim for redistribution treats the claimant as deficient or inferior. Such claims need only recognize that some traits are less suited than others for specific environments—a contingency that does not imply the intrinsic superiority or inferiority of a given endowment. She thus questions those (e.g, Daniels 1985; Buchanan et al. 2000) who claim that certain characteristics or traits are universally valuable, such that an individual who lacked them would be deficient in any environment. Although she tends to see the environment as fixed rather than malleable, Barclay argues that the project of achieving inclusion is best seen in terms of maximizing individuals’ environmental fit. Achieving that fit may require expending more resources for some individuals than others in any given environment. The demands made by very tall or left-handed people for greater accommodation do not presuppose their inferiority, only their minority status (see §2, infra). These comparisons suggest that the demands for accommodation of people with such statistically atypical features differ merely in degree, not kind, from those made by people with various impairments.

Even if compensation for disadvantage need bit be demeaning, however, specific grounds for compensation may well be. Laws and policies that compensate people simply because they are disabled, or have a specific disability, may be objectionable because of the social meaning of disability-compensation. Compensation that is based on the medical classification of disability may reinforce the humanity-obscuring stereotype of “the cripple” as helpless and pitiable. This grave threat to social equality should make us wary of drawing distributive implications from the claim that disability is a “bad difference” rather than a “mere difference “(see entry, “Disability: Well-Being, Health, and Personal Relationships”). Even if disability in general, or specific disabilities, were bad differences, that would hardly imply that individuals who had (those) disabilities were entitled to compensation simply by virtue of that fact.

5. Justice, Disability Identities, and Epistemic Injustice

There are many categories or groups into which people can place themselves, and be placed, on the basis of their varying characteristics. The salience and appeal of these categories depend on social and historical context as well as individual preferences and values. Identity and identity politics become important as members of historically excluded groups challenge their status and work for inclusion. Many women gained a sense of group identity in opposing laws that limited voting and other political rights to men; racial identities have been forged in the fight against segregation. Although people with disabilities are not always understood as sharing an identity, their awareness of membership in an oppressed group has been shaped by exclusionary laws and customs, from “ugly laws” prohibiting people with physical deformities from appearing in public to the state-sponsored involuntary sterilization of “mental defectives”. A sense of group identity has been further encouraged by welfare, social security and other laws that place people with various disabilities in a single category, even if they define that category in different ways.

The importance of disability as a social category was increased by the movement to establish civil rights for people with disabilities. As in the case of other stigmatized groups, the characteristics used as a ground for exclusion became a basis for mobilization and a source of pride. The social model of disability, which informed the movement for disability rights, emphasized what people with various impairments have in common—their stigmatization and exclusion—and thereby promoted the emergence of disability as a powerful social identity.

Critics like Fraser argue that the importance of social identity cannot be adequately captured in any metric of individual advantage. An effective social response to stigmatized identities requires both recognition and transformation—changes in cultural framing and social perception that are poorly served by redistribution. An emphasis on redistribution is often self-defeating, exacerbating stigma and reinforcing the impression of the stigmatized group as deficient (Fraser 1995, 1997; see Olsen 2001). Yet as we will discuss, some ways of transforming social identity have significant dangers as well.

For proponents of recognition, one issue is whether justice requires not only respect for individual members of society, but also respect for their group or cultural identities. Must a just society recognize “group-specific cultural identity” or merely “the status of group members as full partners in social interaction” (Fraser 2001: 23, 24)? Are these separate requirements, or does respect for an individual entail respect for her social or cultural identities? These questions have been addressed primarily with respect to religious, ethnic, racial, and sexual minorities. Very little work has been done on the question of what a disability identity would look like and what sorts of recognition claims it would implicate.

A somewhat parallel issue has been raised in distributive justice—must society allocate resources, broadly construed, to support the group and cultural identities of its members? That support could be based on the claim that such identities are a constituent, perhaps an irreducible one, of the well-being of the individual members of society. This claim has been suggested by justice theorists who argue for the importance of culture as a “context of choice” for individuals (e.g., Kymlicka 1989, Sparrow 2005). An individual deprived of a culture through which he has experienced and interpreted the world will find it far more difficult to flourish. As we will discuss, however, it is doubtful that disability in general, or particular impairments, play such a comprehensive role in the lives of many—let alone all—people with disabilities.[8]

We begin by describing the different characteristics of an individual’s “identity”. One sense of this term is that of numerical identity over time: what makes some person at time t1 the same person as the person at time t2? (see SEP entry on identity over time). This is, in the first instance, a metaphysical question and not our interest here. A different sense of “identity” refers to those characteristics that make one the particular person one is, as judged both by oneself and by others. This includes narrative, biographical, and practical identities. It is less about criteria for sameness over time and more about the constitutive or defining features of one’s self- (or social) conception. This is the sense of “identity” we will be concerned with.

