# The Ergodic Hierarchy

*First published Wed Apr 13, 2011; substantive revision Thu Jul 16, 2020*

The Ergodic Hierarchy (EH) is a central part of ergodic theory. It is a hierarchy of properties that dynamical systems can possess. Its five levels are ergodicity, weak mixing, strong mixing, Kolmogorov, and Bernoulli. Although EH is a mathematical theory, its concepts have been widely used in the foundations of statistical physics, accounts of randomness, and discussions about the nature of chaos, as well as in other sciences such economics. We introduce EH and discuss its applications.

- 1. Dynamical Systems
- 2. Ergodicity
- 3. The Ergodic Hierarchy
- 4. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Statistical Mechanics
- 5. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Randomness
- 6. The ‘No-Application’ Charge
- 7. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Chaos
- 8. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Dynamical Systems

The object of study in ergodic theory is a dynamical system. We first introduce some basic concepts with a simple example, from which we abstract the general definition of a dynamical system. For a brief history of the modern notion of a dynamical system and the associated concepts of EH see the Appendix, Section A.

A lead ball is hanging from the ceiling on a spring. We then pull it
down a bit and let it go. The ball begins to oscillate. The mechanical
state of the ball is completely determined by a specification of the
position \(x\) and the momentum \(p\) of its center of mass; that is,
if we know \(x\) and \(p\), then we know all that there is to know
about the mechanical state of the ball. If we now conjoin \(x\) and
\(p\) in one vector space we obtain the so-called *phase space*
\(X\) of the system (sometimes also referred to as ‘state
space’).^{[1]}
This is illustrated in Figure 1 for a two-dimensional phase space of
the state of a ball moving up and down (i.e., the phase space has one
dimension for the ball’s position and one for its momentum).

Figure 1: The motion of a ball on a spring.

Each point of \(X\) represents a state of the ball (because it gives
the ball’s position and momentum). Accordingly, the time
evolution of the ball’s state is represented by a line in \(X\),
a so-called *phase space trajectory* (from now on
‘trajectory’), showing where in phase space the system was
at each instant of time. For instance, let us assume that at time \(t
= 0\) the ball is located at point \(x_1\) and then moves to \(x_2\)
where it arrives at time \(t = 5\). This motion is represented in
\(X\) by the line segment connecting points \(\gamma_1\) and
\(\gamma_2\). In other words, the motion of the ball is represented in
\(X\) by the motion of a point representing the ball’s
(instantaneous) state, and all the states that the ball is in over the
course of a certain period of time jointly form a trajectory. The
motion of this point has a name: it is the *phase flow*
\(\phi_t\). The phase flow tells us where the ball is at some later
time \(t\) if we specify where it is at \(t = 0\); or, metaphorically
speaking, \(\phi_t\) drags the ball’s state around in \(X\) so
that the movement of the state represents the motion of the real ball.
In other words, \(\phi_t\) is a mathematical representation of the
system’s time evolution. The state of the ball at time \(t = 0\)
is commonly referred to as the *initial condition*. \(\phi_t\)
then tells us, for every point in phase space, how this point evolves
if it is chosen as an initial condition. In our concrete example, point
\(\gamma_1\) is the initial condition and we have \(\gamma_2 =
\phi_{t=5}(\gamma_1)\). More generally, let us call the ball’s
initial condition \(\gamma_0\) and let \(\gamma(t)\) be its state at
some later time \(t\). Then we have \(\gamma(t) = \phi_t (\gamma_0)\).
This is illustrated in figure 2a.

Figure 2: Evolution in Phase space.

Since \(\phi_t\) tells us for every point in \(X\) how it evolves in
time, it also tells us how sets of points move around. For instance,
choose an arbitrary set \(A\) in \(X\); then \(\phi_t (A)\) is the
*image of A* after \(t\) time units under the dynamics of the
system. This is illustrated in Figure 2b. Considering sets of points
rather than single points is important when we think about physical
applications of this mathematical formalism. We can never determine
the exact initial condition of a ball bouncing on a spring. No matter
how precisely we measure \(\gamma_0\), there will always be some
measurement error. So what we really want to know in practical
applications is not how a precise mathematical point evolves, but
rather how a set of points around the initial condition \(\gamma_0\)
evolves. In our example with the ball the evolution is
‘tame’, in that the set keeps its original shape. As we
will see below, this is not always the case.

An important feature of \(X\) is that it is endowed with a so-called
*measure* \(\mu\). We are familiar with measures in many
contexts: from a mathematical point of view, the length that we
attribute to a part of a line, the surface we attribute to a part of a
plane, and the volume we attribute to a segment of space are measures.
A measure is simply a device to attribute a ‘size’ to a
part of a space. Although \(X\) is an abstract mathematical space, the
leading idea of a measure remains the same: it is a tool to quantify
the size of a set. So we say that the set \(A\) has measure \(\mu(A)\)
in much the same way as we say that a certain collection of points of
ordinary space (for instance the ones that lie on the inside of a
bottle) have a certain volume (for instance one litre).

From a more formal point of view, a measure assigns numbers to certain
subsets of a set \(X\) (see Appendix B for a formal definition). This
can be done in different ways and hence there are different measures.
Consider the example of a plane. There is a measure that simply
assigns to each appropriate region of a plane the area of that region.
But now imagine that we pour a bucket of sugar on the plane. The sugar
is not evenly distributed; there are little heaps in some places while
there is almost no sugar in other places. A measure different from the
area measure is one that assigns to a region a number that is equal to
the amount of sugar on that region. One of these measures is
particularly important, namely the so-called *Lebesgue
measure*. This measure has an intuitive interpretation: it is just
a precise formalisation of the measure we commonly use in geometry.
The interval [0, 2] has Lebesgue measure 2 and the interval [3, 4] has
Lebegues measure 1. In two dimensions, a square whose sides have
Lebesgue measure 2 has Lebesgue measure 4; etc. Although this sounds
simple, the mathematical theory of measures is rather involved. We
state the basics of measure theory in the
Appendix,
Section B, and avoid appeal to technical issues in measure theory in
what follows.

The essential elements in the discussion so far were the phase space
\(X\), the time evolution \(\phi_t\), and the measure \(\mu\). And
these are also the ingredients for the definition of an abstract
dynamical system. An abstract dynamical system is a triple \([X, \mu ,
T_t]\), where \(\{T_t \mid t \text{ is an instant of time}\}\) is a
family of automorphisms, i.e., a family of transformations of \(X\)
onto itself with the property that \(T_{t_1 +t_2} = T_{t_1}(T_{t_2})\)
for all \(x \in X\) (Arnold and Avez 1968, 1); we say more about time
below.^{[2]}
In the above example \(X\) is the phase space of the ball’s
motion, \(\mu\) is the Lebesgue measure, and \(T_t\) is
\(\phi_t\).

So far we have described \(T_t\) as giving the time evolution of a system. Now let us look at this from a more mathematical point of view: the effect of \(T_t\) is that it assigns to every point in \(X\) another point in \(X\) after \(t\) time units have elapsed. In the above example \(\gamma_1\) is mapped onto \(\gamma_2\) under \(\phi_t\) after \(t = 5\) seconds. Hence, from a mathematical point of view the time evolution of a system consists in a mapping of \(X\) onto itself, which is why the above definition takes \(T_t\) to be a family of mappings of \(X\) onto itself. Such a mapping is a prescription that tells you for every point \(x\) in \(X\) on which other point in \(X\) it is mapped (from now on we use \(x\) to denote any point in \(X\), and it no longer stands, as in the above example, for the position of the ball).

The systems studied in ergodic theory are forward deterministic. This
means that if two identical copies of that system are in the same
state at *one instant of time*, then they must be in the same
state at *all* future instants of time. Intuitively speaking,
this means that for any given time there is only one way in which the
system can evolve forward. For a discussion of determinism see Earman
(1986).

It should be pointed out that no particular interpretation is intended in an abstract dynamical system. We have motivated the definition with an example from mechanics, but dynamical systems are not tied to that context. They are mathematical objects in their own right, and as such they can be studied independently of particular applications. This makes them a versatile tool in many different domains. In fact, dynamical systems are used, among others, in fields as diverse as physics, biology, geology and economics.

There are many different kinds of dynamical systems. The three most important distinctions are the following.

*Discrete versus continuous time.* We may consider discrete
instants of time or a continuum of instants of time. For ease of
presentation, we shall say in the first case that time is discrete and
in the second case that time is continuous. This is just a convenient
terminology that has no implications for whether time is fundamentally
discrete or continuous. In the above example with the ball time was
continuous (it was taken to be a real number). But often it is
convenient to regard time as discrete. If time is continuous, then
\(t\) is a real number and the family of automorphisms is \(\{T_t \mid
t \in \mathbb{R} \}\), where \(\mathbb{R}\) is the set of real numbers. If time is
discrete, then \(t\) is in the set \(\mathbb{Z} = \{\ldots -2, -1, 0,
1, 2, \ldots \}\), and the family of automorphisms is \(\{T_t \mid t
\in \mathbb{Z}\}\). In order to indicate that we are dealing with a
discrete family rather than a continuous one we sometimes replace
‘\(T_t\)’ with ‘\(T_n\)’; this is just a
notational convention of no conceptual
importance.^{[3]}
In such systems the progression from one instant of time to the next
is also referred to as a ‘step’. In population biology,
for instance, we often want to know how a population grows over a
typical breeding time (e.g. one year). In mathematical models of such
a population the points in \(X\) represent the size of a population
(rather than the position and the momentum of a ball, as in the above
example), and the transformation \(T_n\) represents the growth of the
population after \(n\) time units. A simple example would be \(T_n = x
+ n\).

