Ancient Ethical Theory
While moral theory does not invent morality, or even reflection on it, it does try to bring systematic thinking to bear on these activities. Ancient moral theory, however, does not attempt to be a comprehensive account of all the phenomena that fall under the heading of morality. Rather, assuming piecemeal opinions and practices, it tries to capture its underlying essence. It is the nature of such an enterprise to evaluate and criticize some of these opinions and practices but that is not its primary goal. Ancient moral theory tries to provide a reflective account of an essential human activity so one can grasp what is of fundamental importance in pursuing it. In historical order, the theories to be considered in this article are those of Socrates as presented in certain dialogues of Plato; Plato in the Republic; Aristotle; the Cynics; Cyrenaic hedonism; Epicurus; the Stoics; and Pyrrhonian skepticism.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Socrates
- 3. Plato
- 4. Aristotle
- 5. Cynics
- 6. Cyrenaics
- 7. Epicurus
- 8. Stoics
- 9. Pyrrhonian Skeptics
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In their moral theories, the ancient philosophers depended on several important notions. These include virtue and the virtues, happiness (eudaimonia), and the soul. We can begin with virtue.
Virtue is a general term that translates the Greek word aretê. Sometimes aretê is also translated as excellence. Many objects, natural or artificial, have their particular aretê or kind of excellence. There is the excellence of a horse and the excellence of a knife. Then, of course, there is human excellence. Conceptions of human excellence include such disparate figures as the Homeric warrior chieftain and the Athenian statesman of the period of its imperial expansion. Plato’s character Meno sums up one important strain of thought when he says that excellence for a man is managing the business of the city so that he benefits his friends, harms his enemies, and comes to no harm himself (Meno 71e). From this description we can see that some versions of human excellence have a problematic relation to the moral virtues.
In the ancient world, courage, moderation, justice and piety were leading instances of moral virtue. A virtue is a settled disposition to act in a certain way; justice, for instance, is the settled disposition to act, let’s say, so that each one receives their due. This settled disposition consists in a practical knowledge about how to bring it about, in each situation, that each receives their due. It also includes a strong positive attitude toward bringing it about that each receives their due. Just people, then, are not ones who occasionally act justly, or even who regularly act justly but do so out of some other motive; rather they are people who reliably act that way because they place a positive, high intrinsic value on rendering to each their due and they are good at it. Courage is a settled disposition that allows one to act reliably to pursue right ends in fearful situations, because one values so acting intrinsically. Moderation is the virtue that deals similarly with one’s appetites and emotions.
Human excellence can be conceived in ways that do not include the moral virtues. For instance, someone thought of as excellent for benefiting friends and harming enemies can be cruel, arbitrary, rapacious, and ravenous of appetite. Most ancient philosophers, however, argue that human excellence must include the moral virtues and that the excellent human will be, above all, courageous, moderate, and just. This argument depends on making a link between the moral virtues and happiness. While most ancient philosophers hold that happiness is the proper goal or end of human life, the notion is both simple and complicated, as Aristotle points out. It seems simple to say everyone wants to be happy; it is complicated to say what happiness is. We can approach the problem by discussing, first, the relation of happiness to human excellence and, then, the relation of human excellence to the moral virtues.
It is significant that synonyms for eudaimonia are living well and doing well. These phrases imply certain activities associated with human living. Ancient philosophers argued that whatever activities constitute human living – e.g., those associated with pleasure – one can engage in those activities in a mediocre or even a poor way. One can feel and react to pleasures sometimes appropriately and sometimes inappropriately; or one might always act shamefully and dishonorably. However, to carry out the activities that constitute human living well over a whole lifetime, or long stretches of it, is living well or doing well. At this point the relation of happiness to human excellence should be clear. Human excellence is the psychological basis for carrying out the activities of a human life well; to that extent human excellence is also happiness.
So described, human excellence is general and covers many activities of a human life. However, one can see how human excellence might at least include the moral virtues. The moral virtue relevant to fear, for instance, is courage. Courage is a reliable disposition to react to fear in an appropriate way. What counts as appropriate entails harnessing fear for good or honorable ends. Such ends are not confined to one’s own welfare but include, e.g., the welfare of one’s city. In this way, moral virtues become the kind of human excellence that is other-regarding. The moral virtues, then, are excellent qualities of character – intrinsically valuable for the one who has them; but they are also valuable for others. In rough outline, we can see one important way ancient moral theory tries to link happiness to moral virtue by way of human excellence. Happiness derives from human excellence; human excellence includes the moral virtues, which are implicitly or explicitly other-regarding.
Since happiness plays such a vital role in ancient moral theory, we should note the difference between the Greek word eudaimonia and its usual translation as ‘happiness’. Although its usage varies, most often the English word ‘happiness’ refers to a feeling. For example, we say, “You can tell he feels happy right now, from the way he looks and how he is behaving.” The feeling is described as one of contentment or satisfaction, perhaps with the way one’s life as a whole is going. While some think there is a distinction between feeling happy and feeling content, still happiness is a good and pleasant feeling. However, ‘happiness’ has a secondary sense that does not focus on feelings but rather on activities. For instance, one might say, “It was a happy time in my life; my work was going well.” The speaker need not be referring to the feelings he or she was experiencing but just to the fact that some important activity was going well. Of course, if their work is going well, they might feel contentment. But in speaking of their happiness, they might just as well be referring to their absorption in some successful activity. For ancient philosophers eudaimonia is closer to the secondary sense of our own term. Happiness means not so much feeling a certain way, or feeling a certain way about how one’s life as a whole is going, but rather carrying out certain activities or functioning in a certain way. This sort of happiness is an admirable and praiseworthy accomplishment, whereas achieving satisfaction or contentment may not be.
In this way, then, ancient philosophers typically justify moral virtue. Being courageous, just, and moderate is valuable for the virtuous person because these virtues are inextricably linked with happiness. Everyone wants to be happy, so anyone who realizes the link between virtue and happiness will also want to be virtuous. This argument depends on two central ideas. First, human excellence is a good of the soul – not a material or bodily good such as wealth or political power. Another way to put this idea is to say happiness is not something external, like wealth or political power, but an internal, psychological good. The second central idea is that the most important good of the soul is moral virtue. By being virtuous one enjoys a psychological state whose value outweighs whatever other kinds of goods one might have by being vicious.
Finally, a few words about the soul are in order since, typically, philosophers argue that virtue is a good of the soul. In some ways, this claim is found in many traditions. Many thinkers argue that being moral does not necessarily provide physical beauty, health, or prosperity. Rather, as something good, virtue must be understood as belonging to the soul; it is a psychological good. However, in order to explain virtue as a good of the soul, one does not have to hold that the soul is immortal. While Plato, for example, holds that the soul is immortal and that its virtue is a good that transcends death, his argument for virtue as a psychological good does not depend on the immortality of the soul. He argues that virtue is a psychological good in this life. To live a mortal human life with this good is in itself happiness.
This position that links happiness and virtue is called eudaimonism – a word based on the principal Greek word for happiness, eudaimonia. By eudaimonism, we will mean one of several theses: (a) virtue, together with its active exercise, is identical with happiness; (b) virtue, together with its activities, is the most important and dominant constituent of happiness; (c) virtue is the only means to happiness. However, one must be cautious not to conclude that ancient theories in general attempt to construe the value of virtue simply as a means to achieving happiness. Each theory, as we shall see, has its own approach to the nature of the link between virtue and happiness. It would not be advisable to see ancient theories as concerned with such contemporary issues as whether moral discourse – i.e., discourse about what one ought to do – can or should be reduced to non-moral discourse – i.e., to discourse about what is good for one.
These reflections on virtue can provide an occasion for contrasting ancient moral theory and modern. One way to put the contrast is to say that ancient moral theory is agent-centered while modern moral theory is action-centered. To say that it is action-centered means that, as a theory of morality, it explains morality, to begin with, in terms of actions and their circumstances, and the ways in which actions are moral or immoral. We can roughly divide modern thinkers into two groups. Those who judge the morality of an action on the basis of its known or expected consequences are consequentialist; those who judge the morality of an action on the basis of its conformity to certain kinds of laws, prohibitions, or positive commandments are deontologists. The former include, e.g., those utilitarians who say an action is moral if it provides the greatest good for the greatest number. Deontologists say an action is moral if it conforms to a moral principle, e.g., the obligation to tell the truth. While these thinkers are not uninterested in the moral disposition to produce such actions, or in what disposition is required if they are to show any moral worth in the persons who do them, their focus is on actions, their consequences, and the rules or other principles to which they conform. The result of these ways of approaching morality is that moral assessment falls on actions. This focus explains, for instance, contemporary fascination with such questions of casuistry as, e.g., the conditions under which an action like abortion is morally permitted or immoral.