The sense of individual identity most directly relevant to respect and recognition is arguably that of practical identity. Following Korsgaard (1996, 2009), we can understand a practical identity to be a description under which a person values herself, where valuing oneself involves treating oneself as a source of reasons. For example, someone who identifies as a mother in this sense values herself under the description “mother” and for that reason treats the fact that she is a mother as a source of (normative practical) reasons. Moreover, to “drop” this identification is not like dropping a desire or short-term goal. It involves changing one’s sense of who one is as a person and what gives one’s life value.

On this view, a person’s practical identities should be normatively significant for other people as well. For one thing, many of a person’s significant interests are derived from her practical identities. Since it is uncontroversial that respect and concern require giving appropriate weight to the interests of others, it follows that respect and concern require giving appropriate weight to other people’s practical identities, at least insofar as they generate (legitimate) interests. In addition, respecting a person’s practical identities plausibly falls under a more general requirement of respect for personal autonomy. Personal autonomy is a foundational value of liberal democracies, whose laws and policies do not require individuals to organize their lives around any particular identity, but rather give them the latitude to make of their identities what they will (Appiah 2005; Appiah and Gutmann 1996; see also the SEP entry on identity politics). This can be seen as a part of liberalism’s broader commitment to neutrality about conceptions of the good (e.g., Rawls 1993).

These issues become especially charged if we move from individual to group identities, bringing us closer to the question of disability identities. As K. Anthony Appiah points out, though individual identity is different from group identity, it nevertheless has a collective or social dimension (Appiah 2005: 21). For example, Palestinians living in the West Bank have a distinct collective identity. This is different from, though certainly compatible with, some specific West Bank resident having as part of his individual identity being a Palestinian.[9] It is important to bear this distinction between individual and collective identities in mind, because the latter, to a greater extent than the former, is imposed or “ascribed” by the larger society rather than chosen by the individual.

Being disabled, like being a member of a minority race, subjects one to particular treatment. But one can experience that treatment without feeling compelled to regard one’s disability or minority status as part of one’s individual identity in the practical sense of being a description under which one values oneself. Often, having a disability identity ascribed to one, like having a racial identity ascribed, consists in part in being the object of, and provides an excuse for, discriminatory, demeaning or degrading treatment of various sorts. This is so both for people whose impairments are immediately observable and for those whose impairments are hidden but subject to exposure and ridicule by a temporary change in appearance, e.g., a person with epilepsy who has a seizure in public (Schneider and Conrad 1985; more generally, Davis 2005). And since this social identity is often part of one’s individual identity, such treatment is likely to be injurious to the self-respect of the one with this identity, and in that sense constitute an instance of misrecognition. Ironically, the fact of being unfairly stereotyped can itself shape the identities of those who are treated in this way, as Appiah notes, even if initially they did not identify strongly with the group in question.

Desirable change with respect to social identities is possible in at least two ways. First, even if some important aspects of one’s self are not chosen—say, the fact that one has paraplegia or deafness—how central they are to one’s self-conception, how much they matter to one’s interests and plans, is to some extent within one’s voluntary control. On some views, notably Korsgaard’s, reflective endorsement of an identity is a necessary condition of its being normative for the agent, i.e., providing reasons for her. At the same time, the extent to which one’s identifications are voluntary depends on the constraints of the social environment. One cannot simply decide to make one’s disability a less salient feature of one’s biographical identity, at least, especially if one’s disability is not “hidden”. If the identity is ascribed, and emphasized, by the larger society, it may be difficult to reduce its importance in one’s own practical reasoning. But one still has some choice about whether to accept or resist that emphasis.

Second, there can be a change in the valence of the label, as there has been with the term “queer”: what was once a negative label, accompanied by unjust treatment of various sorts, can be transformed into a positive label and championed as a source of self-respect and pride for those who share in the collective identity. John Lawson discusses how special education for disabled children, once seen as a major factor in the creation of a negative, second-class identity, can be transformed into “sites for the positive promotion of disability as a cultural identity” (Lawson 2001: 203–21). Neither sort of change—in identification or valence—can be accomplished without struggle, personal as well as political, but partial success is sometimes achievable.