Discrete families of automorphisms have the interesting property that they are generated by one mapping. As we have seen above, all automorphisms satisfy \(T_{t_1 +t_2} = T_{t_1}(T_{t_2})\). From this it follows that \(T_n (x) = T^{n}_1 (x)\), that is \(T_n\) is the \(n\)-th iterate of \(T_1\). In this sense \(T_1\) generates \(\{T_t \mid t \in \mathbb{Z}\}\); or, in other words, \(\{T_t \mid t \in \mathbb{Z}\}\) can be ‘reduced’ to \(T_1\). For this reason one often drops the subscript ‘1’, simply calls the map ‘\(T\)’, and writes the dynamical system as the triple \([X, \mu , T]\), where it is understood that \(T = T_1\).

For ease of presentation we use discrete transformations from now on. The definitions and theorems we formulate below carry over to continuous transformations without further ado, and where this is not the case we explicitly say so and treat the two cases separately.

*Measure preserving versus non-measure preserving
transformations*. Roughly speaking, a transformation is measure
preserving if the size of a set (like set \(A\) in the above example)
does not change over the course of time: a set can change its form but
it cannot shrink or grow (with respect to the measure). Formally,
\(T\) is a *measure-preserving transformation* on \(X\) if and
only if (iff) for all sets \(A\) in \(X: \mu(A) = \mu(T^{-1}(A))\),
where \(T^{-1}(A)\) is the set of points that gets mapped onto \(A\)
under \(T\); that is \(T^{-1}(A) = \{ x \in X \mid T(x) \in A
\}\).^{[4]}
From now on we also assume that the transformations we consider are
measure
preserving.^{[5]}

In sum, from now on, unless stated otherwise, we consider discrete measure preserving transformations.

In order to introduce the concept of ergodicity we have to introduce the phase and the time mean of a function \(f\) on \(X\). Mathematically speaking, a function assigns each point in \(X\) a number. If the numbers are always real the function is a real-valued function; and if the numbers may be complex, then it is a complex-valued function. Intuitively we can think of these numbers as representing the physical quantities of interest. Recalling the example of the bouncing ball, \(f\) could for instance assign each point in the phase space \(X\) the kinetic energy the system has at that point; in this case we would have \(f = p^2 / 2m\), where \(m\) is the mass of the ball. For every function we can take two kinds of averages. The first is the infinite time average \(f^*\). The general idea of a time average is familiar from everyday contexts. You play the lottery on three consecutive Saturdays. On the first you win $10; on the second you win nothing; and on the third you win $50. Your average gain is ($10 + $0 + $50)/3 = $20. Technically speaking this is a time average. This simple idea can easily be put to use in a dynamical system: follow the system’s evolution over time (and remember that we are now talking about an average for discrete points of time), take the value of the relevant function at each step, add the values, and then divide by the number of steps. This yields

\[ \frac{1}{k} \sum_{i=0}^{k-1} f(T_i(x_0)), \]where

\[ \sum_{i=0}^{k-1} f(T_i(x_0)), \]is just an abbreviation for

\[ f(x_0) + f(T_1 x_0) + \ldots + f(T_{k-1}x_0). \]This is the finite time average for \(f\) after \(k\) steps. If the system’s state continues to evolve infinitely and we keep tracking the system forever, then we get the infinite time average:

\[ f^* = \lim_{k \rightarrow \infty} \frac{1}{k} \sum_{i=0}^{k-1} f(T_i(x_0)), \]where the symbol ‘lim’ (from latin ‘limes’, meaning border or limit) indicates that we are letting time tend towards infinity (in mathematical symbols: \(\infty)\). One point deserves special attention, since it will become crucial later on: the presence of \(x_0\) in the above expression. Time averages depend on where the system starts; i.e., they depend on the initial condition. If the process starts in a different state, the time average may well be different.

Next we have the space average \(\bar{f}\). Let us again start with a
colloquial example: the average height of the students in a particular
school. This is easily calculated: just take each student’s
height, add up all the numbers, and divide the result by the number of
students. Technically speaking this is a *space average*. In
the example the students in the school correspond to the points in
\(X\); and the fact that we count each students once (we don’t,
for instance, take John’s height into account twice and omit
Jim’s) corresponds to the choice of a measure that gives equal
‘weight’ to each point in \(X\). The transformation \(T\)
has no pendant in our example, and this is deliberate: space averages
have nothing to do with the dynamics of the system (that’s what
sets them off from time averages). The general mathematical definition
of the space average is as follows:

where \(\int_X\) is the integral over the phase space
\(X\).^{[6]}
If the space consists of discrete elements, like the students of the
school (they are ‘discrete’ in that you can count them),
then the integral becomes equivalent to a sum like the one we have
when we determine the average height of a population. If the \(X\) is
continuous (as the phase space above) things are a bit more
involved.

## 2. Ergodicity

With these concepts in place, we can now define
ergodicity.^{[7]}
A dynamical system \([X, \mu , T]\) is *ergodic* iff

for all complex-valued Lebesgue integrable functions \(f\) almost everywhere, meaning for almost all initial conditions. The qualification ‘almost everywhere’ is non-trivial and is the source of a famous problem in the foundations of statistical mechanics, the so-called ‘measure zero problem’ (to which we turn in Section 3). So it is worth unpacking carefully what this condition involves. Not all sets have a finite size. In fact, there are sets of measure zero. This may sound abstract but is very natural. Take a ruler and measure the length of certain objects. You will find, for instance, that your pencil is 17cm long—in the language of mathematics this means that the one dimensional Lebegue measure of the pencil is 17. Now measure a geometrical point and answer the question: how long is the point? The answer is that such a point has no extension and so its length is zero. In mathematical parlance: a set consisting of a geometrical point is a measure zero set. The same goes for a set of two geometrical points: also two geometrical points together have no extension and hence have measure zero. Another example is the following: you have device to measure the surface of objects in a plane. You find out that an A4 sheet has a surface of 623.7 square centimetres. Then you are asked what the surface of a line is. The answer is: zero. Lines don’t have surfaces. So with respect to the two dimensional Lebesgue measure lines are measure zero sets.

In the context of ergodic theory, ‘almost everywhere’ means, by definition, ‘everywhere in \(X\) except, perhaps, in a set of measure zero’. That is, whenever a claim is qualified as ‘almost everywhere’ it means that it could be false for some points in \(X\), but these taken together have measure zero. Now we are in a position to explain what the phrase means in the definition of ergodicity. As we have seen above, the time average (but not the space average!) depends on the initial condition. If we say that \(f^* = \bar{f}\) almost everywhere we mean that all those initial conditions for which it turns out to be the case that \(f^* \ne \bar{f}\) taken together form a set of measure zero—they are like a line in the plane.

Armed with this understanding of the definition of ergodicity, we can now discuss some important properties of ergodic systems. Consider a subset \(A\) of \(X\). For instance, thinking again about the example of the oscillating ball, take the left half of the phase space. Then define the so-called characteristic function of \(A, f_A\), as follows: \(f_A (x) = 1\) for all \(x\) in \(A\) and \(f_A (x) = 0\) for all \(x\) not in \(A\). Plugging this function into the definition of ergodicity yields: \(f^{*}_A = \mu(A)\). This means that the proportion of time that the system’s state spends in set \(A\) is proportional to the measure of that set. To make this even more intuitive, assume that the measure is normalised: \(\mu(X) = 1\) (this is a very common and unproblematic assumption). If we then choose \(A\) so that \(\mu(A) = 1\) ⁄ 2, then we know that the system spends half of the time in \(A\); if \(\mu(A) = 1\) ⁄ 4, it spends a quarter of the time in \(A\); etc. As we will see below, this property of ergodic systems plays a crucial role in certain approaches to statistical mechanics.

Since we are free to choose \(A\) as we wish, we immediately get
another important result: a system can be ergodic only if its
trajectory may access all parts of \(X\) of positive measure, i.e., if
the trajectory passes arbitrarily close to any point in \(X\)
infinitely many times as time tends towards infinity. And this implies
that the phase space of ergodic systems is called *metrically
indecomposable* (or also ‘irreducible’ or
‘inseparable’): every set invariant under \(T\) (i.e.,
every set that is mapped onto itself under \(T)\) has either measure 0
or 1. As a consequence, \(X\) cannot be divided into two or more
subspaces (of non-zero measure) that are invariant under \(T\).
Conversely, a non-ergodic system is metrically decomposable. Hence,
metric indecomposability and ergodicity are equivalent. A metrically
decomposable system is schematically illustrated in Figure 3.

Figure 3: Reducible system: no point in region \(P\) evolves into region \(Q\) and vice versa.

Finally, we would like to state a theorem that will become important in Section 4. One can prove that a system is ergodic iff

\[\tag{E} \lim_{n \rightarrow \infty} \frac{1}{n} \sum_{k=0}^{n-1} \mu(T_k B \cap A) = \mu(b)\mu(A) \]holds for all subsets \(A\) and \(B\) of \(X\). Although this condition does not have an immediate intuitive interpretation, we will see below that it is crucial for the understanding of the kind of randomness we find in ergodic systems.

## 3. The Ergodic Hierarchy

It turns out that ergodicity is only the bottom level of an entire
hierarchy of dynamical properties. This hierarchy is called the
*ergodic hierarchy*, and the study of this hierarchy is the
core task of a mathematical discipline called *ergodic theory*.
This choice of terminology is somewhat misleading, since ergodicity is
only the bottom level of this hierarchy and so EH contains much more
than ergodicity and the scope of ergodic theory stretches far beyond
ergodicty. Ergodic theory (thus understood) is part of *dynamical
systems theory*, which studies a wider class of dynamical systems
than ergodic theory.