By contrast, ancient moral theory explains morality in terms that focus on the moral agent. These thinkers are interested in what constitutes, e.g., a just person. They are concerned about the state of mind and character, the set of values, the attitudes to oneself and to others, and the conception of one’s own place in the common life of a community that belong to just persons simply insofar as they are just. A modern might object that this way of proceeding is backwards. Just actions are logically prior to just persons and must be specifiable in advance of any account of what it is to be a just person. Of course, the ancients had a rough idea of what just actions were; and this rough idea certainly contributed to the notion of a just person, and his motivation and system of values. Still, the notion of a just person is not exhausted by an account of the consequences of just actions, or any principle for determining which actions are and which are not just. For the ancients, the just person is compared to a craftsman, e.g., a physician. Acting as a physician is not simply a collection of medically effective actions. It is knowing when such actions are appropriate, among other things; and this kind of knowledge is not always definable. To understand what being a physician means one must turn to the physician’s judgment and even motivation. These are manifested in particular actions but are not reducible to those actions. In the same way, what constitutes a just person is not exhausted by the actions he or she does nor, for that matter, by any catalogue of possible just actions. Rather, being a just person entails qualities of character proper to the just person, in the light of which they decide what actions justice requires of them and are inclined or disposed to act accordingly.
In this section we confine ourselves to the character Socrates in Plato’s dialogues, and indeed to only certain ones of the dialogues in which a Socrates character plays a role. In those dialogues in which he plays a major role, Socrates varies considerably between two extremes. On the one hand, there is the Socrates who claims to know nothing about virtue and confines himself to asking other characters questions; this Socrates is found in the Apology and in certain dialogues most of which end inconclusively. These dialogues, e.g., Charmides, Laches, Crito, Euthydemus, and Euthyphro, are called aporetic. On the other hand, in other dialogues we find a Socrates who expounds positive teachings about virtue; this Socrates usually asks questions only to elicit agreement. These dialogues are didactic, and conclusive in tone, e.g., Republic, Phaedo, Phaedrus, and Philebus. However, these distinctions between kinds of dialogues and kinds of Socratic characters are not exclusive; there are dialogues that mix the aporetic and conclusive styles, e.g., Protagoras, Meno, and Gorgias. In observing these distinctions, we refer only to the characteristic style of the dialogue and leave aside controversies about the relative dates of composition of the dialogues. (See the entry on Plato, especially the section on Socrates and the section on the historical Socrates.)
The significance of this distinction among dialogues is that one can isolate a strain of moral teaching in the aporetic and mixed dialogues. In spite of their inconclusive nature, in the aporetic dialogues the character Socrates maintains principles about morality that he seems to take to be fundamental. In the mixed dialogues we find similar teaching. This strain is distinct enough from the accounts of morality in the more didactic dialogues that it has been called Socratic, as opposed to Platonic, and associated with the historical personage’s own views. In what follows we limit ourselves to this “Socratic” moral teaching – without taking a position about the relation of “Socratic” moral teaching to that of the historical Socrates. For our purposes it is sufficient to point out a distinction between kinds of moral teaching in the dialogues. We will focus on the aporetic dialogues as well as the mixed dialogues Protagoras, Gorgias, and Meno.
The first feature of Socratic teaching is its heroic quality. In the Apology, Socrates says that a man worth anything at all does not reckon whether his course of action endangers his life or threatens death. He looks only at one thing – whether what he does is just or not, the work of a good or of a bad man (28b–c). Said in the context of his trial, this statement is both about himself and a fundamental claim of his moral teaching. Socrates puts moral considerations above all others. If we think of justice as, roughly, the way we treat others, the just actions to which he refers cover a wide range. It is unjust to rob temples, betray friends, steal, break oaths, commit adultery, and mistreat parents (Rep 443a–b). A similarly strong statement about wrong-doing is found in the Crito, where the question is whether Socrates should save his life by escaping from the jail in Athens and aborting the sentence of death. Socrates says that whether he should escape or not must be governed only by whether it is just or unjust to do so (48d). Obviously, by posing wrong-doing against losing one’s life, Socrates means to emphasize that nothing outweighs in positive value the disvalue of doing unjust actions. In such passages, then, Socrates seems to be a moral hero, willing to sacrifice his very life rather than commit an injustice, and to recommend such heroism to others.
However, this heroism also includes an important element of self-regard. In the passage from the Apology just quoted Socrates goes on to describe his approach to the citizens of Athens. He chides them for being absorbed in the acquisition of wealth, reputation, and honor while they do not take care for nor think about wisdom, truth, and how to make their souls better (Ap. 29d–e). As he develops this idea it becomes clear that the perfection of the soul, making it better, means acquiring and having moral virtue. Rather than heaping up riches and honor, Athenians should seek to perfect their souls in virtue. From this exhortation we can conclude that for Socrates psychological good outweighs material good and that virtue is a psychological good of the first importance. The Crito gives another perspective on psychological good. Socrates says (as something obvious to everyone) that life is not worth living if that which is harmed by disease and benefited by health – i.e., the body – is ruined. But even more so, he adds, life is not worth living if that which is harmed by wrong-doing (to adikon) and benefited by the right – sc. the soul – is ruined, insofar as the soul is more valuable than the body (47e–48a). We can understand this claim in positive terms. Virtue is the chief psychological good; wrong-doing destroys virtue. So Socrates’ strong commitment to virtue reflects his belief in its value for the soul, as well as the importance of the soul’s condition for the quality of our lives.
A second feature of Socratic teaching is its intellectualism. Socratic intellectualism is usually expressed in the claim that virtue is knowledge, implying that if one knows what is good one will do what is good. We find a clear statement of the claim in Protagoras 352c; but it underlies a lot of Socratic teaching. The idea is paradoxical because it flies in the face of what seems to be the ordinary experience of knowingly doing what is not good, called akrasia or being overcome (sometimes anachronistically translated as weakness of will). However, Socrates defends the idea that akrasia is impossible. First, he argues that virtue is all one needs for happiness. In the Apology (41c), Socrates says that no evil at all can come to a good man either in living or in dying (…ouk esti andri agathô(i) kakon ouden oute zônti oute teleutêsanti), implying the good man’s virtue alone makes him proof against bad fortune. In the Crito (48b), he says living well and finely and justly are the same thing (to de eu kai kalôs kai dikaiôs [zên] hoti tauton estin…). In turn, in the Meno (77c–78b), Socrates argues that everyone desires happiness, i.e., one’s own welfare. So, in the first place, one always has a good reason for acting virtuously; doing so entails one’s own happiness. However, even if the link between virtue and happiness is granted, another problem remains. It is possible that one can, knowingly, act against one’s happiness, understood, as it is by Socrates, as one’s own welfare. It seems that an individual can choose to do what is not in her own best interest. People can all too easily desire and go after the pastry that they know is bad for them. Socrates, however, seems to think that once one recognizes (i.e., really knows and fully appreciates) that the pastry is not good in this way, one will cease to desire it. There is no residual desire for, e.g., pleasure, that might compete with the desire for what is good. This position is called intellectualism because it implies that what ultimately motivates any action is some cognitive state, rational or doxastic: if you know what is good you will do it, and if you do an action, and it is bad, that is because you thought somehow that it was good. All error in such choices is due to ignorance.
In support of the idea that if one knows what happiness is, one will pursue it, Socrates argues, in the Euthydemus, that wisdom is necessary and sufficient for happiness. While most of this dialogue is given over to Euthydemus’ and Dionysiodorus’ eristic display, there are two Socratic interludes. In the first of these – in a passage that has a parallel in Meno (88a ff) – Socrates helps the young Cleinias to see that wisdom is a kind of knowledge that infallibly brings happiness. He uses an analogy with craft (technê); a carpenter must not only have but know how to use his tools and materials to be successful (Euthyd. 280b–d). In turn, someone may have such goods as health, wealth, good birth, and beauty, as well as the virtues of justice, moderation, courage, and wisdom (279a–c). Wisdom is the most important, however, because, like carpentry, for example, it is a kind of knowledge, about how to use the other assets so that they are beneficial (281b–c). Moreover, all of these other so-called goods are useless – in fact, even harmful – without wisdom, because without it one will misuse any of the other assets one may possess, so as to act not well but badly. Wisdom is the only unconditional good (281d–e). Socrates’ argument leaves it ambiguous whether wisdom (taken together with its exercise) is identical with happiness or whether it is the dominant and essential component of happiness (282a–b).
