Elisabeth, Princess of Bohemia

First published Tue Aug 20, 2013; substantive revision Tue Aug 17, 2021

Elisabeth, Princess Palatine of Bohemia (1618–1680) is most well-known for her extended correspondence with René Descartes, and indeed these letters constitute what we currently know of her extant philosophical writings. In that correspondence, Elisabeth presses Descartes on the relation between the two really distinct substances of mind and body, and in particular the possibility of their causal interaction and the nature of their union. They also correspond on Descartes’s physics, on the passions and their regulation, on the nature of virtue and the greatest good, on the nature of human freedom of the will and its compatibility with divine causal determination, and on political philosophy. Descartes dedicated his Principles of Philosophy to Elisabeth, and wrote his Passions of the Soul at her request. While there is much to be learned about Descartes’s philosophical views by reading this exchange, this entry is not focused on its relevance for understanding Descartes, but rather to summarize Elisabeth’s own philosophical views. We are now also aware of additional correspondence with scientists of the period, as well as extensive family correspondence. Elisabeth seems to have been involved in negotiations around the Treaty of Westphalia and in efforts to restore the English monarchy after the English civil war. As Abbess of Herford (Germany) convent, she managed the rebuilding of that war-impacted community and also provided refuge to marginalized Protestant religious sects, including Labadists and Quakers.

1. Life

Elisabeth Simmern van Pallandt, born on 26 December 1618, was the third of thirteen children and eldest daughter of Frederick V, Elector Palatine, and Elizabeth Stuart, daughter of James I of England and sister of Charles I. She died on 8 February 1680, in Herford, Germany, where she was abbess of the convent there.

In 1620, Frederick V, having been installed as King of Bohemia, promptly lost his throne in events usually taken to have precipitated the Thirty Years War. In the 1620s, Elisabeth lived in Brandenburg with her grandmother and aunt until the children joined their parents, living in exile, in The Hague, where they were sheltered by Maurice of Nassau, Frederick’s maternal uncle. Akkerman (2021) reconstructs Elisabeth’s education at the Prinsenhof, in Leiden, largely from the memoirs of Elisabeth’s sister Sophie, which were transcribed by Leibniz. Although some of the details of Elisabeth’s education remain sketchy, it is clear that she and her siblings were tutored in languages, including Greek, Latin, French, English and German and perhaps others. We can infer that Elisabeth was taught logic, mathematics, politics, philosophy and the sciences, and it is reported that her intellectual accomplishments earned her the nickname ‘La Greque’ from her siblings. She also was schooled in painting, music and dancing, and might well have been tutored by Constantijn Huygens. Pal (2012) provides more detail of the intellectual environment of the court in The Hague.

While her correspondence with Descartes comprises the only substantive extant philosophical writings of Elisabeth of which we are currently aware, we do know of other correspondence: with John Pell, concerning Descartes’s Geometry; exchanges with Quakers, including Robert Barclay, George Keith, and William Penn; and letters written both by and to her concerning political and financial matters in the English Calendar of State Papers. There is also record of a brief exchange with Nicholas Malebranche. She is also known to have been connected to Francis Mercury van Helmont, who is reported to have been at her deathbed. Ebbersmeyer (2020) provides the first inventory of the extant correspondence of Elisabeth, which includes not only the correspondence of which we were already aware and letters to family, but also letters with intellectuals associated with her stay in Heidelberg, where her elder brother Charles Louis was rebuilding the University after the Thirty Years War, including correspondence in which she circulated Descartes’ mathematical letters to her. The correspondence with Descartes reveals her to have been involved with an appointment in mathematics to the University of Leiden, contemporary discussions of astronomy (Ebbersmeyer 2018), the dissemination of Cartesian natural philosophy in Germany (Shapiro 2019), as well as in negotiations on a number of matters, including the imprisonment of her brother Rupert in conjunction with his efforts around the English Civil War, negotiations of the marriage of her sister Henrietta, negotiations of the Treaty of Westphalia, and the finances of her family after the end of the Thirty Years War.