EH is a nested classification of dynamical properties. The hierarchy is typically represented as consisting of the following five levels:

Bernoulli \(\subset\) Kolmogorov \(\subset\) Strong Mixing \(\subset\) Weak Mixing \(\subset\) Ergodic

The diagram is intended to indicate that all Bernoulli systems are
Kolmogorov systems, all Kolmogorov systems are strong mixing systems,
and so on. Hence all systems in EH are ergodic. However, the converse
relations do not hold: not all ergodic systems are weak mixing, and so
on. In what follows a system that is ergodic but not weak mixing is
referred to as *merely ergodic* and similarly for the next
three
levels.^{[8]}

(4a) | (4b) |

Figure 4: Mixing

Mixing can be intuitively explained by the following example, first used by Gibbs in introducing the concept of mixing. Begin with a glass of water, then add a shot of scotch; this is illustrated in Fig. 4a. The volume \(C\) of the cocktail (scotch + water) is \(\mu(C)\) and the volume of scotch that was added to the water is \(\mu(S)\), so that in \(C\)the concentration of scotch is \(\mu(S)/\mu(C)\).

Now stir. Mathematically, stirring is represented by the time
evolution \(T\), meaning that \(T(S)\) is the region occupied by the
scotch after one unit of mixing time. Intuitively we say that the
cocktail is thoroughly mixed, if the concentration of scotch equals
\(\mu(S) / \mu(C)\) not only with respect to the *whole* volume
of fluid, but with respect to *any* region \(V\) in that
volume. Hence, the drink is thoroughly mixed at time \(n\) if

for any volume \(V\) (of non-zero measure). Now assume that the volume of the cocktail is one unit: \(\mu(C) = 1\) (which we can do without loss of generality since there is always a unit system in which the volume of the glass is one). Then the cocktail is thoroughly mixed iff

\[ \frac{\mu(T_n S \cap V)}{\mu(V)} = \mu(S) \]for any region \(V\) (of non-zero measure). But how large must \(n\) be before the stirring ends with the cocktail well stirred? We now don’t require that the drink must be thoroughly mixed at any finite time, but only that it approaches a state of being thoroughly mixed as time tends towards infinity:

\[ \lim_{n \rightarrow \infty} \frac{\mu(T_n S \cap V)}{\mu(V)} = \mu(S) \]
for any region \(V\) (of non-zero measure). If we now associate the
glass with the phase space \(X\) and replace the scotch \(S\) and the
volume \(V\) with two arbitrary subsets \(A\) and \(B\) of \(X\), then
we get the general definition of what is called *strong mixing*
(often also referred to just as ‘mixing’): a system is
strong mixing iff

for all subsets \(A\) and \(B\) of \(X.\) This requirement for mixing
can be relaxed a bit by allowing for
fluctuations.^{[9]}
That is, instead of requiring that the cocktail reach a uniform state
of being mixed, we now only require that it be mixed on average. In
other words, we allow that bubbles of either scotch or water may crop
up every now and then, but they do so in a way that these fluctuations
average out as time tends towards infinity. This translates into
mathematics in a straightforward way. The deviation from the ideally
mixed state at some time \(n\) is \(\mu(T_n B \cap A) -
\mu(B)\mu(A)\). The requirement that the average of these deviations
vanishes inspires the notion of weak mixing. A system is *weak
mixing* iff

for all subsets \(A\) and \(B\) of \(X\). The vertical strokes denote the so-called absolute value; for instance: \(\lvert 5 \rvert = \lvert -5 \rvert = 5\). One can prove that there is a strict implication relation between the three dynamical properties we have introduced so far: strong mixing implies weak mixing, but not vice versa; and weak mixing implies ergodicity, but not vice versa. Hence, strong mixing is stronger condition than weak mixing, and weak mixing is stronger condition than ergodicity.

The next higher level in EH are K-systems. Unlike in the cases of
ergodic and mixing systems, there is unfortunately no intuitive way of
explaining the standard definition of such systems, and the definition
is such that one cannot read off from it the characteristics of
K-systems (we state this definition in the
Appendix,
Section C). The least unintuitive way to present K-systems is via a
theorem due to Cornfeld *et al* (1982, 283), who prove that a
dynamical system is a K-system iff it is *K-mixing*. A system
is K-mixing iff for any subsets \(A_0, A_1 , \ldots ,A_r\) of \(X\)
(where \(r\) is a natural number of your choice) the following
condition holds:

where \(\sigma(n, r)\) is the minimal \(\sigma\)-algebra generated by the set

\[ \{T_k A_j \mid k \ge n; j = 1, \ldots ,r\}. \]It is far from obvious what this so-called sigma algebra is and hence the content of this condition is not immediately transparent. We will come back to this issue in Section 5 where we provide an intuitive reading of this condition. What matters for the time being is its similarity to the mixing condition. Strong mixing is, trivially, equivalent to

\[ \lim_{n \rightarrow \infty} \mu(T_n B\cap A) - \mu(B)\mu(A) = 0 \]So we see that K-mixing adds something to strong mixing.

In passing we would like to mention another important property of
K-systems: one can prove that K-systems have positive
*Kolmogorov-Sinai entropy* (KS-entropy); for details see the
Appendix,
Section C. The KS-entropy itself does not have an intuitive
interpretation, but it relates to three other concepts of dynamical
systems theory in an interesting way, and these do have intuitive
interpretations. First, *Lyapunov exponents* are a measure for
how fast two originally nearby trajectories diverge on average, and
they are often used in chaos theory to characterise the chaotic nature
of the dynamics of a system. Under certain circumstances (essentially,
the system has to be differentiable and ergodic) one can prove that a
dynamical system has a positive KS-entropy if and only if it has
positive Lyapounov exponents (Lichtenberg and Liebermann 1992, 304).
In such a system initially arbitrarily close trajectories diverge
exponentially. This result is known as *Pessin’s
theorem*. Second, the *algorithmic complexity* of a
sequence is the length of the shortest computer programme needed to
reproduce the sequence. Some sequences are simple; e.g. a string of a
million ‘1’ is simple: the programme needed to reproduce
it basically is ‘write ‘1’ a million times’,
which is very short. Others are complex: there is no pattern in the
sequence 5%8£yu@*mS!}<74^F that one could exploit, and so a
programme reproducing that sequence essentially reads ‘write
5%8£yu@*mS!}<74^F’, which is similar in length to the
sequence itself. In the discrete case a trajectory can be represented
as a sequence of symbols which corresponds to the states of the system
along this trajectory. It is then the case that if a system is a
K-system, then its KS-entropy equals the algorithmic complexity of
almost all its trajectories (Brudno 1978). This is now known
as *Brudno’s theorem* (Alekseev and Yakobson
1981). Third, the *Shannon entropy* is a common measure for the
uncertainty of a future outcome: the higher the entropy the more
uncertain we are about what is going to happen. One can prove that,
given certain plausible assumptions, the KS-entropy is equivalent to a
generalised version of the Shannon entropy, and can hence be regarded
as a measure for the uncertainty of future events given past events
(Frigg 2004).

Bernoulli systems mark the highest level in EH. In order to define
Bernoulli systems we first have to introduce the notion of a partition
of \(X\) (sometimes also called the ‘coarse graining of
\(X\)’). A *partition of X* is a division of \(X\) into
different parts (the so-called ‘atoms of the partition’)
so that these parts don’t overlap and jointly cover \(X\) (i.e.,
they are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive). For instance, in
Figure 1 there is a partition of the phase space that has two atoms
(the left and the right part). More formally, \(\alpha =
\{\alpha_1,\ldots , \alpha_n\}\) is a partition of \(X\) (and the
\(\alpha_i\) its atoms) iff (i) the intersection of any two atoms of
the partition is the empty set, and (ii) the union of all atoms is
\(X\) (up to measure zero). Furthermore it is important to notice that
a partition remains a partition under the dynamics of the system. That
is, if \(\alpha\) is a partition, then \(T_n\alpha = \{T_n\alpha_1
,\ldots ,T_n\alpha_n\}\) is also a partition for all \(n\).

There are, of course, many different ways of partitioning a phase
space. In what follows we are going to study how different partitions
relate to each other. An important concept in this connection is
independence. Let \(\alpha\) and \(\beta\) be two partitions of \(X\).
By definition, these partitions are *independent* iff
\(\mu(\alpha_i \cap \beta_j) = \mu(\alpha_i)\mu(\beta_j)\) for all
atoms \(\alpha_i\) of \(\alpha\) and all atoms \(\beta_j\) of
\(\beta\). We will explain the intuitive meaning of this definition
(and justify calling it ‘independence’) in Section 4; for
the time being we just use it as a formal definition.

With these notions in hand we can now define a *Bernoulli
transformation:* a transformation \(T\) is a Bernoulli
transformation iff there exists a partition \(\alpha\) of \(X\) so
that the images of \(\alpha\) under \(T\) at different instants of
time are independent; that is, the partitions \(\ldots ,T_{-1}\alpha ,
T_0 \alpha , T_1 \alpha ,\ldots\) are all
independent.^{[10]}
In other words, \(T\) is a Bernoulli transformation iff

for all atoms \(\delta_i\) of \(T_k\alpha\) and all atoms \(\beta_j\)
of \(T_l\alpha\) for all \(k \ne l\). We then refer to \(\alpha\) as
the *Bernoulli partition*, and we call a dynamical system \([X,
\mu , T]\) a *Bernoulli system* if \(T\) is a Bernoulli
automorphism, i.e., a Bernoulli transformation mapping \(X\) onto
itself.

Let us illustrate this with a well-known example, the
*baker’s transformation* (so named because of its
similarity to the kneading of dough). This transformation maps the
unit square onto itself. Using standard Cartesian coordinates the
transformation can be written as follows:

In words, for all points \((x, y)\) in the unit square that have an \(x\)-coordinate smaller than \(1/2\), the transformation \(T\) doubles the value of \(x\) and halves the value of \(y\). For all the points \((x, y)\) that have an \(x\)-coordinate greater or equal to \(1/2\), \(T\) transforms \(x\) in to \(2x-1\) and \(y\) into \(y/2 + 1/2\). This is illustrated in Fig. 5a.