In this account, the focus is on a kind of knowledge as the active ingredient in happiness. The other parts of the account are certain assets that seem as passive in relation to wisdom as wood and tools are to the carpenter. Socratic intellectualism has been criticized for either ignoring the non-rational, desiderative and volitional causes of human action or providing an implausibly rationalist account of them. In either case, the common charge is that it fails to account for or appreciate the apparent complexities of moral psychology.
If the objections to intellectualism are warranted, Plato makes significant progress by having his character Socrates suppose that the soul has desires that are not always for what is good. This allows for the complexities of moral psychology to become an important issue in the account of virtue. That development is found in Plato’s mature moral theory. In the Republic, especially in its first four books, Socrates presents the most thorough and detailed account of moral psychology and virtue in the dialogues.
It all begins with the challenge to the very notion of morality, understood along traditional lines, mounted by Callicles in the second half of the Gorgias and by Thrasymachus in Republic I. Callicles thinks that moral convention is designed by the numerous weak people to intimidate the few strong ones, to keep the latter from taking what they could if they would only use their strength. No truly strong person should be taken in by such conventions (Gorg. 482e ff). Thrasymachus argues that justice is the advantage of the more powerful; he holds that justice is a social practice set up by the powerful, i.e., rulers who require their subjects through that practice to act against their own individual and group self-interest (Rep. 338d ff). No sensible person should, and no strong-willed person would, accept rules of justice as having any legitimate authority over them. In answer to the latter challenge, in Republic II, Glaucon and Adeimantus repeatedly urge Socrates to show what value justice has in itself, apart from its rewards and reputation. They gloss the intrinsic value of justice as what value it has in the soul (358b–c), what it does to the soul simply and immediately by its presence therein. Before giving what will be a new account of the soul, Socrates introduces his famous comparison between the soul and the city. As he develops his account of the city, however, it becomes clear that Socrates is talking about an ideal city, which he proceeds to construct in his discussion.
This city has three classes (genê) of citizens. The rulers are characterized by their knowledge about and devotion to the welfare of the city. The auxiliaries are the warrior class that helps the rulers. These two are collectively the guardians of the city (413c–414b; 428c–d). Finally, there are the farmers, artisans, and merchants – in general those concerned with the production of material goods necessary for daily life (369b–371e). The importance of this structure is that it allows Socrates to define virtues of the city by relations among its parts. These virtues are justice, wisdom, courage, and moderation. For instance, justice in the city is each one performing that function for which he is suited by nature and not doing the work that belongs to others (433a–b). One’s function, in turn, is determined by the class to which he belongs. So rulers should rule and not amass wealth, which is the function of the farmers, artisans, and merchants; if the rulers turn from ruling to money-making they are unjust.
Completing the analogy, Socrates gives an account of the soul. He argues that it has three parts, each corresponding to one of the classes in the city. At this point, we should note the difficulty of talking about parts of the soul. In making his argument about conflict in the soul, Socrates does not usually use a word that easily corresponds to the English ‘part.’ Sometimes he uses ‘form’ (eidos) and ‘kind’ (genos) (435b–c), other times a periphrasis such as ‘that in the soul that calculates’ (439d–e), although in the subsequent account of virtue, we do find meros, which means part (442b–d). So, insofar as vocabulary is concerned, one should be cautious about taking the subdivisions of the soul to be independant agents. Perhaps the least misleading way of thinking about the parts is as distinct functions. Reason is the function of calculating, especially about what is good for the soul. The appetites for food, drink, and sex are like the producing class – they are necessary for bodily existence (439c–e). These two parts are familiar to the modern reader, who will recognize the psychological capacity for reasoning and calculating, on the one hand, and the bodily desires, on the other. Less familiar is the part of the soul that corresponds to the auxiliaries, the military class. This is the spirited part (thymos or thymoeides). Associated with the heart, it is an aggressive drive concerned with honor. Thumos is manifested as anger with those who attack one’s honor. Perhaps more importantly, it is manifested as anger with oneself when failing to do what one knows he should do (439e–440d).
The importance of this account is that it is a moral psychology, an account of the soul which serves as a basis for explaining the virtues. Socrates’ account also introduces the idea that there is conflict in the soul. For instance, the appetites can lead one toward pleasure which reason recognizes is not good for the whole soul. In cases of conflict, Socrates says the spirited part sides with reason against appetite. Here we see in rough outline the chief characters in a well-known moral drama. Reason knows what is good both for oneself and in the treatment of others. The appetites, short-sighted and self-centered, pull in the opposite direction. The spirited part is the principle that sides with reason and enforces its decrees.
While the opposition between reason and appetite establishes their distinctness, it has another, more profound consequence. Most commentators read this section of the argument as implying that reason looks out for what is good for the soul while appetite seeks food, drink, and sex, heedless of their benefit for the soul (437d ff). Although open to various interpretations, the difference between reason and appetite does seem aimed at one of the central paradoxes of Socratic intellectualism. Common experience seems to contradict the claim that if one knows what is good he will do it; there seem to be obvious instances where someone does what she, in some sense, knows is not good, while having options to act otherwise. By introducing non-rational elements in the soul, the argument in the Republic also introduces the possibility of doing what one knows, all things considered, not to be good. In such cases, one is motivated by appetite, which lacks the capacity to conceive of what is good, all things considered.
Some interpret this heedlessness as appetite’s being good-independent, whereas reason is good-dependent. Thus, appetite pursues what it pursues without reference to whether what it pursues is good; reason pursues what it pursues always understanding that what it pursues is good. In this kind of interpretation, Socrates in the Republic accepts the possibility of akrasia because some parts of the soul, which are indifferent to the good, can motivate actions that do not aim at what is good. Others interpret this heedlessness as appetite’s operating on a constrained notion of good; for instance, for appetite only pleasure is good. By contrast, reason operates on a larger notion, i.e., what is good, all things considered. In this interpretation, akrasia is also possible, but now because some parts of the soul, which motivate action, do so with a constrained view of good. In any event, the stage is set for conflict in the soul between reason and appetite. If we assume that either can motive action on its own, the possibility exists for the soul’s pursuing bodily pleasure in spite of reason’s determination that doing so is not good, all things considered. This potential gives rise to a separate strain of thinking about virtue. While, for Socratic intellectualism, virtue just is knowledge, in the aftermath of the argument for subdividing the soul, virtue comes to have two aspects. The first is to acquire the knowledge which is the basis of virtue; the second is to instill in the appetites and emotions – which cannot grasp the knowledge – a docility so that they react in a compliant way to what reason knows to be the best thing to do. Thus, non-rational parts of the soul acquire reliable habits on which the moral virtues depend.
Given the complexity of the differences among the parts, we can now understand how their relations to one another define virtue in the soul. Virtue reduces the potential for conflict to harmony. The master virtue, justice, is each part doing its function and not interfering with that of another (441d–e; 443d). Since the function of reason is to exercise forethought for the whole soul, it should rule. The appetites, which seek only their immediate satisfaction, should not rule. A soul ruled by appetites is the very picture of psychological injustice. Still, to fulfill its function of ruling, reason needs wisdom, the knowledge of what is beneficial for each of the parts of the soul and for the whole. Moderation is a harmony among the parts based on agreement that reason should rule. Courage is the spirited part carrying out the decrees of reason about what is to be feared (442b–d). Any attentive reader of the dialogues must feel that Socrates has now given an answer to the questions that started many of the aporetic dialogues. At this point, we have the fully developed moral psychology that allows the definition of the moral virtues. They fall into place around the tripartite structure of the soul.