Even if disability is not and does not have to be a central component of every disabled person’s identity, this does not negate the significance of disability as an organizing principle of political action. But when the social and political recognition of disability becomes the objective of political action, as it is in identity politics, it gives rise to the “dilemma of difference” (Minow 1990). Consider special education for children: On the one hand, labeling a child “disabled” risks stigmatizing and isolating the child. In this sense, to be “different” is to be inferior. Alternatively, being labeled “disabled” is a way for parents to secure attention to the child’s particular ways of learning and functioning. In this sense, to be “different” is to be entitled to appropriate educational assistance.

The dilemma may not be insurmountable. The movement for universal design in education aims to refashion classrooms and teaching practices to encourage the participation of all students. To the extent that the movement is successful, it will minimize the need for “special education” (Biklen 1992; Gartner and Lipsky 2002; Lipsky and Gartner 1996). Law and public policy must think creatively about ways to solve this dilemma so that the stigma they seek to eliminate is not in effect reinforced. Success in resolving the dilemma of difference may reduce the importance of disability identity for justice. If disability is simply a characteristic to be taken account of in social arrangements, it could become as significant or insignificant as height or aptitude.

There are at least two other risks for an identity politics of disability. One involves the danger of assuming that the members of a particular marginalized group all share the same culture, be it African-American culture or disability culture. This assumption is not required by a mature identity politics, but it may be encouraged by efforts to mobilize diverse individuals around a single identity. Two considerations may help to resist this tendency. First, we must recognize that culture is a complex concept, and that defining it is no easy task. Second, we must recognize that on any plausible definition, people with the same disability (let alone different disabilities) need not share a common culture. There are some examples of a shared disability culture: Deaf culture is perhaps the best known. But many people who are deaf, particularly those who do not sign, do not identify as Deaf or take part in Deaf culture (Tucker 1997[10] And even for those who participate, Deaf culture does not appear to be the kind of “encompassing” or “comprehensive” culture claimed by Kymlicka, Margalit, and Raz to provide a “context of choice” for its members.[11]

The second, related risk involves privileging one identity over others. This is especially important for people with multiple or “intersectional” identities. People who are African-American and disabled, or female and disabled, or disabled and LGBT may sometimes feel a conflict between those identities. In one study, for example, African-American women with mobility impairments reported that they felt estranged from the disability-rights movement, partly because its leadership seemed predominantly white, and partly because some of its principal goals—to maximize independence—went against their more communal values, which emphasized family and co-dependence (Feldman and Tegart 2003). More generally, although there has been comparatively little discussion of the intersection between disability and race within philosophical work on disability (though see Stubblefield 2009), more discussion can be found in disability studies more generally (e.g., Bell 2011). Also, some have noted that mainstream feminism’s focus on independence and self-sufficiency has tended to exclude women with disabilities, who are perceived as lacking in these cardinal virtues (Crawford and Ostrove 2003; Wendell 1996). At the same time, disabled women are often particularly vulnerable to the injustices that motivate the feminist movement: they are frequently victims of sexual exploitation (Crawford and Ostrove 2003), encounter many obstacles to leaving dissatisfying relationships because of physical, psychological and financial dependency (Olkin 2003), and have median incomes below the poverty line and substantially lower than those of their male counterparts (Crawford and Ostrove 2003; Olkin 1999).

In addition to these potential risks associated with emphasizing identity politics for persons with disabilities and other stigmatized minorities, there have been several major challenges in mobilizing people with disabilities around an affirmative group or cultural identity. The first, addressed by the disability rights movement, was getting people with disabilities to recognize that they have something in common with others who are differently impaired but also suffer stigma and exclusion because of their impairment. This has been difficult because people who are born with disabilities or acquire them in childhood come from widely dispersed socioeconomic, geographic and racial groups (Scotch 1988) and so are less likely to grow up with a sense of group identity. Another obstacle has been the overwhelmingly negative connotation of the label “disabled”. Indeed, the challenge for people with visual, motor, and psychiatric impairments has been to recognize that they share a “disabled” identity while denying that this makes them dependent, child-like, or powerless (Asch 1985; Scotch 1988); such a self-identity would quite literally disable one’s capacity for social participation and political action.

It is instructive to compare how the medical and social models would address these challenges. The medical model suggests a disability identity that is both fragmented and negative. Because the medical model defines disability in terms of particular physical or mental impairments, the primary commonalities it recognizes among disabled people are strictly functional; it views the blind person and the deaf person as having very different problems. Although it could recognize the fact that such biomedically distinct conditions had similar social consequences—stigmatization and exclusion—it would treat those similar consequences merely as secondary effects of the two conditions. Even within a single impairment, a medical model encourages distinctions based on etiology. For example, it would distinguish blindness due to Leber’s congenital amaurosis from blindness due to retinaopathy of prematurity, focusing on genetic testing for the former and treatment for the latter, and placing less emphasis on the shared challenges of living with blindness. Although this narrow focus may be appropriate for the purposes of clinical intervention, it obscures the recognition of disability as a social and political problem, except insofar as it raises perennial questions about how to distribute scarce health-care resources (Barnartt et al. 2001).

