Notes to Naturalism in Epistemology

1. As Elisabeth Pacherie puts it: “one should not take the label ‘naturalistic epistemology’ to be referring to a single, well-defined, doctrine. Rather, this label functions as an umbrella term covering a set of approaches that question in more or less radical ways the tenets of classical epistemology and insist on the relevance of empirical research to epistemological investigations” (2002: 299).

2. In his in-depth account of the history of naturalism, including in epistemology, Kitcher (1992) identifies the (re)introduction of psychology into epistemology and a suspicion of the a priori as the central features of NE.

3. What follows incorporates the typologies suggested by Goldman (1994) and Feldman (2012). Other helpful typologies, largely convergent with or complementary to the present one, are offered in Maffie (1990a) and Kappel (2011), both of which contain very helpful general discussion of NE.

4. An apparent exception is Pollock (1987, 1986; Pollock & Cruz 1999). Pollock, and Pollock and Cruz, characterize their view as a “naturalistic internalism”. However, they are using an unorthodox notion of “the internal”. Pollock at one point says:

I propose to define internal states to be those states that are directly accessible to the mechanisms in our central nervous system that direct our reasoning. (1987: 70; italics added)

This is a significant departure from the sort of first-personal accessibility that more familiar internalists insist upon. Still, it seems correct to say, with Kappel, that

nothing in descriptive naturalism per se [in present terms, substantive NE] forces one to be an externalist about knowledge or justification. (2011: 838)

5. For discussion of the internalism/externalism divide, including alternative formulations, see, e.g., Pappas (2014) and Ichikawa & Steup (2014).

6. In North America too, naturalism was evident in the work of the pragmatists (Hookway 2015), though not always in psychologistic form. The emphasis on the primacy of practice in philosophy, a suspicion of the distinction between facts and values (Putnam 1994a: 152), and “the insistence that what has weight in our lives should also have weight in philosophy” (Putnam 1994b: 517), are all themes within NE. For discussion of some of the early 20th Century American sources of naturalism, see Kim (2003).

7. One recent discussion that in places strongly echoes Quine (1969) is Patricia Churchland’s (1987). She writes, for example, that “the fundamental epistemological question can be reformulated thus: How does the brain work?” (1987: 546). However, Churchland immediately adds that there remains “the normative dimension of epistemology”—which, in her terms, compares, evaluates, and suggests improvements in computational and representational styles (1987: 546). Hers is a more moderate form of NE, then, “which draws upon what is available in psychology and neuroscience to inform our research” (1987: 546, italics added).

8. Kim (1988: 391) suggests in addition that it is a mistake to assume, as he reads Quine as doing, that there is no normativity in the sciences. He argues too that belief attribution involves a presumption of others’ basic rationality—which means, he thinks, that even to talk of beliefs is to engage in the normative. In a similar spirit, Putnam (1982) argues that truth cannot be understood apart from rationality, so that an eliminativism about the latter, such as Quine is taken to endorse, means that we cannot even make sense of the former.

9. Kornblith also points out, more generally, that “there are ways of interpreting Quine that have him offering obviously dreadful arguments” (1995: 240). For sympathetic discussions that go beyond the brief presentation of Quine’s arguments given above, see, e.g., Foley (1994), Johnsen (2005), and Gregory (2006).

10. As Armstrong (1973: 159) notes, Frank Ramsey had anticipated both causal and reliable process views:

I have always said that a belief was knowledge if it was (i) true, (ii) certain, (iii) obtained by a reliable process. But the word “process” is very unsatisfactory; we can call inference a process, but even then unreliable seems to refer only to a fallacious method not to a false premiss as it is supposed to do. Can we say that a memory is obtained by a reliable process? I think perhaps we can if we mean the causal process connecting what happens with my remembering it. We might then say, a belief obtained by a reliable process must be caused by what are not beliefs in a way or with accompaniments that can be more or less relied on to give true beliefs, and if in this train of causation occur other intermediary beliefs these must all be true ones. (Ramsey 1931: 258)

11. There are of course different types of reduction, something that we are here neglecting. See Maffie (1990a) for the epistemological case(s); for general discussion, see van Riel and van Gulick (2014). For comprehensive discussion of supervenience, see McLaughlin and Bennett (2014).