One might object, however, that all Socrates has accomplished is to define justice and the other virtues as they operate within the soul. While each part treats the others justly, so to speak, it is not clear what justice among the parts of someone’s soul has to do with that person treating other people justly. Socrates at first addresses this issue rather brusquely, saying that someone with a just soul would not embezzle funds, rob temples, steal, betray friends, break oaths, commit adultery, neglect parents, nor ignore the gods. The reason for this is that each part in the soul does its own function in the matter of ruling and being ruled (443a–b). Socrates does not explain this connection between psychic harmony and moral virtue. However, if we assume that injustice is based in overweening appetite or unbridled anger, then one can see the connection between restrained appetites, well-governed anger and treating others justly. The man whose sexual appetite is not governed by reason, e.g., would commit the injustice of adultery.
This approach to the virtues by way of moral psychology, in fact, proves to be remarkably durable in ancient moral theory. In one way or another, the various schools attempt to explain the virtues in terms of the soul, although there are, of course, variations in the accounts. Indeed, we can treat the theory of the Republic as one such variation. While the account in Republic IV has affinities with that of Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics, for instance, further developments in Republic V–VII make Plato’s overall account altogether unique. It is in these books that the theory of forms makes its appearance.
In Republic V, Socrates returns to the issue of political rule by asking what change in actual cities would bring the ideal city closer to realization. The famous answer is that philosophers should rule as kings (473d). Trying to make the scandalous, even ridiculous, answer more palatable, Socrates immediately begins to explain what he means by philosophers. They are the ones who can distinguish between the many beautiful things and the one beautiful itself. The beautiful itself, the good itself, and the just itself are what he calls forms. The ability to understand such forms defines the philosopher (476a–c). Fully elaborated, this extraordinary theory holds that there is a set of unchanging and unambiguous entities, collectively referred to as being. These are known directly by reason in a way that is separate from the use of sensory perception. The objects of sensory perception are collectively referred to as becoming since they are changing and ambiguous (508d). This infallible grasp means that one knows what goodness is, what beauty is, and what justice is. Because only philosophers have this knowledge – an infallible grasp of goodness, beauty, and justice – they and only they are fit to be rulers in the city.
While moral theory occupies a significant portion of the Republic, Socrates does not say a lot about its relation to the epistemology and metaphysics of the central books. For instance, one might have expected the account to show how, e.g., reason might use knowledge of the forms to govern the other parts of the soul. Indeed, in Book VI, Socrates does say that the philosopher will imitate in his own soul the order and harmony of the forms out of admiration (500c–d). Since imitation is the heart of the account of moral education in Books II–III, the idea that one might imitate forms is intriguing; but it is not developed. In fact, the relation between virtues in the soul and the metaphysics and epistemology of the forms is not an easy one. For instance, Socrates says that virtue in the soul is happiness (580b–c). However, he also says that knowledge and contemplation of the forms is happiness (517c–d). Since having or exercising the virtues of wisdom, moderation, courage, and justice is different from knowledge and contemplation of forms, the questions naturally arises about how to bring the two together into an integrated life. In the dialogues, the relation between knowledge of forms and virtues such as moderation, justice, and courage is an issue that never seems to be fully resolved because it receives different treatments.
In RepublicIX, Socrates offers a sketch of one way to bring these two dimensions together. Toward the end of the book, Socrates conducts a three-part contest to show the philosophical, or aristocratic, man is the happiest. In the second of these contests, he claims that each part of the soul has its peculiar desire and corresponding pleasure. Reason, for instance, desires to learn; satisfying that desire is a pleasure distinct from the pleasure, e.g., of eating (580d–e). One can now see that the functions of each of the parts has a new, affective dimension. Then, in the last of the contests, Socrates makes an ontological distinction between true pleasure of the soul and less true pleasure of the body. The former is the pleasure of knowing being, i.e., the forms, and the latter is the pleasure of filling bodily appetite. The less true pleasures also give rise to illusions and phantoms of pleasure; these illusions and phantoms recall the images and shadows in the allegory of the cave (583b–586c). Clearly, then, distinctions from the metaphysics and epistemology of the central books are being made relevant to the divisions within the soul. Pleasures of reason are on a higher ontological level than those of the bodily appetites; this difference calls for a modification of the definitions of the virtues from Book IV. For instance, in Book IV, justice is each part fulfilling its own function; in Book IX, that function is specified in terms of the kinds of pleasure each part pursues. Reason pursues the true pleasure of knowing and the appetites the less true pleasure of the body. Appetite commits injustice if it pursues pleasure not proper to it, i.e., if it pursues bodily pleasures as though they were true pleasures (586d–587a). The result is an account of virtue which discriminates among pleasures, as any virtue ethics should; but the criterion of discrimination reflects the distinction between being and becoming. Rational pleasures are more real than bodily pleasures, although bodily pleasures are not negligible. Happiness, in turn, integrates the virtue of managing bodily appetites and pleasures with the pleasures of learning, but definitely gives greater weight to the latter.
However, in the Phaedo, we find another approach to the relation between knowledge of forms and virtues in the soul. Socrates identifies wisdom with kowledge of such forms as beauty, justice, and goodness (65d–e). The philosopher can know these only by reason that is detached from the body as much as possible (65e–66a). In fact, pure knowledge is found only when the soul is completely detached from the body in death. With such a severe account of the knowledge of the forms it is not surprising that courage, justice, and moderation are subordinated to wisdom. When Socrates says the true exchange of pleasures, pains, and fears is for wisdom, he invokes moderation, justice, and courage as virtues that serve this exchange (68b–69e). This passage suggests, for instance, that moderation would control bodily pleasures and pains and fears so that reason could be free of these disturbances in order to pursue knowledge. This notion of virtues differs from the account in the first books of the Republic in that the latter presents a comprehensive picture of the welfare of all the parts of the soul whereas the Phaedo, by implication, subordinates to reason those parts characterized by pleasures, pain, and fears.
In the Symposium, we find yet another configuration of the relation between virtue and the forms, in which the non-rational parts of the soul disappear – or are sublimated. In Diotima’s discourse on eros, she argues that the real purpose of love is to give birth in beauty (206b–c). This idea implies two dimensions: inspiration by what is itself beautiful and producing beautiful objects. Although Diotima talks about the way these concepts work in sexual procreation, her real interest is in their psychological manifestations. For instance, the lover, inspired by the physical beauty of the beloved, will produce beautiful ideas. In turn, the beauty of a soul will inspire ideas that will improve young men (210a–d). Finally, Diotima claims that the true object of erotic love is not the beautiful body or even the beautiful soul – but beauty itself. Unlike the beauty of bodies and of souls, this beauty does not come to be nor pass away, neither increases nor decreases. Nor does it vary according to aspect or context. It is not in a face or hands but is itself by itself, one in form (211a–c). Since this paradigm of beauty is the true object of eros, it inspires its own particular product, i.e., true virtue, distinct from the images of virtue inspired by encounters with beauty in bodies and souls (212a–c). While this passage highlights the relation between eros and the form of beauty in motivating virtue, it is almost silent on what this virtue might be. We do not know whether it just is the expression of love of beauty in the lover’s actions, or its concretization in the dispositions of the lover’s soul, or another manifestation. Clearly, this account in the Symposium works without the elaborate theory about parts of the soul and their function in virtue, found in Republic I–IV.
As with other ancient theories, this account of virtue can be called eudaimonist. Plato’s theory is best represented as holding that virtue, together with its active exercise, is the most important and the dominant constituent of happiness (580b–c). One might object that eudaimonist theories reduce morality to self-interest. We should recall however that eudaimonia in this theory does not refer primarily to a feeling. In the Republic, it refers to a state of the soul, and the active life to which it leads, whose value is multifaceted. The order and harmony of the soul is, of course, good for the soul because it provides what is good for each of the parts and the whole, and so makes the parts function well, for the benefit of each and of the whole person. In this way, the soul has the best internal economy, so to speak. Still, we should not overlook the ways in which order and harmony in the soul are paired with order and harmony in the city. They are both modeled on the forms. As a consequence, virtue in the soul is not a private concern artificially joined to the public function of ruling. Rather, the philosopher who imitates forms in ruling her soul is equally motivated to imitate forms in ruling the city. So, insofar as virtue consists in imitating the forms, it is also a state of the soul best expressed by exercising rule in the city – or at least in the ideal city. Eudaimonia, then, includes looking after the welfare of others.