In 1660 Elisabeth entered the Lutheran convent at Herford, and in 1667 she became abbess of the convent. She seems to have been an effective manager of the convent lands, but also she welcomed more marginal religious sects, including the Labadists, at the request of Anna Maria van Schurman (see De Baar 2021 for a discussion of the extended friendship between Elisabeth and van Schurman), and Quakers, including Penn and Barclay.

It is worth mentioning the accomplishments of some of her siblings. As noted above, her older brother Charles Louis was responsible for restoring the University of Heidelberg after the Thirty Years War. Rupert, the brother born next after her, gained fame for his chemical experiments as well as for his military and entrepreneurial exploits, including the founding of the Hudson’s Bay Company. Louise Hollandine, a younger sister, was an accomplished painter and student of Gerritt van Honthorst. Sophie, her youngest sister, became the electress of Hanover and was renowned for her intellectual patronage, particularly that of Leibniz. Sophie’s daughter, Sophie-Charlotte, was tutored by Leibniz, and both women carried on substantive philosophical correspondence with Leibniz in which he clarified his philosophical views. See Strickland (2011).

2. Early Interest in the Passions

Elisabeth seems to have taken an early interest in the passions, as Edward Reynolds dedicated his Treatise on the passions and the faculties of the soule of man (1640) to her. While there is little information about its context, the dedication suggests that Elisabeth had seen a draft of the work, and so one can infer that they had some discussion or correspondence. Reynolds’s work, while one of the first self-standing treatments of the passions of the period, draws largely on Aristotelian-Scholastic discussions. It does, however, focus on the sensitivity of the passions to reason, and so our capacity to correct our errant passions through reflection.

3. Intellectual Networks

In addition to her well-known correspondence with Descartes, discussed in detail below, Elisabeth also had other extensive correspondence, now documented in Ebbersmeyer (2020). Through this correspondence scholars are beginning to gain a sense of her intellectual networks.

Elisabeth corresponded with a number of prominent Quakers, including Robert Barclay and William Penn, who visited her at the convent in Herford. Though both Barclay and Penn attempt to gain Elisabeth as a convert, she does not seem interested in engaging them philosophically or theologically. Insofar as the Scottish Quakers played a strategic role in the efforts to restore the throne, one can wonder whether her engagement with them was simply political. On the other hand, Elisabeth’s long-standing interest in emerging alternative theories, along with her interest in divine providence, makes it just as plausible that she took a more intellectual interest in their world view.

Hutton (2021) explores Elisabeth’s connections to the Quakers in more detail, through her correspondence with Robert Barclay and George Keith, and aims to ascertain whether Elisabeth and Anne Conway knew one another through those connections, as well as her connections with Henry More, the Hartlib Circle, and Francis Mercury van Helmont, De Baar (2021) considers Elisabeth’s interest in religion more generally through her correspondence with Anna Maria van Schurman.

Pal (2021) focuses on Elisabeth’s family correspondence, as well as her exchanges with Descartes and others, to argue that the overarching concern of Elisabeth’s intellectual interests was the question of how best to rule.

Ebbersmeyer (2021), drawing on correspondence and on dedications of books, demonstrates Elisabeth’s awareness of and potential involvement in a number of areas of natural philosophy, including mathematics, medicine, microscopy, astronomy, and physics. Ebbersmeyer goes on to explore the details of Elisabeth’s interest in astronomy through her exchanges with Constantijn Huygens and Andreas Colvius, and to show that Elisabeth was involved in debates about the discovery of the moons of Jupiter, emerging maps of the moon of Earth, and the invention of new telescopes.

4. Correspondence with René Descartes

Elisabeth’s correspondence with Descartes begins at her initiative in 1643 and continues until Descartes’s death in early 1650. Elisabeth does not seem to have produced any systematic philosophical work, and her extant philosophical writings consist almost entirely of her correspondence with Descartes. While we have Descartes’s works, and centuries of interpretation to contextualize his side of the exchange, we do not have this larger picture in which to situate Elisabeth’s thoughts. Thus, any account of her proper philosophical position must be gleaned through interpretation. It is evident from the correspondence that Elisabeth has a remarkable and wide-ranging critical philosophical acumen. Careful reading of her side of the correspondence does suggest she has some positive philosophical commitments of her own, on matters including the nature of causation, the nature of the mind, explanations of natural phenomena, virtue, and good governance.