Figure 5a: The Baker’s transformation

Now regard the two areas shown in the left-hand part of the above figure as the two atoms of a partition \(\alpha = \{\alpha_1 ,\alpha_2\}\). It is then easy to see that \(\alpha\) and T\(\alpha\) are independent: \(\mu(\alpha_1 \cap T\alpha_2) = \mu(\alpha_1)\mu(T\alpha_2)\), and similarly for all other atoms of \(\alpha\) and \(T\alpha\). This is illustrated in Figure 5b.

Figure 5b: The independence of \(\alpha\) and \(T\alpha\).

One can prove that independence holds for all other iterates of \(\alpha\) as well. So the baker’s transformation together with the partition \(\alpha\) is a Bernoulli transformation.

In the literature Bernoulli systems are often introduced using
so-called *shift maps* (or *Bernoulli shifts*). We here
briefly indicate how shift maps are related to Bernoulli systems with
the example of the baker’s transformation; for a more general
discussion see the
Appendix,
Section D. Choose a point in the unit square and write its \(x\) and
\(y\) coordinates as binary numbers: \(x = 0.a_1 a_2 a_3\ldots\) and
\(y = 0.b_1 b_2 b_3\ldots\), where all the \(a_i\) and \(b_i\) are
either 0 or 1. Now put both strings together back to back with a dot
in the middle to form one infinite string: \(S= \ldots b_3 b_2 b_1
.a_1 a_2 a_3\ldots\), which may represent the state of the system just
as a ‘standard’ two-dimensional vector does. Some
straightforward algebra then shows that

From this we see that in our ‘one string’ representation
of the point the operation of \(T\) amounts to shifting the dot one
position to the right: \(TS= \ldots b_3 b_2 b_1 a_1 .a_2 a_3\ldots\)
Hence, the baker’s transformation is equivalent to a shift on an
infinite string of zeros and
ones.^{[11]}

There are two further notions that are crucial to the theory of
Bernoulli systems, the property of being *weak Bernoulli* and
*very weak Bernoulli*. These properties play a crucial role in
showing that certain transformations are in fact Bernoulli. The
baker’s transformation is one of the few examples that have a
geometrically simple Bernoulli partition, and so one often cannot
prove directly that a system is a Bernoulli system. One then shows
that a certain geometrically simple partition is weak Bernoulli and
uses a theorem due to Ornstein to the effect that if a system is weak
Bernoulli then there exists a Bernoulli partition for that system. The
mathematics of these notions and the associated proofs of equivalence
are intricate and a presentation of them is beyond the scope of this
entry. The interested reader is referred to Ornstein (1974) or Shields
(1973).

## 4. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Statistical Mechanics

The concepts of EH, and in particular ergodicity itself, play important roles in the foundation of statistical mechanics (SM). In this section we review what these roles are.

A discussion of SM faces an immediate problem.
Foundational debates in many other fields of physics can take as their
point of departure a generally accepted formalism. Things are
different in SM. Unlike, say, relativity theory,
SM has not yet found a generally accepted theoretical framework, let
alone a canonical
formulation.^{[12]}
What we find in SM is plethora of different approaches and schools,
each with its own programme and mathematical
apparatus.^{[13]}
However, all these schools use (slight variants) of either of two
theoretical frameworks, one of which can be associated with Boltzmann
(1877) and the other with Gibbs (1902), and can thereby be classify
either as ‘Boltzmannian’ or ‘Gibbsian’. For
this reason we divide our presentation of SM into a two parts, one for
each of these families of approaches.

Before delving into a discussion of these theories, let us briefly review the basic tenets of SM by dint of a common example. Consider a gas that is confined to the left half of a box. Now remove the barrier separating the two halves of the box. As a result, the gas quickly disperses, and it continues to do so until it uniformly fills the entire box. The gas has approached equilibrium. This raises two questions. First, how is equilibrium characterised? That is, what does it take for a system to be in equilibrium? Second, how do we characterise the approach to equilibrium? That is, what are the salient features of the approach to equilibrium and what features of a system make it behave in this way? These questions are addressed in two subdisciplines of SM: equilibrium SM and non-equilibrium SM.

There are two different ways of describing processes like the spreading of a gas. Thermodynamics describes the system using a few macroscopic variables (in the case of the gas pressure, volume and temperature), while disregarding the microscopic constitution of the gas. As far as thermodynamics is concerned matter could be a continuum rather than consisting of particles—it just would not make any difference. For this reason thermodynamics is called a ‘macro theory’.

The cornerstone of thermodynamics is the so-called Second Law of thermodynamics. This law describes one of the salient features of the above process: its unidirectionality. We see gases spread—i.e., we see them evolving towards equilibrium—but we never observe gases spontaneously reverting to the left half of a box—i.e., we never see them move away from equilibrium when left alone. And this is not a specific feature of gases. In fact, not only gases but also all other macroscopic systems behave in this way, irrespective of their specific makeup. This fact is enshrined in the Second Law of thermodynamics, which, roughly, states that transitions from equilibrium to non-equilibrium states cannot occur in isolated systems, which is the same as saying that entropy cannot decrease in isolated systems (where a system is isolated if it has no interaction with its environment: there is no heat exchange, no one is compressing the gas, etc.).

But there is an altogether different way of looking at that same gas; that is, as consisting of a large number of molecules (a vessel on a laboratory table contains something like \(10^{23}\) molecules). These molecules bounce around under the influence of the forces exerted onto them when they crash into the walls of the vessel and collide with each other. The motion of each molecule is governed by the laws of classical mechanics in the same way as the motion of the bouncing ball. So rather than attributing some macro variables to the gas and focussing on them, we could try to understand the gas’ behaviour by studying the dynamics of its micro constituents.

This raises the question of how the two ways of looking at the gas fit together. Since neither the thermodynamic nor the mechanical approach is in any way privileged, both have to lead to the same conclusions. Statistical mechanics is the discipline that addresses this task. From a more abstract point of view we can therefore also say that SM is the study of the connection between micro-physics and macro-physics: it aims to account for a system’s macro behaviour in terms of the dynamical laws governing its microscopic constituents. The term ‘statistical’ in its name is owed to the fact that, as we will see, a mechanical explanation can only be given if we also introduce probabilistic elements into the theory.

### 4.1 Boltzmannian SM

We first introduce the main elements of the Boltzmannian framework and
then turn to the use of ergodicity in it. Every system can posses
various macrostates \(M_1 ,\ldots ,M_k\). These macrostates are
characterised by the values of macroscopic variables, in the case of a
gas pressure, temperature, and
volume.^{[14]}
In the introductory example one macro-state corresponds to the gas
being confined to the left half, another one to it being spread out.
In fact, these two states have special status: the former is the
gas’ initial state (also referred to as the ‘past
state’); the latter is the gas’ equilibrium state. We
label the states \(M_p\) and \(M_{eq}\) respectively.

It is one of the fundamental posits of the Boltzmann approach that
macrostates supervene on microstates, meaning that a change in a
system’s macrostate must be accompanied by a change in its
microstate (for a discussion of supervenience see McLaughlin and
Bennett 2005, and references therein). For instance, it is not
possible to change the pressure of a system and at the same time keep
its micro-state constant. Hence, to every given microstate \(x\) there
corresponds *exactly one* macrostate. Let us refer to this
macrostate as \(M(x)\). This determination relation is not one-to-one;
in fact many different \(x\) can correspond to the same macrostate. We
now group together all microstates \(x\) that correspond to the same
macro-state, which yields a partitioning of the phase space in
non-overlapping regions, each corresponding to a macro-state. For this
reason we also use the same letters, \(M_1 ,\ldots ,M_k\), to refer to
macro-states and the corresponding regions in phase space. This is
illustrated in Figure 6a.

(6a) | (6b) |

Figure 6: The macrostate structure of \(X\).

We are now in a position to introduce the Boltzmann entropy. To this
end recall that we have a measure \(\mu \) on the phase space that
assigns to every set a particular volume, hence *a fortiori*
also to macrostates. With this in mind, the Boltzmann entropy of a
macro-state \(M_j\) can be defined as \(S_B = k_B\log [\mu(M_j)]\),
where \(k_B\) is the Boltzmann constant. The important feature of the
logarithm is that it is a *monotonic function*: the larger
\(M_j\), the larger its logarithm. From this it follows that the
largest macro-state also has the highest entropy!

One can show that, at least in the case of dilute gases, the Boltzmann entropy coincides with the thermodynamic entropy (in the sense that both have the same functional dependence on the basic state variables), and so it is plausible to say that the equilibrium state is the macro-state for which the Boltzmann entropy is maximal (since thermodynamics posits that entropy be maximal for equilibrium states). By assumption the system starts off in a low entropy state, the initial state \(M_p\) (the gas being squeezed into the left half of the box). The problem of explaining the approach to equilibrium then amounts to answering the question: why does a system originally in \(M_p\) eventually move into \(M_{eq}\) and then stay there? (See Figure 6b.)

In the 1870s Boltzmann offered an important answer to this
question.^{[15]}
At the heart of his answer lies the idea to assign probabilities to
macrostates according to their size. So Boltzmann adopted the
following postulate: \(p(M_j) = c\mu(M_j)\) for all \(j = 1,\ldots
,k\), where \(c\) is a normalisation constant assuring that the
probabilities add up to one. Granted this postulate, it follows
immediately that the most likely state is the equilibrium state (since
the equilibrium state occupies the largest chunk of the phase space).
From this point of view it seems natural to understand the approach to
equilibrium as the evolution from an unlikely macrostate to a more
likely macrostate and finally to the most likely macro-state. This,
Boltzmann argued, was a statistical justification of the Second Law of
thermodynamics.