Indeed, the very nature of Plato’s account of virtue and happiness leaves some aspects of the link between the two unclear. While virtue is the dominant factor in happiness, we still cannot tell whether for Plato one can have a reason for being, e.g., courageous that does not depend directly on happiness. Plato, even though he has forged a strong link between virtue and happiness, has not addressed such issues. In his account, it is still possible that one might be courageous just for its own sake while at the same time believing courage is also reliably linked to happiness. In the Republic, Socrates tries to answer the question what value justice has by itself in the soul; it does not follow that he is trying to convince Glaucon and Adeimantus that the value of justice is exhausted by its connection to one’s own happiness.
(For further developments in Plato’s moral theory in dialogues usually thought to postdate the Republic (especially Philebus), see Plato entry, especially the section on Socrates and the section on Plato’s indirectness.)
The moral theory of Aristotle, like that of Plato, focuses on virtue, recommending the virtuous way of life by its relation to happiness. His most important ethical work, Nicomachean Ethics, devotes the first book to a preliminary account of happiness, which is then completed in the last chapters of the final book, Book X. This account ties happiness to excellent activity of the soul. In subsequent books, excellent activity of the soul is tied to the moral virtues and to the virtue of “practical wisdom” – excellence in thinking and deciding about how to behave. This approach to moral theory depends on a moral psychology that shares a number of affinities with Plato’s. However, while for Plato the theory of forms has a role in justifying virtue, Aristotle notoriously rejects that theory. Aristotle grounds his account of virtue in his theory about the soul – a topic to which he devotes a separate treatise, de Anima.
Aristotle opens the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics by positing some one supreme good as the aim of human actions, investigations, and crafts (1094a). Identifying this good as happiness, he immediately notes the variations in the notion (1095a15–25). Some think the happy life is the life of enjoyment; the more refined think it is the life of political activity; others think it is the life of study or theoretical contemplation (1095b10–20). The object of the life of enjoyment is bodily pleasure; that of political activity is honor or even virtue. The object of the life of study is philosophical or scientific understanding. Arguing that the end of human life must be the most complete, he concludes that happiness is the most complete end. Whereas pleasure, honor, virtue, and understanding are choice-worthy in themselves, they are also chosen for the sake of happiness. Happiness is not chosen for the sake of anything else (1097a25–1097b5). That the other choice-worthy ends are chosen for the sake of happiness might suggest that they are chosen only as instrumental means to happiness, as though happiness were a separate state. However, it is more likely that the other choice-worthy ends are constituents of happiness. As a consequence, the happy life is composed of such activities as virtuous pursuits, honorable acts, and contemplation of truth. While conceiving these choice-worthy ends as constituents of happiness might be illuminating, it does, in turn, raise the issue of whether happiness is a jumble of activities or whether it requires organization – even prioritization – of the constituents.
Next, Aristotle turns to his own account of happiness, the summit of Book I. The account depends on an analogy with the notion of function or characteristic activity or work (ergon). A flutist has a function or work, i.e., playing the flute. The key idea for Aristotle is that the good of flute players (as such) is found in their functioning as a flutist. By analogy, if there is a human function, the good for a human is found in this function (1097b20–30). Aristotle then turns to the human soul. He argues that, in fact, there is a human function, to be found in the human soul’s characteristic activity, i.e., the exercise of reason (1098a1–20). Then, without explanation, he makes the claim that this rational function is expressed in two distinct ways: by deliberating and issuing commands, on the one hand, and by obeying such commands, on the other. The part that has reason in itself deliberates about decisions, both for the short term and the long. The part that obeys reason is that aspect of the soul, such as the appetites, that functions in a human being under the influence of reason. The appetites can fail to obey reason; but they at least have the capacity to obey (as, for example, such autonomic functions as nutritive and metabolic ones do not).
Aristotle then argues that since the function of a human is to exercise the soul’s activities according to reason, the function of a good human is to exercise well and finely the soul’s activities according to reason. Given the two aspects of reason that Aristotle has distinguished, one can see that both can be well or badly done. On the one hand, one can reason well or badly – about what to do within the next five minutes, twenty-four hours, or ten years. On the other, actions motivated by appetites can be well or badly done, and likewise having an appetite at all can sometimes not be a well done, but a badly done, activity of the soul. Acting on the desire for a drink from the wine cooler at a banquet is not always a good idea, nor is having such a desire. According to Aristotle, the good human being has a soul in which these functions are consistently done well. Thus, good persons reason well about plans, short term or long; and when they satisfy their appetites, and even when they have appetites, it is in conformity with reason. Returning to the question of happiness, Aristotle says the good for a human is to live the way the good human lives, that is, to live with one’s life aimed at and structured by the same thing that the good human being aims at in his or her life. So, his account of happiness, i.e., the highest good for a human, is virtuous or excellent activity of the soul. But he has not identified this virtuous activity with that of the moral virtues, at this point. In fact, he says if there are many kinds of excellence, then human good is found in the active exercise of the highest. He is careful to point out that happiness is not just the ability to function well in this way; it is the activity itself. Moreover, this activity must be carried out for a complete life. One swallow does not make a spring.
Although the reference here to parts or aspects of the soul is cursory, it is influenced by Aristotle’s theories in the de Anima. Fundamental to the human soul and to all living things, including plants, is nutrition and growth (415a20 ff). Next is sensation and locomotion; these functions are characteristic of animals (416b30 ff). Aristotle associates appetite and desire with this part of the soul (414b1–5). Thus we have a rough sketch of animal life: animals, moved by appetite for food, go toward the objects of desire, which are discerned by sensation. To these functions is added thought in the case of humans. Thought is both theoretical and practical (427a 15–20). The bulk of the de Anima is devoted to explaining the nutritive, sensory, and rational functions; Aristotle considers desire and appetite as the source of movement in other animals (432a15 ff), and these plus reason as its source in humans. In Nicomachean Ethics he focuses on the role that appetite and desire, together with reason, play in the moral drama of human life.
In chapter 8 of Book I, Aristotle explicitly identifies human good with psychological good. Dividing goods into external goods, those of the body, and those of the soul, he states that his account of happiness agrees with those who hold it is a good of the soul. In fact, in this account, happiness is closely related to traditionally conceived psychological goods such as pleasure and moral virtue, although the nature of the relation has yet to be shown (1098b10–30). Still, in Book I Aristotle is laying the foundation in his moral psychology for showing the link between the moral virtues and happiness. In Book II he completes this foundation when he turns to the question of which condition of the soul is to be identified with (moral) virtue, or virtue of character.
In II. 5, he says that conditions of the soul are either feelings (pathê), capacities for feeling (dynameis) or dispositions (hexeis). Feelings are such things as appetite, anger, fear and generally those conditions that are accompanied by pleasure and pain. Capacities are, for example, the simple capacity to have these feelings. Finally, disposition is that condition of the soul whereby we are well or badly off with respect to feelings. For instance, people are badly disposed with respect to anger who typically get angry violently or who typically get angry weakly (1105b20–30). Virtue, as a condition of the soul, will be one of these three. After arguing that virtue is neither feeling nor capacity, Aristotle turns to what it means to be well or badly off with respect to feelings. He says that in everything that is continuous and divisible it is possible to take more, less, or an equal amount (1106a25). This remark is puzzling until we realize that he is actually talking about feelings. Feelings are continuous and divisible; so one can take more, less, or an equal amount of them. Presumably, when it comes to feeling anger, e.g., one can feel too much, not enough, or a balanced amount. Aristotle thinks that what counts as too much, not enough, or a balanced amount can vary to some extent from individual to individual. At this point he is ready to come back to moral virtue for it is concerned with feelings and actions (to which feelings give rise), in which one can have excess, deficiency, or the mean. To have a feeling like anger at the right time, on the right occasion, towards the right people, for the right purpose and in the right manner is to feel the right amount, the mean between extremes of excess and deficiency; this is the mark of moral virtue (1106a15–20). Finally, virtue is not a question only of feelings since there is a mean between extremes of action. Presumably, Aristotle means that the appropriate feeling – the mean between the extremes in each situation – gives rise to the appropriate action.
At last Aristotle is ready to discuss particular moral virtues. Beginning with courage, he mentions here two feelings, fear and confidence. An excessive disposition to confidence is rashness and an excessive disposition to fear and a deficiency in confidence is cowardice. When it comes to certain bodily pleasures and pains, the mean is moderation. While the excess is profligacy, deficiency in respect of pleasures almost never occurs. Aristotle gives a fuller account of both of these virtues in Book III; however, the basic idea remains. The virtue in each case is a mean between two extremes, the extremes being vices. Virtue, then, is a reliable disposition whereby one reacts in relevant situations with the appropriate feeling – neither excessive nor deficient – and acts in the appropriate way – neither excessively nor deficiently.