12. Perhaps, as Sosa suggests (2003: 28–29), Descartes notion of (sufficient) clarity and distinctness is similarly inexplicable in non-epistemic terms. Fumerton suggests that

the notion of a fact being before consciousness is… an epistemic concept, and…that one of the fundamental sui generis concepts that defy further analysis or reduction is the concept of direct acquaintance with a fact that in part[...] defines the concept of noninferential knowledge. (1988: 455; compare Pust 2014: Section 1.3)

13. As both Sosa (2003) and Van Cleve (1999) point out in responding to Lehrer (1997), treating reasonableness (e.g.) as primitive does not by itself commit him to rejecting supervenience (contrary, perhaps, to what Goldman’s discussion suggests—1994: 303, including note 7). Both Sosa (2003: 23) and Van Cleve (1999: 1053) cite the example of Moore, who held that goodness was primitive while insisting that it supervened on natural properties. For general discussion of epistemic supervenience, including the matters addressed in this note, see Turri (2010).

14. He says that he speaks thus in order to “emphasize [his] dissociation of the Cartesian dream” (Quine 1992: 19).

15. Quine follows the logical empiricists in holding that the only plausible candidates for a priori knowledge or justification are analytic truths. For discussion of this, and of Quine’s reasons for rejecting the analytic-synthetic distinction, see Gregory (2006) and Kelly (2014).

16. In the same vein, Foley has argued that, in spite of his rejection of the a priori, for Quine some matters will be so central to our “web of belief” that, in spite of their de facto revisability and their being known only a posteriori, they will function as “a kind of Quinean counterpart” to the necessary truths, knowable a priori, of TE (Foley 1994: 256). More generally, Foley contends that, in terms of actual practice, there is no real difference between Quine’s naturalized epistemologist and a practitioner of TE (see esp. pp. 258–259). Compare Johnsen:

Despite its reputation, [Quine’s “Epistemology Naturalized”] contains little that is new; it is largely a sustained argument for the idea that much if not all of what goes on under the name of epistemology can be seen to be part of the scientific enterprise broadly—and rightly—conceived. (2005: 91)

17. Siegel (1990) is reacting in particular to Laudan’s (1987, e.g.) “normative naturalism”, which portrays normative rules of epistemology and science as hypothetical imperatives. While it is the instrumentalist view of norms on which Siegel focuses, it is worth noting that while both Quine and Kornblith take truth (/truth or prediction) to be the epistemic goal, Laudan holds that “the aims of science in particular and of inquiry in general have exhibited certain significant shifts through time” (1990: 48).

18. For discussion and qualified defense of Kornblith’s account of epistemic normativity, see Rysiew (2017).

19. Compare Foley (1994: 250), commenting on a particular passage from Quine:

It sounds as if Quine is going to tell us about the relation of evidential support, and he is going to do so from his armchair, without relying on the findings of science. In other words, it sounds as if he is going to be doing epistemology in an a priori manner. He would no doubt insist that it is not really a priori. On his view, even armchair theorizing draws upon a large background of empirical information. So, it is not truly a priori even if it is not truly neurology, psychology, psycholinguistics, genetics, or history either. But it is the Quinean counterpart of a priori theorizing.

Cf. too Sosa, who is not usually thought of as a leading standard-bearer for NE:

It is often claimed that the recourse of analytic philosophy to intuitions in the armchair is in the service of “conceptual analysis”. But I find this deplorably misleading, for the use of intuitions in analytic philosophy, and in philosophy more generally, should not be tied to conceptual analysis….The objective questions involved are about rightness, or justice, or epistemic justification. (2007: 59)

20. Janet Levin (2013) has also recently argued to similar effect; and, like Goldman, she thinks that traditional armchair methodology is compatible with NE.

21. Goldman (2005), like some others (e.g., Talbott 2005, Williams 1996), is also sceptical about the idea that knowledge is a natural kind.

22. Crumley refers to Goldman’s brand of NE as “modest naturalism”, which embodies a commitment to both supervenience (versus reduction) and a role for conceptual analysis in epistemological theorizing (2009: 203).

23. Like Quine and Kornblith, Maffie (1990a) denies that the a priori has a legitimate place within NE.

24. In more recent work, Goldman is less emphatic in choosing personal concepts as the target of philosophical investigation. He offers several alternatives and doesn’t decisively choose personal concepts as the “correct” target. See Goldman (2010).

25. For an overview of x-phi and intuitions, see Pust (2014: Section 4) and Russell (2014: Sections 8.1–8.2). On epistemic intuitions in particular, see Nagel (2007). For a representative sampling of current issues and positions concerning x-phi, see, e.g., Haug (2013) and Machery and O’Neill (2014).

26. On the distinction between the positive and negative programs within x-phi, see Alexander et al. (2010), for example.

27. Cf. Kappel (2011: 846): “…why pay so much attention to our actual considered set of epistemic judgments, or our actual epistemic concepts? Why not turn directly to the problem of devising better ways of reasoning and conducting inquiry?”

28. See Rysiew (2008), which surveys the rationality debate and its relation to epistemological theorizing; Rysiew (2012) provides an annotated bibliography of many of the relevant major works.

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Patrick Rysiew <>

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