But Boltzmann knew that simply postulating \(p(M_j) = c\mu(M_j)\)
would not solve the problem unless the postulate could be justified in
terms of the dynamics of the system. This is where ergodicity enters
the scene. As we have seen above, ergodic systems have the property of
spending a fraction of time in each part of the phase space that is
proportional to its size (with respect to \(\mu)\). As we have also
seen, the equilibrium state is the largest macrostate. In fact, the
equilibrium state is *much* larger than the other states. So if
we assume that the system is ergodic, then it is in equilibrium most
of the time! It is then natural to interpret \(p(M_j)\) as a time
average: \(p(M_j)\) is the fraction of time that the system spends in
state \(M_j\) over the course of time. We now have the main elements
of Boltzmann’s framework in front of us: (a) partition the phase
space of the system in macrostates and show that the equilibrium state
is by far the largest state; (b) adopt a time average interpretation
of probability; and (c) assume that the system in question is
ergodic. It then follows that the system is most likely to be found in
equilibrium, which justifies (a probabilistic version of) the Second
law.

Three objections have been levelled against this line of thought. First, it is pointed that assuming ergodicity is too strong in two ways. The first is that it turns out to be extremely difficult to prove that the systems of interest really are ergodic. Contrary to what is sometimes asserted, not even a system of \(n\) elastic hard balls moving in a cubic box with hard reflecting walls has been proven to be ergodic for arbitrary \(n\); it has been proven to be ergodic only for \(n \le 4\). To this charge one could reply that what looks like defeat to some, appears to be a challenge to others. Progress in mathematics may eventually resolve the issue, and there is at least one recent result that justifies optimism: Simanyi (2004) shows that a system of \(n\) hard balls on a torus of dimension 3 or greater is ergodic, for an arbitrary natural number \(n\).

The second way in which ergodicity seems to be too strong is that even if eventually we can come by proofs of ergodicity for the relevant systems, the assumption is too strong because there are systems that are known not to be ergodic and yet they behave in accordance with the Second Law. Bricmont (2001) investigates the Kac Ring Model and a system of \(n\) uncoupled anharmonic oscillators of identical mass, and points out that both systems exhibit thermodynamic behaviour and yet they fail to be ergodic. Hence, ergodicity is not necessary for thermodynamic behaviour. Earman and Redei (1996, p. 70) and van Lith (2001, p. 585) argue that if ergodicity is not necessary for thermodynamic behaviour, then ergodicity cannot provide a satisfactory explanation for this behaviour. Either there must be properties other than ergodicity that explain thermodynamic behaviour in cases in which the system is not ergodic, or there must be an altogether different explanation for the approach to equilibrium even for systems which are ergodic.

In response to this objection, Vranas (1998) and Frigg and Werndl
(2011) argue that most systems that fail to be ergodic are
‘almost ergodic’ in a specifiable way, and this is good
enough. We discuss Vranas’ approach below when discussing
Gibbsian SM since that is the context in which he has put forward his
suggestion. Werndl and Frigg (2015a, 2015b) offer an alternative
definition of Boltzmannian equilibrium and exploit the ergodic
decomposition theorem to show that even if a system is not ergodic it
will spend most of the time in equilibrium, as envisaged by Boltzmann
(roughly the ergodic decomposition theorem says that the phase space
of every measure preserving system can be partitioned into parts so
that the dynamics is ergodic on each part; for details see Petersen
1983). Frigg (2009) suggested exploiting the fact that almost all
Hamiltonian systems are non-integrable, and that these systems have
so-called Arnold webs, i.e., large regions of phase space on which the
motion of the system is ergodic. Lavis (2005) re-examined the Kac ring
model and pointed out that even though the system is not ergodic, it
has an ergodic decomposition, which is sufficient to guarantee the
approach to equilibrium. He also challenged the assumption, implicit
in the above criticism, that providing an explanation for the approach
to equilibrium amounts to identifying one (and only one!) property
that all systems have in common. In fact, it may be the case that
different properties are responsible for the approach to equilibrium
in different systems, and there is no reason to rule out such
explanations. In sum, the tenor of all these responses is that even though
ergodicity *simpliciter* may not have the resources to explain
the approach to equilibrium, somewhat qualified properties do.

The second objection is that even if ergodicity obtains, this is not sufficient to give us what we need. As we have seen above, ergodicity comes with the qualification ‘almost everywhere’. This qualification is usually understood as suggesting that sets of measure zero can be ignored without detriment. The idea is that points falling in a set of measure zero are ‘sparse’ and can therefore be neglected. The question of whether or not this move is legitimate is known as the ‘measure zero problem’.

Simply neglecting sets of measure zero seems to be problematic for various reasons. First, sets of measure zero can be rather ‘big’; for instance, the rational numbers have measure zero within the real numbers. Moreover, a set of measure zero need not be (or even appear) negligible if sets are compared with respect to properties other than their measures. For instance, we can judge the ‘size’ of a set by its cardinality or Baire category rather than by its measure, which leads us to different conclusions about the set’s size (Sklar 1993, pp. 182–88). It is also a mistake to assume that an event with measure zero cannot occur. In fact, having measure zero and being impossible are distinct notions. Whether or not the system at some point was in one of the special initial conditions for which the space and time mean fail to be equal is a factual question that cannot be settled by appeal to measures; pointing out that such points are scarce in the sense of measure theory does resolve the problem because it does not imply that they are scarce in the world as well.

In response two things can said. First, discounting sets of measure zero is standard practice in physics and the problem is not specific to ergodic theory. So unless there is a good reason to suspect that specific measure zero states are in fact important, one might argue that the onus of proof is on those who think that discounting them in this case is illegitimate. Second, the fact that SM works in so many cases suggests that they indeed are scarce.

The third criticism is rarely explicitly articulated, but it is clearly in the background of contemporary Boltzmannian approaches to SM such as Albert’s (2000), which reject Boltzmann’s starting point, namely the postulate \(p(M_j) = c\mu(M_j)\). Albert introduces an alternative postulate, essentially providing transition probabilities between two macrostates conditional on the so-called Past Hypothesis, the posit that the universe came into existence in a low entropy state (the Big Bang). Albert then argues that in such an account erogidicity becomes an idle wheel, and hence he rejects it as completely irrelevant to the foundations of SM. This, however, may well be too hasty. Although it is true that ergodicity simpliciter cannot justify Albert’s probability postulate, another dynamical assumption is needed in order for this postulate to be true (Frigg 2010).

### 4.2 Gibbsian SM

At the basis of Gibbs’ approach stands a conceptual shift. The
object of study in the Boltzmannian framework is an individual system,
consisting of a large but finite number of micro constituents. By
contrast, within the Gibbs framework the object of study is a
so-called *ensemble*: an imaginary collection of infinitely
many copies of the same system (they are the same in that they have
the same phase space, dynamics and measure), but who happen to be in
different states. An ensemble of gases, for instance, consists of
infinitely many copies of the same gas bit in different states: one is
concentrated in the left corner of the box, one is evenly distributed,
etc. It is important to emphasise that ensembles are fictions, or
‘mental copies of the one system under consideration’
(Schrödinger 1952, 3); or alternatively they can be thought of as
collections of possible states of the entire system. Hence, it is
important not to confuse ensembles with collections of micro-objects
such as the molecules of a gas!

The instantaneous state of one system of the ensemble is specified by
one point in its phase space. The state of the ensemble *as a
whole* is therefore specified by a density function \(\varrho\) on
the system’s phase space. From a technical point of view
\(\varrho\) is a function just like \(f\) that we encountered in
Section 1. We furthermore assume that \(\varrho\) is a probability
density, reflecting the probability density of finding the state of a
system chosen at random from the entire ensemble in region \(R\), so
that the probability of the state being in \(R\) is \(p(R) = \int_R
\varrho d\mu\). To make this more intuitive consider the following
analogy. You play a special kind of darts: you fix a plank to the
wall, which serves as your dart board. For some reason you know that
the probability of your dart landing at a particular place on the
board is given by the curve shown in Figure 7. You are then asked what
the probability is that your next dart lands in the left half of the
board. The answer is 1 ⁄ 2 since one half of the surface
underneath the curve is on the left side. The dart board then plays
the role of the system’s state space, a region of the board
(here the left half) plays the role of \(R\), and throwing a dart
plays the role of picking a system from the ensemble.

Figure 7: Dart board

The importance of this is that it allows us to calculate expectation
values. Assume that the game is such that you get one Pound if the
dart hits the left half and three Pounds if it lands on the right
half. What is your expected gain? The answer is 1 ⁄ \(2 \times
1\) Pound \(+ 1\) ⁄ \(2 \times 3\) Pounds \(= 2\) Pounds. This
is the expectation value. The same idea is at work in SM. Physical
magnitudes like, for instance, pressure are associated with functions
\(f\) on the phase pace. We then calculate the expectation value of
these magnitudes, which, in general is given by \(\langle f \rangle =
\int fd\mu\). In the context of Gibbsian SM these expectation values
are also referred to as *phase averages* or *ensemble
averages*. They are of central importance because these values are
used as predictions for observed values. So if you want to use the
formalism to predict what will be observed in an experiment, you first
have to figure out what the probability density \(\varrho\) is, then
find the function \(f\) corresponding to the physical quantity you are
interested in, and then calculate the phase average. Neither of these
steps is easy in practice and working physicists spend most of their
time doing these calculations. However, these difficulties need not
occupy us if we are interested in the conceptual issues underlying
this ‘recipe’.

By definition, a probability density \(\varrho\) is stationary if it does not change over time. Given that observable quantities are associated with phase averages and that equilibrium is defined in terms of the constancy of the macroscopic parameters characterising the system, it is natural to regard the stationarity of the distribution as a necessary condition for equilibrium because stationary distributions yield constant averages. For this reason Gibbs refers to stationarity as the ‘condition of statistical equilibrium’.