To complete the notion of moral virtue we must consider the role reason plays in moral actions. Summing up at Book II.6, Aristotle says virtue is a disposition to choose, lying in the mean which is relative to us, determined by reason (1107a1). Since he is talking about choosing actions, he is focusing on the way moral virtue issues in actions. In turn, it is the role of practical wisdom (phronêsis) to determine choice. While moral virtues, virtues of character, belong to the part of the soul which can obey reason, practical wisdom is a virtue of the part of the soul that itself reasons. The virtues of thought, intellectual virtues, are knowledge (epistêmê), comprehension (nous), wisdom (sophia), craft (technê), and practical wisdom (1139b15–25). The first three grasp the truth about what cannot be otherwise and is not contingent. A good example of knowledge about what cannot be otherwise is mathematics. Craft and practical wisdom pursue the truth that can be had about what can be otherwise and is contingent. What can be otherwise includes what is made – the province of craft – and what is done – the province of practical wisdom (1140a1). While Aristotle’s account of practical wisdom raises several problems, we will focus on only two closely related issues. He says that it is the mark of someone with practical wisdom to deliberate well about what leads to the good for himself (to dunasthai kalôs bouleusasthai peri ta hautô(i) agatha). This good is not specific, such as health and strength, but is living well in general (1140a25–30). This description of practical wisdom, first of all, implies that it deliberates about actions; it is a skill for discerning those actions which hit the mean between the two extremes. However, the ambiguity of the phrase ‘what leads to the good’ might suggest that practical wisdom deliberates only about instrumental means to living well. Still since practical wisdom determines which actions hit the mean between two extremes, such actions are not instrumental means to living well – as though living well were a separate state. Actions which hit the mean are parts of living well; the good life is composed of actions under the headings of, for instance, honor and pleasure, which achieve the mean. In addition, the deliberation of practical wisdom does not have to be confined to determining which actions hit the mean. While Aristotle would deny that anyone deliberates about whether happiness is the end of human life, we do deliberate about the constituents of happiness. So, one might well deliberate about the ways in which honor and pleasure fit into happiness.
Now we can discern the link between morality and happiness. While happiness itself is excellent or virtuous activity of the soul, moral virtue is a disposition to achieve the mean between two extremes in feeling and in action. The missing link is that achieving the mean is also excellent activity of the soul. Activity that expresses the virtue of courage, for example, is also the best kind of activity when it comes to the emotion of fear. Activity that expresses the virtue of moderation is also excellent activity when it comes to the bodily appetites. In this way, then, the happy person is also the virtuous person. However, in Book I Aristotle has already pointed out the problem of bodily and external goods in relation to happiness. Even if happiness is virtuous activity of the soul, in some cases these goods are needed to be virtuous – for example, one must have money to be generous. In fact, the lack of good birth, good children, and beauty can mar one’s happiness for the happy person does not appear to be one who is altogether ugly, low born, solitary, or childless, and even less so if he has friends and children who are bad, or good friends and children who then die (1099a30–1099b10). Aristotle is raising a problem that he does not attempt to solve in this passage. Even if happiness is virtuous activity of the soul, it does not confer immunity to the vicissitudes of life.
Aristotle’s moral psychology has further implications for his account of happiness. In Book I, chapter 7, he said that human good is virtuous activity of the soul but was indefinite about the virtues. In most of the Nicomachean Ethics he talks about the moral virtues, leaving the impression that virtuous activity is the same as activity associated with moral virtues. In Book X, however, Aristotle revisits the issue of virtuous activity. If happiness, he says, is activity in accordance with virtue, it will be activity in accordance with the highest. The highest virtue belongs to the best part of the soul, i.e., the intellect (nous) or the part that governs in the soul and contemplates the fine and godly, being itself the divine part of the soul or that which is closest to the divine (1177a10–20). Up to this point, Aristotle has apparently been talking about the man of political action and the happiness that is suitable to rational, embodied human beings. Active in the life of the city, this person exercises courage, moderation, liberality, and justice in the public arena. Now, instead of the life of an effective and successful citizen, Aristotle is holding up the life of study and contemplation as the one that achieves happiness – that is, the highest human good, the activity of the highest virtue. Such a life would achieve the greatest possible self-sufficiency and invulnerability (1177a30). Indeed, at first he portrays these two lives as so opposite that they seem incompatible.
In the end, however, he palliates the differences, leaving the possibility for some way to harmonize the two (1178a30). The differences between the two lives are rooted in the different aspects of the soul. Moral virtues belong to the appetites and desires of the sensory soul – the part obviously associated with the active political life, when its activities are brought under the guidance and control of excellent practical thought and judgment. The “highest” virtues, those belonging to the scientific or philosophical intellect, belong to theoretical reason. To concentrate on these activities one must be appropriately disengaged from active political life. While the latter description leads Aristotle to portray as possible a kind of human life that partakes of divine detachment (1178b5 ff), finally human life is an indissolvable composite of intellect, reason, sensation, desires, and appetites. For Aristotle, strictly speaking, happiness simply is the exercise of the highest virtues, those of theoretical reason and understanding. But even persons pursuing those activities as their highest good, and making them central to their lives, will need to remain connected to daily life, and even to political affairs in the community in which they live. Hence, they will possess and exercise the moral virtues and those of practical thought, as well as those other, higher, virtues, throughout their lives. Clearly, this conception of happiness does not hold all virtue, moral and intellectual, to be of equal value. Rather, Aristotle means the intellectual virtue of study and contemplation to be the dominant part of happiness. However, problems remains since we can understand dominance in two ways. In the first version, the activity of theoretical contemplation is the sole, exclusive component of happiness and the exercise of the moral virtues and practical wisdom is an instrumental means to happiness, but not integral to it. The problem with this version of dominance is that it undermines what Aristotle has said about the intrinsic value of the virtuous activity of politically and socially engaged human beings, including friendship. In a second version of dominance, we might understand contemplation to be the principal, but not exclusive, constituent of happiness. The problem with this version of dominance lies in integrating such apparently incompatible activities into a coherent life. If we give the proper weight to the divine good of theoretical contemplation it may leave us little interest in the virtuous pursuits of the moral goods arising from our political nature, except, again, as means for establishing and maintaining the conditions in which we may contemplate.
Like Plato, Aristotle is a eudaimonist in that he argues that virtue (including in some way the moral virtues of courage, justice and the rest) is the dominant and most important component of happiness. However, he is not claiming that the only reason to be morally virtuous is that moral virtue is a constituent of happiness. He says that we seek to have virtue and virtuous action for itself as well (Nicomachean Ethics, 1097b 1–10); not to do so is to fail even to be virtuous. In this regard, it is like pleasure, which is also a constituent of the happy life. Like pleasure, virtue is sought for its own sake. Still, as a constituent of happiness, virtuous action is grounded in the highest end for a human being. One can discern in the Nicomachean Ethics two different types of argument for the link between virtue and happiness. One is based on Aristotle’s account of human nature and culminates in the so-called function argument of Book I. If happiness is excellent or virtuous activity of the soul, the latter is understood by way of the uniquely human function. If one understands the human function then one can understand what it is for that function to be done excellently (1098a5–15). This sort of argument has been criticized because it moves from a premise about what humans are to a conclusion about what they ought to be. Such criticism reflects the modern claim that there is a fact-value distinction. One defense of Aristotle’s argument holds that his account of human nature is meant both to be objective and to offer the basis for an understanding of excellence. The difference, then, between modern moral theory and ancient is over what counts as an objective account of human nature. However, even if we accept this defense, we can still ask why a human would consider it good to achieve human excellence as it is defined in the function argument. At this point another argument for the link between happiness and virtue – one more dispersed in the text of the Nicomachean Ethics – becomes relevant; it is based on value terms only and appeals to what a human might consider it good to achieve. Aristotle describes virtuous activity of the soul as fine (kalos) and excellent (spoudaios). Finally, the link between virtue and happiness is forged if a human sees that it is good to live a life that one considers to be fine and excellent.
(For further detailed discussion, see entry on Aristotle’s ethics.)