4.1 Provenance

While many of Descartes’s letters to Elisabeth were published in the volumes of his correspondence edited by Clerselier after his death, Elisabeth refused Pierre Chanut’s request to publish her side of the exchange. Elisabeth’s side of the correspondence was first published in a volume by A. Foucher de Careil, after he was alerted to its existence by an antiquarian bookseller, Frederick Müller, who had found a packet of letters in Rosendael, outside Arnhem. These same letters are what appear in the Oeuvres of Descartes, edited by Charles Adam and Paul Tannery. The letters from Rosendael are not originals, but rather copies that date from the early 18th century. While we do not know the provenance of the copies, the consistency of their content with that of Descartes’s letters, along with allusions to events in Elisabeth’s family and private life, argues strongly in favor of the authenticity of the copies.

4.2 Mind-Body Interaction and the Nature of Mind

The correspondence between Elisabeth and Descartes begins with Elisabeth’s asking probing questions about how Descartes can explain the ability of an immaterial substance to act on a material substance. At issue in this initial query is the kind of causation operating between mind and body. As Elisabeth frames the issues, existing accounts tie causal efficacy to extension, and in this regard it is significant that she poses her question about the mind’s ability to act on the body, and not the body’s ability to affect the mind. To account for the causal efficacy of an immaterial mind, Elisabeth suggests that Descartes can articulate either the account of causation proper to mind-body interaction or the substantial nature of the mind such that existing accounts could explain its actions. Descartes’s response is not only evasive but opens up further issues, in particular about whether the mind-body union is a third substance, insofar as he appeals to the Scholastic notion of heaviness to address Elisabeth’s concerns (Garber 1983), and intimates there is a contradiction in thinking of mind and body as both two distinct substances and as united (Mattern 1978). In addition, in his responses, Descartes jumps between the two separate issues of mind-body and body-mind interaction (Rozemond 1999). My concern in this entry is not, however, to articulate the views expressed in Descartes’s side of the correspondence.

This exchange reveals that Elisabeth is committed to a mechanist account of causation—that is, one limited to efficient causation. Elisabeth rejects Descartes’s appeal to the Scholastic conception of heaviness as a model through which to explain mind-body interaction, on the grounds that, as Descartes himself previously argued, it is unintelligible and inconsistent with a mechanist conception of nature. That is, she squarely rejects the formal causal explanatory model underlying the Scholastic notion of a real quality, insofar as she refuses to consider that model appropriate in some contexts. She is nonetheless open-minded about which account of efficient causation ought to be adopted. This openness reveals that she is apprised of debates about the nature of causation in the period (Gabbey 1990, Clatterbaugh 1999, Nadler 1993). Elisabeth’s investment in the new science emerging in the seventeenth century is reflected in what she writes regarding mathematics and natural philosophy, discussed briefly in the next subsection.

Elisabeth’s remarks to Descartes also suggest that she is willing to revisit Descartes’s substance dualism. She presses Descartes to further articulate his account of substance, pointing not only to the problem of mind-body interaction, but also to cases where the poor condition of the body—the vapours, for instance—affects capacity for thought. These cases, she intimates, would be more straightforwardly explained by considering the mind to be material and extended. The issue of the role of the condition of the body in our capacity for thought also figures in the correspondence of 1645, concerning the regulation of the passions, from both a theoretical and a personal perspective. Elisabeth maintains that we have autonomy of thought—that we have control over what we think and can turn our attention from one object to another— and so that the order of thought does not depend on the causal order of material things. However, at the same time she acknowledges that the capacity for thought, and the free will essential to it, is dependent on the overall condition of the body. Elisabeth thus rejects an account of mind that reduces thinking to bodily states, but at the same time she calls into question the idea that the capacity of thinking exists wholly independently of body, that is, that a thinking thing is substance properly speaking. As Alanen (2021) puts it, what is at issue in this exchange is how to understand the agency proper to thought. Shapiro (1999 and 2007) suggests that while Elisabeth might be willing to revisit substance dualism, she does not advocate clearly for any alternative. Janssen-Lauret (2018) maintains that in the end Elisabeth endorses substance dualism and argues that Elisabeth subscribes to a naturalistic dualism, which holds that the soul is both conscious and extended without endorsing materialism.

