Notes to Essential vs. Accidental Properties

1. The distinction between logical and metaphysical possibility is sometimes talked about as the distinction between narrowly logical possibility and broadly logical possibility (see Plantinga (1974)). That there is genuinely a distinction here is attested to by the fact that typical mathematical claims—such as Goldbach’s Conjecture that every even number greater than two is the sum of two primes, that there are infinitely many primes, that two plus two is four, and so on—are metaphysically but not logically necessary, if they are true at all. Similarly, typical philosophical claims—such as that personal identity consists in a certain kind of continuity of consciousness, that torturing innocent people is wrong, and so on—are metaphysically but not logically necessary, if they are true at all.

2. That being said, Fine seems willing to say that the modal characterization has something going for it. He writes: “It is my aim in this paper to show that the contemporary assimilation of essence to modality is fundamentally misguided and that, as a consequence, the corresponding conception of metaphysics should be given up. It is not my view that the modal account fails to capture anything which might reasonably be called a concept of essence. My point, rather, is that the notion of essence which is of central importance to the metaphysics of identity is not to be understood in modal terms or even to be regarded as extensionally equivalent to a modal notion” (1994, p. 3, our emphasis).

3. Although these alleged counterexamples are most closely associated with Fine (1994), they were discussed earlier in Dunn (1990). In fact, as Dunn points out, Marcus (1967) and Parsons (1967) discussed similar examples of “trivially essential” properties, even though Marcus and Parsons did not regard them as counterexamples to the modal characterization. Still, Fine’s discussion of these examples has garnered the most attention in recent years.

4. It should be noted that several of these non-standard modal accounts have come under critical discussion. See Fine (2007) for a response to Correia (2007), see Skiles (2015) for a response to Cowling (2013) and Wildman (2013), and see Steward (2015) for a response to Brogaard and Salerno (2013).

5. Note that the phrase “any given object” is used to convey existential commitment — that is, the presupposition that there are objects. Without this commitment, neither “minimal essentialism” nor “maximal essentialism” will count as a form of essentialism, given that essentialism, as it was characterized at the outset, implies that some objects do have essential properties.

6. It is also plausible to understand the sentence ‘Water is H2O’ as an identity claim rather than in the way it is being understood here. On that understanding, the claim may be knowable a priori. For it may be that ‘Water’ and ‘H2O’ function as logically proper names of a certain chemical substance, so that ‘Water is H2O’ has the same content as ‘Water is water’ and ‘H2O is H2O’ (see Salmon (2003, p. 488) and Salmon (1987/1988, p. 197, n. 5)).

Notes to the Supplement on the Arguments for Origin Essentialism

7. It may be worth pointing out that the intuition that if one’s parents had not gotten together, then one would never have existed does not straightforwardly offer support for origin essentialism. Compare: the fact that if Ed had not lit the cigarette, then the house would never have burned down does not mean that it is impossible for the house to have burned down without Ed’s lighting the cigarette. In general it is one thing to say that \(B\) would not have happened had \(A\) not happened and another to say that \(B\) could not have happened without \(A\)’s happening.

8. The three versions of the argument that appear in this section are taken—with some minor changes—from Salmon (1981, Chapter 7 and Appendix I). Salmon offers translations of the argument into the language of quantified modal logic. Those who are so inclined may verify their validity by means of the formal translations. For those who are not so inclined, I hope my explanation makes the reasoning clear.

9. To see modal tolerance as a direct threat to the sufficiency premise of the argument for origin essentialism rather than as a direct threat to the thesis of origin essentialism itself, just start from its being possible for \(a\) to be the only table originally made from \(m\) according to plan \(p\) and its being possible for \(b\) to be the only table originally made from \(m_n\) according to plan \(p\). In the case of \(a\), repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which it is the only table originally made from \(m_{n/2}\) according to plan \(p\). In the case of \(b\), repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which it is the only table originally made from \(m_{n/2}\) according to plan \(p\). The sufficiency premise then incorrectly identifies \(a\) and \(b\).

Copyright © 2016 by
Teresa Robertson <trobertson@philosophy.ucsb.edu>
Philip Atkins <philip.atkins@temple.edu>

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