Although the Cynics had an impact on moral thinking in Athens after the death of Socrates, it is through later, and highly controversial, reports of their deeds and sayings – rather than their writings – that we know of them. Diogenes the Cynic, the central figure, is famous for living in a wine jar (Diogenes Laertius [= DL] VI 23) and going about with a lantern looking for ‘a man’ – i.e., someone not corrupted (DL VI 41). He claimed to set courage over against fortune, nature against convention, and reason against passion (DL VI 38). Of this trio of opposites, the most characteristic for understanding the Cynics is nature against convention. Diogenes taught that a life according to nature was better than one that conformed to convention. First of all, natural life is simpler. Diogenes ate, slept, or conversed wherever it suited him and carried his food around with him (DL VI 22). When he saw a child drinking out of its hand, he threw away his cup, saying that a child had bested him in frugality (DL VI 37). He said the life of humans had been made easy by the gods but that humans had lost sight of this through seeking after honeyed cakes, perfumes, and similar things (DL VI 44). With sufficient training the life according to nature is the happy life (DL VI 71).
Accordingly Diogenes became famous for behavior that flouted convention (DL VI 69). Still, he thought that the simple life not only freed one from unnecessary concerns but was essential to virtue. Although he says nothing specific about the virtues, he does commend training for virtuous behavior (DL VI 70). His frugality certainly bespeaks self-control. He condemned love of money, praised good men, and held love to be the occupation of the idle (DL VI 50–51).
Besides his contempt for convention, what is most noteworthy about Diogenes as a moral teacher is his emphasis on detachment from those things most people consider good. In this emphasis, Diogenes seems to have intensified a tendency found in Socrates. Certainly Socrates could be heedless of convention and careless about providing for his bodily needs. To Plato, however, Diogenes seemed to be Socrates gone mad (DL VI 54). Still, in Diogenes’ attitude, we can see at least the beginning of the idea that the end of life is a psychological state marked by detachment. Counseling the simple and uncomplicated satisfaction of one’s natural instincts and desires, Diogenes urges detachment from those things held out by convention to be good. While he is not so explicit, others develop the theme of detachment into the notion of tranquility. The Stoics and Epicureans hold that happiness depends on detachment from vulnerable or difficult to obtain bodily and external goods and consists in a psychological state more under one’s own direct control. In this way, happiness becomes associated (for the Epicureans) with tranquility (ataraxia). Finally, in Skepticism, suspension of judgment is a kind of epistemic detachment that provides tranquility. So in Diogenes we find the beginnings of an idea that will become central to later ancient moral theory.
The first of the Cyrenaic school was Aristippus, who came from Cyrene, a Greek city on the north African coast. The account of his teachings, in Diogenes Laertius, can seem sometimes inconsistent. Nevertheless, Aristippus is interesting because, as a thorough hedonist, he is something of a foil for Epicurus. First of all, pleasure is the end or the goal of life – what everyone should seek in life. However, the pleasure that is the end is not pleasure in general, or pleasure over the long term, but immediate, particular pleasures. Thus the end varies situation by situation, action by action. The end is not happiness because happiness is the sum of particular pleasures (DL II 87–88). Accumulating the pleasures that produce happiness is tiresome (DL II 90). Particular pleasures are ones that are close-by or sure. Moreover, Aristippus said that pleasures do not differ from one another, that one pleasure is not more pleasant than another. This sort of thinking would encourage one to choose a readily available pleasure rather than wait for a “better” one in the future. This conclusion is reinforced by other parts of his teaching. His school says that bodily pleasures are much better than mental pleasures. While this claim would seem to contradict the idea that pleasures do not differ, it does show preference for the immediately or easily available pleasures of bodily gratification over, e.g., the mental pleasure of a self-aware just person. In fact, Aristippus’ school holds that pleasure is good even if it comes from the most unseemly things (DL II 88). Aristippus, then, seems to have raised improvidence to the level of a principle.
Still, it is possible that the position is more than an elaborate justification for short-sighted pleasure-seeking. Cyrenaics taught that a wise man (sophos) (one who always pursues immediate gratification) will in general live more pleasantly than a foolish man. That prudence or wisdom (phronêsis) is good, not in itself but in its consequences, suggests that some balance, perhaps even regarding others, is required in choosing pleasures (DL II 91). The Cyrenaic attitude to punishment seems to be an example of prudence. They hold that nothing is just, fine, or base by nature but only by convention and custom; still a good man will do nothing out of line through fear of punishment (DL II 93). Finally, they hold that friendship is based in self-interest (DL II 91). These aspects of Cyrenaic teaching suggest they are egoist hedonists. If so, there are grounds for taking the interest of others into account as long as doing so is based on what best provides an individual pleasure.
Nevertheless, Aristippus’ school holds that the end of life is a psychological good, pleasure. Still, it is particular pleasures not the accumulation of these that is the end. As a consequence, their moral theory contrasts sharply with others in antiquity. If we take the claims about the wise man, prudence, and friendship to be references to virtue, then Aristippus’ school denies that virtue is indispensable for achieving the end or goal of life. While they hold that virtue is good insofar as it leads to the end, they seem prepared to dispense with virtue in circumstances where it proves ineffective. Even if they held virtue in more esteem, the Cyrenaics would nonetheless not be eudaimonists since they deny that happiness is the end of life.
Epicurean moral theory is the most prominent hedonistic theory in the ancient world. While Epicurus holds that pleasure is the sole intrinsic good and pain is what is intrinsically bad for humans, he is also very careful about defining these two. Aware of the Cyrenaics who hold that pleasures, moral and immoral, are the end or goal of all action, Epicurus presents a sustained argument that pleasure, correctly understood, will coincide with virtue.
In the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus begins by making a distinction among desires. Some desires are empty or groundless and others are natural; the natural are further subdivided into the merely natural and the necessary. Finally, the necessary are those necessary for happiness, those necessary for the body’s freedom from distress, and those necessary for life itself (Letter to Menoeceus 127). A helpful scholiast (cf. Principal Doctrines XXIX) gives us some examples; necessary desires are ones that bring relief from unavoidable pain, such as drinking when thirsty – if we don’t drink when we need replenishment, we will just get thirstier and thirstier, a painful experience. The natural but not necessary are the ones that vary pleasure but are not needed in order to motivate us to remove or ward off pain, such as the desire for expensive food: we do not need to want, or to eat, expensive food in order to ward off the pain of prolonged hunger. Finally, the groundless desires are for such things as crowns and statues bestowed as civic honors – these are things that when desired at all are desired with intense and harmful cravings. Keeping these distinctions in mind is a great help in one’s life because it shows us what we need to aim for. The aim of the blessed life is the body’s health and the soul’s freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) (128).
After this austere introduction, Epicurus makes the bold claim that pleasure is the beginning and end of the blessed life. Then he makes an important qualification. Just because pleasure is the good, Epicureans do not seek every pleasure. Some lead to greater pain. Just so, they do not avoid all pains; some lead to greater pleasures (128–29). Such a position sounds, of course, like common-sense hedonism. If one’s aim is to have as much pleasure as possible over the long term, it makes sense to avoid some smaller pleasures that will be followed by larger pains. If one wants, for example, to have as much pleasure from drinking wine as possible, then it would make sense to exercise some judgment about how much to drink on an occasion since the next morning’s hangover will be very unpleasant, and might keep one from having wine the next day. However, his distinction among groundless, natural, and necessary desires should make us suspicious that Epicurus is no common-sense hedonist. The aim of life is not maximizing pleasures in the way the above example suggests. Rather, real pleasure, the aim of life, is what we experience through freedom from pain and distress. So it is not the pains of the hangover or the possible loss of further bouts of wine drinking that should restrain my drinking on this occasion. Rather one should be aiming at the pleasure given by freedom from bodily pain and mental distress (131–32).