Interestingly, Elisabeth introduces her own nature as female as one bodily ‘condition’ that can impact reason. While Descartes concedes that a certain threshold of bodily health is necessary for the freedom that characterizes rational thought, he disregards Elisabeth’s appeal to the “weakness of my sex” (Shapiro 1999). Pellegrin (2021), in analyzing how the female body figures in the correspondence between Descartes and Elisabeth, argues that the very idea of a weak sex is antithetical to Cartesianism.

4.3 Mathematics and Natural Philosophy

In letters of November 1643, shortly after the initial exchange concerning the union of mind and body, Descartes sets Elisabeth the classic geometrical problem of the three circles or Apollonius’s problem: to find a circle that touches each of three given circles on a plane. While Elisabeth’s solution is no longer available, Descartes’s comments indicate that Elisabeth had already mastered techniques of algebraic geometry. She is thought to have learned them from Johan Stampioen’s textbook. Elisabeth’s approach to the problem seems to have differed from Descartes’s own, and Descartes remarks on her solution having a symmetry and transparency in virtue of its using only a single variable that his lacked. Elisabeth’s recognized mathematical acumen is also evidenced by her involvement in the hiring of Frans van Schooten to the mathematical faculty at Leiden and John Pell’s effort to enlist her help in understanding Descartes’s Geometry.

In 1644, Descartes dedicated his Principles of Philosophy to Elisabeth. In that work, Descartes not only presents his metaphysics in textbook form, he also lays out his physics in some detail. Elisabeth responds to the dedication with gratitude, but also by offering criticisms of Descartes’s accounts of magnetic attraction and the heaviness of mercury.

Also in the correspondence, Elisabeth shows herself to have a keen interest in the workings of the physical world and in efficient causal explanations of natural phenomena: she criticizes Kenelm Digby’s reading of Descartes; she requests the works of Hogelande and Regius; she reports on various observed phenomena, and in particular on diseases and cures, while looking for acceptable efficient causal explanations of them. This commitment efficient causal explanations leads her to try to disseminate Cartesian physics in Germany.

Ebbersmeyer (2021), as noted above, demonstrates how Elisabeth’s interest in natural philosophy was not limited to her correspondence with Descartes, and moreover, continued after Descartes’s death.

Shapiro (2019) argues that with respect to natural philosophy, Elisabeth ought to be understood as a Cartesian. Kambouchner (2021) argues that consideration of Elisabeth’s views on practical and civil life shows that in this respect Elisabeth is not a Cartesian, though he also suggests that Descartes himself may not be a dogmatic Cartesian either.

4.4 The Passions and Moral Philosophy

In his letters to Elisabeth of 1645 and 1646, Descartes develops his moral philosophy, and in particular, his account of virtue as being resolved to do that which we judge to be the best. His letters begin as an effort to address a persistent illness of Elisabeth, which Descartes diagnoses as the manifestation of a sadness, no doubt due to the events of the English Civil War. As Elisabeth herself puts it, he “has the kindness to want to cure [her] body with [her] soul” (AT 4:208, 24 May 1645). While they begin by reading Seneca’s De Vita Beata, they both agree that the work is not sufficiently systematic, and discussion turns to Descartes’s own views. Once again, Elisabeth, in her letters, plays a principally critical role.

Her criticisms of Descartes intertwine three distinct philosophical positions. First, she takes up the position of Aristotelian virtue ethics, in objecting that Descartes’s very liberal account of virtue, which requires only the intention to do good, does not require that one’s good intentions are realized in actions that are actually good. That is, she notes that Descartes makes virtue impervious to fortune or moral luck. She, however, goes beyond the canonical Aristotelian position to maintain that even our ability to reason is subject to luck. (This position helps to illuminate her view on the nature of the human mind. See the discussion in section 3.2 above.) Elisabeth also takes up a classically Stoic position, insofar as she objects to the way in which Descartes’s account of virtue separates virtue from contentment. She objects that Descartes’s account of virtue allows for the virtuous agent to make mistakes, and she does not see how an agent can avoid regret in the face of those mistakes. Insofar we regret when even our best intentions go awry, we can be virtuous and fail to be content. While it is unclear whether her objection is a psychological one or a normative one, she does maintain that achieving contentment requires an ‘infinite science’ (4:289) so that we might know all of the impact of our actions, and so properly evaluate them. Without a faculty of reason that is already perfected, on her view, not only will we not be able to achieve virtue, we also will not rest content. (See Shapiro 2012 for an interpretation of these remarks. Perler (2021) situates this discussion within a contemporary framework of internalism and externalism and argues that Elisabeth replaces Descartes’ internalist conception of happiness with a more complex conception that takes both internal and external factors into account.) On her view, not only the right use of our rational faculties but also the right conditions for using them are required for obtaining happiness.