In contrast, the various social models were explicitly formulated to support a disability identity that could serve as the basis for claims of respect and recognition. The inclusion of people with a vast array of different impairments in United States and other national civil rights laws, and the creation of the United Nations convention on the rights of persons with disabilities, have helped to forge a shared disability identity. The emergence of disability studies as a recognized field of academic inquiry has also contributed. The minority group model promotes a trans-impairment identity by treating people with disabilities as a “discrete and insular minority” making claims on a generally stigmatizing able-bodied majority. Though the minority group model has proven extremely useful in passing anti-discrimination laws, it may do so at the expense of emphasizing the differences between people with disabilities and people without them, rather than highlighting the many ways in which identity need not be tied to the presence or absence of an impairment. The human variation model tempers this emphasis, and resists essentialism about disability identity, by treating the group itself as socially constructed. It sees the category of “the disabled” as resting on an artificial dichotomy imposed on a continuum of variation. The conceptualization of disability as just one source of difference, and as a difference in kind more than degree, can undercut a sense of disability as the basis for a unique and exclusive identity.

The more the redesign of the physical and social environment is guided by a thoroughgoing human-variation model, the less dominant disability identity and identity politics may become for people with disabilities. A society in which disabilities lack the social and practical significance they currently have may be one in which the equality of people with disabilities can be fully recognized without having to treat disability as a salient feature of their identities.

It may be, though, that the physical, sensory, or psychic experience of a particular impairment turns out to be central and salient to how those with the impairment live—even in a society deeply committed to inclusion, participation, and non-discrimination. Perhaps communicating primarily gesturally and not vocally, or moving through the world with wheels and not on legs, or focusing on detail rather than context, makes the lives of people who are deaf, or paralyzed, or autistic sufficiently distinctive that they feel a strong affinity and connection with others who have the same impairment (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience for a discussion of this claim.) Disability theorists who adopt different social model approaches might profitably consider how different views about group and individual identity apply to people with disabilities.

The connection between different models of disability and different ways of understanding disability identity points us in the direction of an important category of injustice, in addition to the distributive and relational conceptions already discussed. This is epistemic injustice (Fricker 2007; Barnes, 2016). Epistemic injustice consists in a person’s being wronged in her capacity as an epistemic subject. Testimonial injustice consists in someone’s being wronged in her capacity as a subject of knowledge, while hermeneutical injustice consists in someone’s being wronged in her capacity as a subject of understanding. More specifically, testimonial injustice consists in someone’s testimony being given less credence than the evidence warrants due to prejudice on the part of the hearer, while hermeneutical injustice consists in someone’s experiences being obscured from individual and collective understanding due to wrongful exclusion from the practices by which those understandings are generated. Both have clear implications for disability, justice, and identity.

For example, consider the use of quality-adjusted life years (QALYs) to assess the prospective benefits of health care interventions. The standard method of “quality adjustment” involves (i) assigning a value of 1 to each life-year one can reasonably expect to save through a given intervention, and (ii) discounting each life-year that would be lived by a person with a disability by some coefficient (between 0 and 1) which is thought to reflect the badness of living with the disability in question. These coefficients are typically arrived at by asking people how many years of life with the disability people would be willing to exchange for each year of life without the disability. For example, suppose survey data indicate that people would trade 8 years of life with blindness for 4 years of life with sight. The method of quality-adjustment would assign a QALY of 0.5 to each year of life lived with blindness. The upshot is that saving nondisabled life-years provides more “bang for your buck” in the QALY model, and as such is to be preferred to saving disabled life-years.

This implication has led some to criticize the method of quality-adjustment on the grounds that it produces a kind of “double jeopardy:” people with disabilities are disadvantaged twice-over, first by having the disability itself, second by having their health care needs discounted for that very reason (e.g., Singer et al. 1995; Bognar 2011; John et al. 2017). But there is another way of thinking about QALYs which takes issue with both quality-adjustment and an assumption behind the double-jeopardy criticism. When the “exchange rate” between disabled and non-disabled life-years is calculated, it is primarily or exclusively based the judgments of able-bodied people. This feature is criticizable on two distinct grounds. One is that it disrespects the first-person authority of people with disabilities, who know first-hand what it’s like to have the disability in question (and, if disabled as adults, know also what it’s like not to have the disability). This disrespect for first-person authority is plausibly an example of testimonial injustice, at least insofar as it reflects prejudicial or otherwise biased attitudes on the part of the able-bodied. A second, related criticism is that this approach exaggerates the difference in quality between able-bodied and disabled lives, relative to an approach that appropriately incorporated and weighed the perspectives of people with disabilities. Able-bodied people often overestimate how bad it would be to have a given disability, given popular stereotypes which depict life with disability as tragic, occlusive of life’s major goods, and so on. This is plausibly an example of hermeneutical injustice, insofar as the poor understanding of disabled people’s experiences and identities results from their exclusion from the public sphere. This is only one example; much work remains to be done exploring the implications of epistemic injustice for people with disabilities.