Among all stationary distributions those satisfying a further
requirement, the *Gibbsian maximum entropy principle*, play a
special role. The *Gibbs entropy* (sometimes called
‘ensemble entropy’) is defined as

The Gibbsian maximum entropy principle then requires that \(S_G
(\varrho)\) be maximal, given the constraints that are imposed on the
system.^{[16]}

The last clause is essential because different constraints single out
different distributions. A common choice is to keep both the energy
and the particle number in the system fixed. One can prove that under
these circumstances \(S_G (\varrho)\) is maximal for the so-called
*microcanonical distribution* (or *microcanonical
ensemble*). If we choose to hold the number of particles constant
while allowing for energy fluctuations around a given mean value we
obtain the so-called *canonical distribution*; if we also allow
the particle number to fluctuate around a given mean value we find the
so-called *grand-canonical
distribution*.^{[17]}

This formalism is enormously successful in that correct predictions can be derived for a vast class of systems. But the success of this formalism is rather puzzling. The first and most obvious question concerns the relation of systems and ensembles. The probability distribution in the Gibbs approach is defined over an ensemble, the formalism provides ensemble averages, and equilibrium is regarded as a property of an ensemble. But what we are really interested in is the behaviour of a single system! What could the properties of an ensemble—a fictional entity consisting of infinitely many mental copies of the real system—tell us about the one real system on the laboratory table? And more specifically, why do averages over an ensemble coincide with the values found in measurements performed on an actual physical system in equilibrium? There is no obvious reason why this should be so, and it turns out that ergodicity plays a central role in answering these questions.

Common textbook wisdom justifies the use of phase averages as follows.
As we have seen, the Gibbs formalism associates physical quantities
with functions on the system’s phase space. Making an
experiment measuring one of these quantities takes time and it is
assumed that what measurement devices register is not the
instantaneous value of the function in question, but rather its time
average over the duration of the measurement. Hence, time averages are
what is empirically accessible. Then, so the argument continues,
although measurements take an amount of time that is short by human
standards, it is long compared to microscopic time scales on which
typical molecular processes take place. For this reason it is assumed
that the measured *finite* time average is approximately equal
to the *infinite* time average of the measured function. If we
now assume that the system is ergodic, then time averages equal phase
averages. The latter can easily be obtained from the formalism. Hence
we have found the sought-after connection: the Gibbs formalism
provides phase averages which, due to ergodicity, are equal to
infinite time averages, and these are, to a good approximation, equal
to the finite time averages obtained from measurements.

This argument is problematic for at least two reasons. First, from the
fact that measurements take some time it does not follow that what is
actually measured are time averages. For instance, it could be the
case that the value provided to us by the measurement device is simply
the value assumed by at the last moment of the measurement,
irrespective of what the previous values of were (e.g.
it’s simply the last pointer reading registered). So we would
need an argument for the conclusion that measurements indeed produce
time averages. Second, even if we take for granted that
measurements do produce *finite* time averages, equating these
averages with infinite time averages is problematic. Even if the
duration of the measurement is long by experimental standards (which
need not be the case), finite and infinite averages may assume very
different values. That is not to say that they necessarily have to be
different; they *could* coincide. But whether or not they do is
an empirical question, which depends on the specifics of the system
under investigation. So care is needed when replacing finite with
infinite time averages, and one cannot identify them without further
argument.

Malament and Zabell (1980) respond to this challenge by suggesting a way of explaining the success of equilibrium theory that still invokes ergodicity, but avoids appeal to time averages. This solves the above mentioned problems, but suffers from the difficulty that many systems that are successfully dealt with by the formalism of SM are not ergodic. To circumvent this difficulty Vranas (1998) suggested replacing ergodicity with what he calls \(\varepsilon\)-ergodicity. Intuitively a system is \(\varepsilon\)-ergodic if it is ergodic not on the entire phase space, but on a very large part of it (those parts on which it is not ergodic having measure \(\varepsilon\), where \(\varepsilon\) is very small). The leading idea behind his approach is to challenge the commonly held belief that even if a system is just a ‘little bit’ non-ergodic, then it behaves in a completely ‘un-ergodic’ way. Vranas points out that there is a middle ground and then argues that this middle ground actually provides us with everything we need. This is a promising proposal, but it faces three challenges. First, it needs to be shown that all relevant systems really are \(\varepsilon\)-ergodicity. Second, the argument so far has only been developed for the microcanonical ensemble, but one would like to know whether, and if so how, it works for the canonical and the grandcanonical ensembles. Third, it is still based on the assumption that equilibrium is characterised by a stationary distribution, which, as we will see below, is an obstacle when it comes to formulating a workable Gibbsian non-equilibrium theory.

The second response begins with Khinchin’s work. Khinchin (1949)
pointed out that the problems of the ergodic programme are due to the
fact that it focuses on too general a class of systems. Rather than
studying dynamical systems at a general level, we should focus on
those cases that are relevant in statistical mechanics. This involves
two restrictions. First, we only have to consider systems with a large
number of degrees of freedom; second, we only need to take into
account a special class of phase functions, the so-called ‘sum
functions’. These functions are a sum of one-particle functions,
i.e., functions that take into account only the position and momentum
of one particle. Under these assumption Khinchin proved that as \(n\)
becomes larger, the measure of those regions on the energy
hypersurface^{[18]}
where the time and the space means differ by more than a small amount
tends towards zero. Roughly speaking, this result says that for large
\(n\) the system behaves, for all practical purposes, as if it was
ergodic.

The problem with this result is that it is valid only for sum
functions, and in particular only if the energy function of the system
is itself a sum function, which is not the case when particles
interact. So the question is how this result can be generalised to
more realistic cases. This problem stands at the starting point of a
research programme now known as the *thermodynamic limit*,
championed, among others, by Lanford, Mazur, Ruelle, and van der
Linden (see van Lith (2001) for a survey). Its leading question is
whether one can still prove ‘Khinchin-like’ results in the
case of energy function *with* interaction
terms.^{[19]}
Results of this kind can be proven in the limit for \(n \rightarrow
\infty\), if also the volume \(V\) of the system tends towards
infinity in such a way that the number-density \(n/V\) remains
constant.

So far we have only dealt with equilibrium, and things get worse once we turn to non-equilibrium. The main problem is that it is a consequence of the formalism that the Gibbs entropy is a constant! This precludes a characterisation of the approach to equilibrium in terms of increasing Gibbs entropy, which is what one would expect if we were to treat the Gibbs entropy as the SM counterpart of the thermodynamic entropy. The standard way around this problem is to coarse-grain the phase space, and then define the so-called coarse grained Gibbs entropy. Put simply, course-graining the phase space amounts to putting a grid on the phase space and declare that all points within one cell of the grid are indistinguishable. This procedure turns a continuous phase space into a discrete collection of cells, and the state of the system is then specified by saying in which cell the system’s state is. If we define the Gibbs entropy on this grid, it turns out (for purely mathematical reasons) that the entropy is no longer a constant and can actually increase or decrease. If one then assumes that the system is mixing, it follows from the so-called convergence theorem of ergodic theory that the coarse-grained Gibbs entropy approaches a maximum. However, this solution is fraught with controversy, the two main bones of contention being the justification of coarse-graining and the assumption that the system is mixing.

In sum, ergodicity plays a central role in many attempts to justify the posits of SM. And even where a simplistic use of ergodicity is eventually unsuccessful, somewhat modified notions prove fruitful in an analysis of the problem and in the search for better solutions.

## 5. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Randomness

EH is often presented as a hierarchy of increasing degrees of
randomness in deterministic systems: the higher up in this hierarchy a
system is placed the more random its
behaviour.^{[20]}
However, the definitions of different levels of EH do not make
explicit appeal to randomness; nor does the usual way of presenting EH
involve a specification of the notion of randomness that is supposed
to underlie the hierarchy. So there is a question about what notion of
randomness underlies EH and in what sense exactly EH is a hierarchy of
random behaviour.

Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz (2006) discuss this problem and argue that EH is best understood as a hierarchy of random behaviour if randomness is explicated in terms of unpredictability, where unpredictability is accounted for in terms of probabilistic relevance. Different patterns of probabilistic relevance, in turn, are spelled out in terms of different types of decay of correlation between a system’s states at different times. Let us introduce these elements one at a time.

Properties of systems can be associated with different parts of the
phase space. In the ball example, for instance, the property
*having positive momentum* is associated with the right half of
the phase space; that is, it is associated with the set \(\{x \in X
\mid p \gt 0\}\). Generalising this idea we say that to every subset
\(A\) of a system’s phase space there corresponds a property
\(P_A\) so that the system possesses that property at time \(t\) iff
the system’s state \(x\) is in \(A\) at \(t\). The subset \(A\)
may be arbitrary and the property corresponding to \(A\) may not be
intuitive, unlike, for example, the property of *having positive
momentum.* But nothing in the analysis to follow hangs on a
property being ‘intuitive’. We then define the
*event* \(A^t\) as the obtaining of \(P_A\) at time \(t\).

At every time \(t\) there is a matter of fact whether \(P_A\) obtains, which is determined by the dynamics of the system. However, we may not know whether or not this is the case. We therefore introduce epistemic probabilities expressing our uncertainty about whether \(P_A\) obtains: \(p(A^t)\) reflects an agent’s degree of belief in \(P_A\)’s obtaining at time \(t\). In the same way we can introduce conditional probabilities: \(p(A^t \mid B^{t_1})\) is our degree of belief in the system having \(P_A\) at \(t\) given that it had \(P_B\) at an earlier time \(t_1\), where \(B\) is also a subset of the system’s phase space. By the usual rule of conditional probability we have \(p(A^t \mid B^{t_1}) = p(A^t \amp B^{t_1}) / (p(B^{t_1})\). This can of course be generalised to more then one event: \(p(A^t \mid B_{1}^{t_1} \amp \ldots \amp B_{r}^{t_r})\) is our degree of belief in the system having \(P_A\) at \(t\) given that it had \(P_{B_1}\) at \(t_1, P_{B_2}\) at \(t_2,\ldots\), and \(P_{B_{ r}}\) at \(t_r\), where \(B_1 ,\ldots ,B_r\) are subsets of the system’s phase space (and \(r\) a natural number), and \(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_r\) are successive instants of time (i.e., \(t \gt t_1 \gt \ldots \gt t_r)\).