In the context of this exchange, in the same letter of 13 September 1645, Elisabeth asks Descartes to “define the passions, in order to know them better” (AT 4: 289). It is this request that leads Descartes to draft a treatise on the passions, on which Elisabeth comments in her letter of 25 April 1646, and which is ultimately published in 1649 as The Passions of the Soul. Elisabeth’s concerns about our ability to properly evaluate our actions lead her to express a further concern, this time about the possibility of measuring value objectively, given that we each have personal biases, whether by temperament or by matters of self-interest. Without a proper measure of value, she implies, Descartes’s account of virtue cannot even get off the ground, for it is not clear what should constitute our best judgement of what is the best course of action. Behind Elisabeth’s objection here is a view of ethics akin to that of Hobbes and other contractarians, which takes the good to be a matter of balancing of competing self-interests.

In his letter of 15 September 1645 Descartes aims to answer some of her concerns by outlining a set of metaphysical truths knowledge of which will suffice in guiding our practical judgements, including that all things depend on God (who exists), the nature of the human mind and its immortality, and the vast extent of the universe (15 September 1645; AT 4:292). Elisabeth responds by asserting that these considerations just open more problems—of explaining human free will, of how understanding the immortality of the soul can make us seek death, and of distinguishing particular providence from the idea of God—without providing any guidance for evaluating things properly. (See Schmaltz 2019 and Reuter 2021 for interpretations of Elisabeth’s view on free will and divine providence.)

4.5 Political Philosophy

Elisabeth’s interest in properly evaluating actions and their outcomes is clearly related to her position as an exiled Princess, one with hopes that her family will regain some of their political power. She is particularly concerned with the problems that rulers face making decisions that stand to impact a large group of people with incomplete information. To this end, she asks Descartes to present the central maxims “concerning civil life” (AT 4:406, 25 April 1646), and for his thoughts on Machiavelli’s The Prince. Descartes politely refuses the former, but offers his thoughts on the latter in his letter of September 1646. Elisabeth offers her own reading in her letter of 10 October 1646. In her view Machiavelli’s focus on a state that is the most difficult to govern does provide useful guidance for achieving stability, but affords little for how to proceed in governing a stable state. Paganani (2021) situates this exchange within the broader 17th century context, both the political realities and the political philosophy, and in particular, Hobbes. He argues that Elisabeth took Machiavelli’s realism as a starting point, to begin to work through her own solution to how to resolve the conflicts arising from competing evaluations of self-interested agents, each moved by their own desires and passions, and ensure mutual security, peace, and insofar as possible individual well-being. Elisabeth rejects Descartes’appeal to divine guarantee, and, perhaps rooted in her own actual practice and public role, favours a pragmatic and operational approach to navigating charged political realities. He argues that she puts forward a distinctive position on the politics of moral action, and in particular on the problem of how natural law applies in a wicked world.

Shapiro (2021) explores a remark Elisabeth makes in her letter to Descartes of 4 December 1649 on the apparent incompatibility of governing and philosophizing (AT 5:452), and argues that Elisabeth recognizes that rulers, and not simply their subjects, inevitably have their own passions, which must be regulated according to the demands of their office. These practical demands, and in particular the time constraints of their decision-making, can leave a ruler with a very different affective profile from that of the philosopher.

Given the suggestion of Pal (2021) that Elisabeth’s own interests centred on how to govern well, this part of her correspondence gains significance. It is reasonable to assume that further consideration on these issues informed her management of the convent at Herford, and perhaps led her to find a way both to govern and to pursue her intellectual interests at the same time.


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