Notes to Epistemic Self-Doubt

1. As a conditional probability SR would also underwrite by conditionalization the mere having of a belief as a reason to continue to have that belief, a view called epistemic conservatism, which some have found objectionable. See Sklar 1975, Foley 1982, Adler 1990, and Christensen 1994 for discussion.

2. Probabilistic coherence is logically equivalent to potential calibration in the technical sense contained in the Brier score (van Fraassen 1983). A sequential forecaster must not revise on the basis of a finite track record that suggests miscalibration, no matter how strongly that frequency suggests it, on pain of incoherence (Dawid 1982). The higher-order probability approach below avoids this consequence by representing the judgments about the track record explicitly at the second order with a different function for reliability.

3. We can’t assume that one’s expected reliability is the same whatever one’s confidence is greater in q or not-q, and so, whatever one’s guess. Those reliabilities are mathematically independent and human beings’ calibration curves (discussed below) tend to vary systematically with level of confidence and proposition, a feature that does not by itself make a subject incoherent.

4. The calibration curve is distinct from the calibration score, which is the calibration-related idea most often discussed in philosophy and which has been criticized and largely dismissed, on grounds laid out in Seidenfeld 1985. The calibration score is a root mean squares measure of how far a person’s calibration curve is from the \(x = y\) line. A single score has a one-many relationship with an infinite number of calibration curves, so a lower calibration score does not uniquely determine how a reduction in the score has been achieved. Consequently one may improve one’s calibration score simply by making less informative claims, e.g., having every day the same confidence in rain, a confidence that matches the annual frequency of rain. The use of the calibration curve here is very different. Due to the fact that the subject will be conditionalizing on it, what the person should do with her confidence is uniquely determined, and the improvement is not judged by its effect on her overall calibration score.

5. What sort of mistake might have been made is relevant to the estimation of the calibration curve for a particular person and proposition and occasion, since the reliability of one’s answer will also vary with method. But the particulars of why you are uncalibrated do not make a difference to how you correct for it or with what justification.

6. Though not noted by authors who have endorsed it, it is evident that USR needs admissibility conditions to rule out obvious counterexamples such as taking r to be q itself. Since the calibration approach being discussed does not depend on USR this can be ignored in this context.

7. \(P(q)=x\) and \(\PR(q\mid P(q)=x)=y\) do not by themselves imply \(\PR(q)=y\). To discharge that conditional probability requires that \(\PR(P(q)=x)\) is high, so one must ask under what conditions the credence being x makes the objective probability high that the credence is x. Under what conditions does A imply that A is objectively probable? This is an interesting question but it can be avoided in the derivation by appealing to a variation on the Principal Principle (Vranas 2004),

Conditional Principle (CP)
\(P(q\mid B \amp Ch(q\mid B)=y) = y \)

to which no one has objected. The generalization of the Conditional Principle from chance to any objective type of probability is:

General Conditional Principle (GCP}
\(P(q\mid B \amp \PR(q\mid B)=y) = y \)

This says that the credence in q given that B is true and that the objective probability of q given that B is true is y, is y. Here too there are questions of admissibility, but as with PP it’s easy to expect that there exists a useful domain in which CP and GCP are true.

Cal below is an instance of GCP:

\(P(q\mid (P(q)=x \amp \PR(q\mid P(q)=x)=y)) = y \)

8. This formulation of PP suppresses a conjunct r of the kind that USR above has, meaning that it also requires admissibility conditions to identify the domain in which it is true. Those would be carried over in the use of PP in what follows here.

Copyright © 2017 by
Sherrilyn Roush <>

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