Intuitively, an event in the past is relevant to our making
predictions if taking the past event into account makes a difference
to our predictions, or more specifically if it lowers or raises the
probability for a future event. In other words, \(p(A^t \mid
B_{1}^{t_1}) - p(A^t)\) is a measure of the relevance of \(B^{t_1}\)
to predicting \(A^t : B^{t_1}\) is positively relevant if the \(p(A^t
\mid B_{1}^{t_1}) - p(A^t) \gt 0\), negatively relevant if \(p(A^t
\mid B_{1}^{t_1}) - p(A^t) \lt 0\), and irrelevant if \(p(A^t \mid
B_{1}^{t_1}) - p(A^t) = 0\). For technical reasons it turns out to be
easier to work with a slightly different but equivalent notion of
relevance, which is obtained from the above by multiplying both sides
of the equation by \(p(B^{t_1})\). Therefore we adopt the following
definition. The *relevance* of \(B^{t_1}\) for \(A^t\) is

The generalisation of this definition to cases with more than one set \(B\) (as above) is straightforward.

Relevance serves to explicate unpredictability. Intuitively, the less
relevant past events are for \(A^t\), the less predictable the system
is. This basic idea can then be refined in various ways. First, the
type of unpredictability we obtain depends on the type of events to
which (R) is applied. For instance, the degree of the unpredictability
of \(A^t\) increases if its probability is independent not only of
\(B^{t_1}\) or other ‘isolated’ past events, but rather
the entire past. Second, the unpredictability of an event \(A^t\)
increases if the probabilistic dependence of that event on past events
\(B^{t_1}\) decreases rapidly with the increase of the temporal
distance between the events. Third, the probability of \(A^t\) may be
independent of past events *simpliciter*, or it may be
independent of such events only on average. These ideas underlie the
analysis of EH as a hierarchy of unpredictability.

Before we can provide such an analysis, two further steps are needed.
First, if the probabilities are to be useful to understanding
randomness in a *dynamical system*, the probability assignment
has to reflect the properties of the system. So we have to connect the
above probabilities to features of the system. The natural choice is
the system’s measure
\(\mu\).^{[21]}
So we postulate that the probability of an event \(A^t\) is equal to
the measure of the set \(A: p(A^{t}) = \mu(A)\) for all \(t\). This
can be generalised to joint probabilities as follows:

for all instants of time \(t \gt t_1\) and all subsets \(A\) and \(B\)
of the system’s phase space. \(T_{t_1 \rightarrow t}B\) is the
image of the set \(B\) under the dynamics of the system from \(t_1\)
to \(t\). We refer to this postulate as the *Probability
Postulate* (P), which is illustrated in Figure 8. Again, this
condition is naturally generalised to cases of joint probabilities of
\(A^t\) with multiple events \(B^{t_i}\). Granted (P) and its
generalization, (R) reflects the dynamical properties of systems.

Figure 8: Condition (P).

Before briefly introducing the next element of the analysis let us mention that there is a question about whether the association of probabilities with the measure of the system is reasonable. Prima facie, a measure on a phase space can have a purely geometrical interpretation and need not necessarily have anything to do with the quantification of uncertainty. For instance, we can use a measure to determine the length of a table, but this measure need not have anything to do with uncertainty. Whether or not such an association is legitimate depends on the cases at hand and the interpretation of the measure. However, for systems of interest in statistical physics it is natural and indeed standard to assume that the probability of the system’s state to be in a particular subset of the phase space \(X\) is proportional to the measure of \(A\).

The last element to be introduced is the notion of the correlation between two subsets \(A\) and \(B\) of the system’s phase space, which is defined as follows:

\[\tag{C} C(A, B) = \mu(A \cap B) - \mu(A)\mu(B). \]If the value of \(C(A, B)\) is positive (negative), there is positive (negative) correlation between \(A\) and \(B\); if it is zero, then \(A\) and \(B\) are uncorrelated. It then follows immediately from the above that

\[\tag{RC} R(B^{t_1}, A^t) = C(T_{t_1\rightarrow t}B, A). \](RC) constitutes the basis for the interpretation of EH as a hierarchy of objective randomness. Granted this equation, the subjective probabilistic relevance of the event \(B^{t_1}\) for the event \(A^t\) reflects objective dynamical properties of the system since for different transformations \(T\ R(B^{t_1}, A^t)\) will indicate different kinds of probabilistic relevance of \(B^{t_1}\) for \(A^t\).

To put (RC) to use, it is important to notice that the equations defining the various levels of EH above can be written in terms of correlations. Taking into account that we are dealing with discrete systems (and hence we have \(T_{t_1\rightarrow t}B = T_k B\) where \(k\) is the number of time steps it takes to get from \(t_1\) and \(t)\), these equations read:

Applying (RC) to these expressions, we can explicate the nature of the unpredictability that each of the different levels of EH involves.

Let us start at the top of EH. In Bernoulli systems the probabilities of the present state are totally independent of whatever happened in the past, even if the past is only one time step back. So knowing the past of the system does not improve our predictive abilities in the least; the past is simply irrelevant to predicting the future. This fact is often summarised in the slogan that Bernoulli systems are as random as a coin toss. We should emphasise, however, that this is true only for events in the Bernoulli partition; the characterisation of a Bernoulli system is silent about what random properties partitions other than the Bernoulli partition have.

K-mixing is more difficult to analyse. We now have to tackle the question of how to understand \(\sigma(n, r)\), the minimal \(\sigma\)-algebra generated by the set

\[ \{T_k A_j \mid k \ge n ; j = 1, \ldots ,r\} \]that we sidestepped earlier on. What matters for our analysis is that the following types of sets are members of

\[\sigma(n, r): T_k A_{j_0} \cap T_{k +1}A_{j_1} \cap T_{k +2}A_{j_2} \cap \ldots,\]
where the indices \(j_i\) range over \(1, \ldots ,r\). Since we are
free to chose the sets A\(_0\), A\(_1,\ldots\), A\(_r\) as we please,
we can always chose them so that they are the past history of the
system: the system was in \(A_{j_0}\) \(k\) time steps back, in
\(A_{j_1}\) \( k+1\) time steps back, etc. Call this the
(coarse-grained) *remote past* of the
system—‘remote’ because we only consider states that
are more than \(k\) time steps back. The K-mixing condition then says
that the system’s *entire* remote past history becomes
irrelevant to predicting what happens in the future as time tends
towards infinity. Typically Bernoulli systems are compared with
K-systems by focussing on the events in the Bernoulli partition. With
respect to that partition K is weaker than Bernoulli. The difference
is both in the limit and the remote history. In a Bernoulli system the
future is independent of the *entire* past (not only the remote
past), and this is true without taking a limit (in the case of
K-mixing independence only obtains in the limit). However, this only
holds for the Bernoulli partition; it may or may not hold for other
partitions—the definition of a Bernoulli system says nothing
about that case.^{[22]}

The interpretation of strong mixing is now straightforward. It says
that for any two sets \(A\) and \(B\), having been in \(B\) \(k\) time
steps back becomes irrelevant to the probability of being in \(A\)
some time in the future if time tends towards infinity (i.e. when n
tends to infinity). In other words, past events \(B\) become
increasingly irrelevant for the probability of \(A\) as the temporal
distance between \(A\) and \(B\) becomes larger. This condition is
weaker than K-mixing because it only states that the future is
independent of isolated events in the remote past, while K-mixing
implies independence of the *entire* remote past history.

In weakly mixing systems the past may be relevant to predicting the future, even in the remote past. The weak mixing condition only says that this influence has to be weak enough for it to be the case that the absolute value of the correlations between a future event and past events vanishes on average; but this does not mean that all individual correlations vanish. So in weakly mixing systems events in the past can remain relevant to the future.

Ergodicity, finally, implies no decay of correlation at all. The ergodicity condition only says that the average of the correlations (and this time without an absolute value) of all past events with a future event is zero. But this is compatible with there being strong correlations between every instant in the past and the future, provided that positive and negative correlations average out. So in ergodic systems the past does not become irrelevant. For this reason ergodic system are not random at all (in the sense of random introduced above).

## 6. The ‘No-Application’ Charge

How relevant are these insights to understanding the behaviour of
actual systems? A frequently heard objection (which we have already
encountered in Section 4) is that EH and more generally ergodic theory
are irrelevant since most systems (including those that we are
ultimately interested in) are not ergodic at
all.^{[23]}

This charge is less acute than it appears at first glance. First, it is important to emphasise that it is not the sheer number of applications that make a physical concept important, but whether there are some important systems that are ergodic. And there are examples of such systems. For example, so-called ‘hard-ball systems’ (and some more sophisticated variants of them) are effective idealizations of the dynamics of gas molecules, and these systems seem to be ergodic;for details, see Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz 2006, Section 3.2, Vranas (1998) and Frigg and Werndl (2011).

Furthermore, EH can be used to characterize randomness and chaos in
both ergodic and non-ergodic systems. Even if a system *as a whole* is
not ergodic (i.e., if it fails to be ergodic with respect to the
*entire* phase space \(X)\), there can be (and usually there
are) subsets of \(X\) on which the system is ergodic. This is what
Lichtenberg and Libermann (1992, p. 295) have in mind when they
observe that ‘[i]n a sense, ergodicity is universal, and the
central question is to define the subspace over which it
exists’. In fact, non-ergodic systems may have subsets that are
not only ergodic, but even Bernoulli! It then becomes interesting
to ask what these subsets are, what their measures are, and what
topological features they have. These are questions studied in parts
of dynamical systems theory, most notably KAM theory. Hence, KAM
theory does not demonstrate that ergodic theory is not useful in
analyzing the dynamical behavior of real physical systems (as is often
claimed). Indeed, KAM systems have regions in which the system
manifest either merely ergodic or Bernoulli behaviour, and accordingly
EH is useful for charactering the dynamical properties of such systems
(Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz 2006, Section 4). Further, as we have
mentioned in Section 4.1, almost all Hamiltonian systems are
non-integrable, and accordingly they have large regions of the phase
space in which their motion is ergodic-like. So EH is a useful tool in
studying the dynamical properties of systems even if the system fails
to be ergodic *tout court*.