6. Conclusion

This entry began by pointing out a feature of disability that distinguishes it from other characteristics which have often been seen as grounding legitimate claims of justice, such as race, sex, sexual and gender identity, and religion. Simply put, achieving full inclusion for people with disabilities is expensive to a degree that achieving full inclusion for other minorities is not. Any plausible theory of inclusion implies the necessity of considerable accommodation and environmental reconstruction. And even if the costs of such measures have often been exaggerated, it is difficult to see how the appropriate degree of accommodation and reconstruction would not require diverting significant amounts of resources from other worthy goals, including some goals which are supported by countervailing considerations of justice. One implication of this feature of disability is that disability requires us to directly compare, and perhaps trade off, values of relational justice, which ground the demand for full inclusion as part of a society of equals, and values of distributive justice, which ground the demand for a fair distribution of scarce resources.

Having made this general point, the entry proceeded to discuss different models of disability, which differ principally in their understanding of the relationship between impairment and limitation. Whereas the medical model of disability tends to attribute most of the limitations associated with disability to functional aspects of the relevant impairments, the social model of disability emphasizes the mediating role of the social environment—broadly understood to include the configuration of physical space, the availability of various forms of accommodation, social practices and norms, etc.—in generating disability-related disadvantage. Among other things, the social model highlights the relational aspects of disability-related disadvantage, such as stigma, invisibility, and exclusion, whereas the medical model lends itself to a narrow distributive interpretation of the claims of justice generated by disability.

In subsequent sections, the entry focused on the role of disability in contractualist and other distributive theories of justice. Disability has often been regarded as a “limit case” for contractualist theories of justice, and more specifically for the idealizing assumptions these theories make about the capacities of those who choose and those who are governed by contractualist principles of justice. We also saw that disability has played a central role in discussions of outcome-oriented, distributive theories of justice, in particular luck egalitarianism. Internally, disability has played a central role in discussions about the “currency” of justice, since it has often been seen as a paradigm example of unchosen disadvantage. Externally, disability has played a central role in relational criticisms of luck egalitarian theories of justice. At best, these theories have been seen as failing to attribute normative significance to morally relevant differences between identical patterns of distribution which differ in the causal contribution of the social environment. At worst, these theories have been criticized for expressing disrespect towards people with disabilities in virtue of characterizing them as “mere” unfortunates or objects of pity. Although some of these criticisms may be overstated, they have been taken to heart by many theorists of distributive justice, especially proponents of the capabilities approach. Finally, the entry concluded by pointing to a topic which has received far less attention in discussions of disability and justice: namely, the normative significance of disability as a form of social identity, and the connections between disability and epistemic injustice.

This entry raises a number of questions which would benefit from further exploration. Clearly, one general question is how exactly to understand the distinction between distributive and relational values of justice. Another, related question is how to assess the comparative weight or importance of these values. And if, as many find plausible, some form of pluralism about justice is the correct answer, then we will need to work out how the relevant trade-offs, weights, and so on apply to the special case of disability, which simultaneously raises both distributive and relational concerns. A third question which calls for further research is the link between disability and epistemic injustice. We briefly discussed two examples of testimonial and hermeneutical injustice concerning people with disabilities, but there are—needless to say—many more. Indeed, disability may be an especially powerful example of epistemic injustice precisely because the phenomenological experiences of people with disabilities, especially those with sensory impairments, differ considerably from the experiences of the able-bodied majority, raising the hard question of how well we must understand others in order to treat them as justice requires.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


We want to thank the participants in the Workshop on Disability: Bioethics, Philosophy, and Public Policy (January 18–19, 2007) for enormous help in framing the issues discussed in this Entry. In addition, we have received invaluable editorial assistance from Dorit Barlevy, Ari Schick and William Chin.

Copyright © 2019 by
Daniel Putnam <dmp428@nyu.edu>
David Wasserman <dtwasserm@gmail.com>
Jeffrey Blustein <jblustein@ccny.cuny.edu>
Adrienne Asch

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