Another frequently heard objection is that EH is irrelevant in
practice because most levels of EH (in fact, all except Bernoulli) are
defined in terms of *infinite* time limits and hence remain
silent about what happens in *finite* time. But all we ever
observe are finite times and so EH is irrelevant to physics as
practiced by actual scientists.

This charge can be dispelled by a closer look at the definition of a
limit, which shows that *infinite* limits in fact have
important implications for the dynamical behaviour of the system in
finite times. The definition of a limit is as follows (where \(f\) is
an arbitrary function of time): lim\(_{t\rightarrow \infty} f(t) = c\)
iff for every \(\varepsilon \gt 0\) there exists an \(t’ \gt 0\) so
that for all \(t \gt t’\) we have \(\lvert f(t) - c\rvert \lt
\varepsilon\). In words, for every number \(\varepsilon\), no matter
how small, there is a *finite* time \(t’\) after which the
values of \(f\) differ from \(c\) by less then \(\varepsilon\). That
is, once we are past \(t’\) the values of \(f\) never move more than
\(\varepsilon\) away from \(c\). With this in mind strong mixing, for
instance, says that for a given threshold \(\varepsilon\) there exists
a *finite* time \(t_n (n\) units of time after the current
time) after which \(C(T_n B, A)\) is always smaller than
\(\varepsilon\). We are free to choose \(\varepsilon\) to be an
empirically relevant margin, and so we know that if a system is
mixing, we should expect the correlations between the states of the
system after *t\(_n\)* and its current state to be below
\(\varepsilon\). The upshot is that in strong mixing systems, being in
a state \(B\) at some past time becomes increasingly irrelevant for
its probability of being in the state \(A\) now, as the temporal
distance between \(A\) and \(B\) becomes larger. Thus, the fact that
system is strong mixing clearly has implications for its dynamical
behaviour in finite times. Furthermore, often (although not always)
convergence proofs provide effective bounds on rates of convergence
and these bounds can be used to inform expectations about behaviour at
a given time.

Since different levels of EH correspond to different degrees of randomness, each explicated in terms of a different type of asymptotic decay of correlations between states of systems at different times, one might suspect that a similar pattern can be found in the rates of decay. That is, one might be tempted to think that EH can equally be characterized as a hierarchy of increasing rates of decay of correlations: a K-system, for instance, which exhibits exponential divergence of trajectories would be characterized by an exponential rate of decay of correlations, while a SM-system would exhibit a polynomial rate of decay.

This, unfortunately, does not work. Natural as it may seem, EH cannot be interpreted as a hierarchy of increasing rates of decay of correlations. It is a mathematical fact that there is no particular rate of decay associated with each level of EH. For instance, one can construct K-systems in which the decay is as slow as one wishes it to be. So the rate of decay is a feature of particular systems rather than of a level of EH.

## 7. The Ergodic Hierarchy and Chaos

The question of how to characterise *chaos* has been
controversially discussed ever since the inception of chaos theory;
for a survey see Smith (1998, Ch. 10). An important family of
approaches defines chaos using EH. Belot and Earman (1997, 155) state
that being strong mixing is a necessary condition and being a K-system
is a sufficient condition for a system to be chaotic. The view that
being a K-system is the mark of chaos and that any lower degree of
randomness is not chaotic is frequently motivated by two ideas. The
first is the idea that chaotic behaviour involves dynamical
instability in the form of exponential divergence of nearby
trajectories. Thus, since a system involves an exponential divergence
of nearby trajectories only if it is a K-system, it is concluded that
(merely) ergodic and mixing systems are not chaotic whereas K- and
B-systems are. It is noteworthy, however, that SM is compatible with
there being polynomial divergence of nearby trajectories and that such
divergence sometimes exceeds exponential divergence in the short run.
Thus, if chaos is to be closely associated with the rate of divergence
of nearby trajectories, there seems to be no good reason to deny that
SM systems exhibit chaotic behaviour.

The second common motivation for the view that being a K-system is the
mark of chaos is the idea that the shift from zero to positive
KS-entropy marks the transition from a ‘regular’ to
‘chaotic’ behaviour. This may suggest that having positive
KS-entropy is both necessary and sufficient condition for chaotic
behaviour. Thus, since K-systems have positive KS-entropy while SM
systems don’t, it is concluded that K-systems are chaotic
whereas SM-systems are not. Why is KS-entropy a mark of chaos? There
are three motivations, corresponding to three different
interpretations of KS-entropy. First, KS-entropy could be interpreted
as entailing dynamical instability in the sense of having nearby
divergence of nearby trajectories (see Lichtenberg & Liebermann,
1992, p. 304). Second, KS-entropy could be connected to algorithmic
complexity (Brudno 1978). Yet, while such a complexity is sometimes
mentioned as an indication of chaos, it is more difficult to connect
it to physical intuitions about chaos. Third, KS-entropy could be
interpreted as a generalized version of Shannon’s information
theoretic entropy (see Frigg 2004). According to this approach,
positive KS-entropy entails a certain degree of unpredictability,
which is sufficiently high to deserve the title
chaotic.^{[24]}

Werndl (2009b) argues that a careful review of all systems that one
commonly regards as chaotic shows that strong mixing is the crucial
criterion: a system is chaotic just in case it is strong mixing. As
she is careful to point out, this claim needs to be qualified: systems
are rarely mixing on the entire phase space, but neither are they
chaotic on the entire phase space. The crucial move is to restrict
attention to those regions of phase space where the system is chaotic,
and it then turns out that in these same regions the systems are also
strong mixing. Hence Werndl concludes that strong mixing is the
hallmark of chaos. And surprisingly this is true also of dissipative
systems (i.e., systems that are not measure preserving). These systems
have attractors, and they are chaotic on their attractors rather than
on the entire phase space. The crucial point then is that one can
define an invariant (preserved) measure *on the attractor* and
show that the system is strongly mixing with respect to that measure.
So strong mixing can define chaos in both conservative and dissipative
systems.

The search for necessary and sufficient conditions for chaos presupposes that there is a clear-cut divide between chaotic and non-chaotic systems. EH may challenge this view, as every attempt to draw a line somewhere to demarcate the chaotic from non-chaotic systems is bound to be somewhat arbitrary. Ergodic systems are pretty regular, mixing systems are less regular and the higher positions in the hierarchy exhibit still more haphazard behaviour. But is there one particular point where the transition from ‘non-chaos’ to chaos takes place? Based on the argument that EH is a hierarchy of increasing degrees of randomness and degrees of randomness correspond to different degrees of unpredictability (see Section 5), Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz (2006, Section 5.3) suggest that chaos may well be viewed as a matter of degree rather than an all-or-nothing affair. Bernoulli systems are very chaotic, K-systems are slightly less chaotic, SM-systems are still less chaotic, and ergodic systems are non-chaotic. This suggestion connects well with the idea that chaos is closely related to unpredictability.

The ergodic hierarchy has also been used to understand quantum chaos. Castagnino and Lombardi (2007) analyze the problem of quantum chaos as a particular case of the classical limit of quantum mechanics and identify mixing in the classical limit as the condition that a quantum system must satisfy to be nonintegrable. Gomez and Castagnino (2014, 2015) generalize the entire ergodic hierarchy to the quantum context and argue that EH thus generalized is a helpful tool to understand quantum chaos; Fortin and Lombardi (2018) use EH to understand decoherence; and Gomez (2018) discusses the KS entropy in quantum mixing systems.

Mixing, finally, has also been invoked in understanding the effects of structural model error. Frigg, Bradley, Du and Smith (2014) argue that the distinction between parameter error and structural model error is crucial, and that the latter has significant and hitherto unappreciated impact on the predictive ability of a model. Wilson-Mayo (2015) points out that to put this observation on a solid foundation we need a notion of structural chaos. He proposes such a notion by appealing to topological mixing.

## 8. Conclusion

EH is often regarded as relevant for explicating the nature of randomness in deterministic dynamical systems. It is not clear, however, what notion of randomness this claim invokes. The formal definitions of EH do not make explicit appeal to randomness and the usual ways of presenting EH do not involve any specification of the notion of randomness that is supposed to underlie EH. As suggested in Section 5, EH can be interpreted as a hierarchy of randomness if degrees of randomness are explicated in terms of degrees of unpredictability, which in turn are explicated in terms of (coherent) conditional degrees of beliefs. In order for these degrees of belief to be indicative of the system’s dynamical properties, they have to be updated according to a system’s dynamical law. The idea is then that the different levels of EH, except for merely ergodic systems, correspond to different kinds of unpredictability, which correspond to different patterns of decay of correlations between systems’ past states and their present states. Merely ergodic systems seem to display no randomness, as the correlations between their past and present states need not decay at all.

Ergodic theory plays an important role in statistical physics, and EH, or some modification of it, constitutes an important measure of randomness in both Hamiltonian and dissipative systems. It is sometimes argued that EH is by and large irrelevant for physics because real physical systems are not ergodic. But, this charge is unwarranted, and a closer look at non-ergodic systems reveals a rather different picture, because EH can be fruitfully be used in the foundations of statistical mechanics, analyses of randomness, and chaos theory. More recently it has also played a role in understanding laws of nature (Filomeno 2019, List and Pivato 2019).

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