The usual way to understand the pleasure of freedom from pain and from distress is by way of the distinction between kinetic pleasures and katastematic, or what are, following Cicero, misleadingly called ‘static’ ones (Diogenes Laertius X 136). The name of the former implies motion and the name of the latter implies a state or condition. The reason the distinction is important is that freedom from pain and from distress is a state or condition, not a motion. Epicurus holds not only that this state is a kind of pleasure but that it is the most complete pleasure (Principal Doctrines III). Modern commentators have taken various approaches to explaining why this state should be considered a pleasure, as opposed to, e.g., the attitude of taking pleasure in the fact that one is free of pain and distress. After all, taking pleasure in a fact is not a feeling in the same sense as the pleasure of drinking when thirsty. Since the latter is usually taken to be an example of kinetic pleasure (and is associated with the pain of thirst), sometimes katastematic pleasure is said to be just kinetic pleasure free from pain and distress, e.g., the pleasure of satiety. A somewhat broader conception of katastematic pleasure holds that it is the enjoyment of one’s natural constitution when one is not distracted by bodily pain or mental distress. Finally, some commentators hold the pleasure of freedom from pain and from distress to be a feeling available only to the wise person, who properly appreciates simple pleasures. Since eating plain bread and drinking water are usually not difficult to achieve, to the wise, their enjoyment is not overwhelmed by fear (130–31). Accordingly, the pleasure they take in these is free of pain and distress. Of course, the wise do not have to confine themselves to simple pleasures; they can enjoy luxurious ones as well – as long as they avoid needing them, which entails fear.
At this point, we can see that Epicurus has so refined the account of pleasure and pain that he is able to tie them to virtue. In the Letter to Menoeceus, he claims, as a truth for which he does not argue, that virtue and pleasure are inseparable and that living a prudent, honorable, and just life is the necessary and sufficient means to the pleasure that is the end of life (132). An example of what he might mean is found in Principal Doctrines, where Epicurus holds that justice is a contract among humans to avoid suffering harm from one another. Then he argues that injustice is not bad per se but is bad because of the fear that arises from the expectation that one will be punished for his misdeeds. He reinforces this claim by arguing that it is impossible for someone who violates the compact to be confident that he will escape detection (Principal Doctrines XXXIV–V). While one might doubt this claim about the malfactor’s state of mind, nevertheless, we can see that Epicurus means to ground justice, understood as the rules governing human intercourse, in his moral psychology, i.e., the need to avoid distress.
Epicurus, like his predecessors in the ancient moral tradition, identified the good as something psychological. However, instead of, for example, the complex Aristotelian notion of excellent activity of the soul, Epicurus settled on the fairly obvious psychological good of pleasure. Of course, Aristotle argues that excellent activity of the soul is intrinsically pleasurable (Nicomachean Ethics 1099a5). Still, in his account pleasure seems something like a dividend of excellent activity (1175b30). By contrast, for Epicurus pleasure itself is the end of life. However, since Epicureans hold freedom from pain (aponia) and distress (ataraxia) gives the preferable pleasure, they emphasize tranquility (ataraxia) as the end of life. Modern utilitarians, for whom freedom from pain and distress is not paramount, would include a broader palate of pleasures.
Epicurus’ doctrine can be considered eudaimonist. While Plato and Aristotle maintain that virtue is constitutive of happiness, Epicurus holds that virtue is the only means to achieve happiness, where happiness is understood as a continuous experience of the pleasure that comes from freedom from pain and from mental distress. Thus, he is a eudaimonist in that he holds virtue is indispensable to happiness; but he does not identify virtuous activity, in whole or in part, with happiness. Finally, Epicurus is usually interpreted to have held a version of psychological hedonism – i.e., everything we do is done for the sake of pleasure – rather than ethical hedonism – i.e., we ought to do everything for the sake of pleasure. However, Principal Doctrine XXV suggests the latter position; and when in the Letter to Menoeceus he says that “we” do everything in order not to be in pain or in fear, he might mean to be referring to “we” Epicureans. If so, the claim would be normative. Still, once all disturbance of the soul is dispelled, he says, one is no longer in need nor is there any other good that could be added (128). Since this claim appears to be descriptive, Epicurus could be taken, as he usually has been, to be arguing that whatever we do is done for the sake of pleasure. In this account, that aspect of human nature on which virtue is based is fairly straightforward. The account is certainly less complex than, e.g., Aristotle’s. In turn, Epicurus seems to have argued in such a way as to make pleasure the only reason for being virtuous. If psychological hedonism is true, then when one realizes the necessary link between virtue and pleasure, one has all the reason one needs to be virtuous and the only reason one can have.
The Stoics are well known for their teaching that the good is to be identified with virtue. Virtues include logic, physics, and ethics (Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta [=SVF]II 35), as well as wisdom, moderation, justice, and courage. To our modern ears, the first three sound like academic subjects; but for the Stoics, they were virtues of thought. However, orthodox Stoics do not follow the Aristotelian distinction between intellectual and moral virtues because – as we shall see – they hold that all human psychological functions, including the affective and volitional, are rational in a single, unified sense. For them, consequently, all virtues form a unity around the core concept of knowledge. Finally, all that is required for happiness (i.e., the secure possession of the good, of what is needed to make one’s life a thoroughly good one) – and the only thing – is to lead a virtuous life. In this teaching Stoics are addressing the problem of bodily and external goods raised by Aristotle. Their solution takes the radical course of dismissing such alleged goods from the account of happiness because they are not necessary for virtue, and are not, in fact, in any way good at all.
They argue that health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, good reputation, and noble birth are neither good nor bad. Since they can be used well or badly and the good is invariably good, these assets are not good. The virtues, however, are good (DL VII 102–103), since they are perfections of our rationality, and only rationally perfected thoughts and decisions can possibly have the features of harmony and order in which goodness itself consists. Since possessing and exercising virtue is happiness, happiness does not include such things as health, pleasure, and wealth. Still, the Stoics do not dismiss these assets altogether since they still have a kind of value. These things are indifferent to happiness in that they do not add to one’s virtue nor detract from it, and so they do not add to or take away from one’s possession of the good. One is not more virtuous because healthy nor less virtuous because ill. But being healthy generally conforms with nature’s plans for the lives of animals and plants, so it is preferable to be healthy, and one should try to preserve and maintain one’s health. Health is, then, the kind of value they call a preferred indifferent; but it is not in any way a good, and it makes no contribution to the quality of one’s life as a good or a bad one, happy or miserable.
In order to understand the Stoic claims about the relation of virtue to happiness, we can begin with virtue. Chrysippus says that virtue is a craft (technê) having to do with the things of life (SVF II 909). In other texts, we learn that the things of life include impulse (hormê). Each animal has an impulse for self-preservation; it has an awareness of its constitution and strives to preserve its integrity. There is also a natural impulse to care for offspring. Humans, then, are naturally inclined toward preserving life, health, and children. But then grown-up humans also do these things under the guidance of reason; reason in the adult human case is the craftsman of impulse (DL VII 85–6). This latter phrase is significant because it implies that just following natural impulse is not enough. In fact, it is not even possible for an adult human, whose nature is such as to do everything they do by reason, even to follow the sort of natural impulses that animals and immature humans do in their actions. In order to lead a virtuous life, reason must shape our impulses and guide their expression in action.
Impulse is the key to understanding the relation between virtue and happiness. An impulse is a propositional attitude that, when assented to, leads to action, e.g., ‘I should eat this bread now.’ However, impulses do not arise in a separate, non-rational part of the soul. Stoics deny there are any non-rational desires of appetite capable of impelling action. The soul, insofar as it provides motivations and is the cause of our actions, consists of the commanding faculty (hêgemonikon) which is also reason (SVF I 202). We can distinguish correct impulses into those which treat virtue as the only good and those which treat things indifferent as indifferent. By contrast, emotions or passions ( pathê) are incorrect impulses that treat what is indifferent as good. However, they do not come from a non-rational part of the soul but are false judgments about the good, where judgment is understood as assent to some impulse. Emotions, such as desire, fear, pleasure, and pain, embody such erroneous judgments (SVF III 391, 393, 394). For instance, the desire for health arises from assenting to the impulse that embodies the false judgment that health is good, instead of a preferred indifferent. The sage – someone perfected in virtue – would never assent to such false propositions and thus would never have emotions in this sense, no feelings that carried him beyond reason’s true assessment. He would, however, experience feelings attuned to reason, eupatheiai –literally good emotions or feelings. For instance, he would feel joy over his virtue, but not pleasure – the latter being an emotion that treats the actual possession of an indifferent as a good.
Knowledge, then, about what is good, bad, and indifferent is the heart of virtue. Courage, e.g., is simply knowledge of what is to be endured: the impulse to endure or not, and the only impulse that is needed by courage, then follows automatically, as a product or aspect of that knowledge. This tight unity in the soul is the basis for the Stoic teaching about the unity of the virtues. Zeno (the founder of the school) defines wisdom (phronêsis), or rather practical knowledge, in matters requiring distribution as justice, in matters requiring choice as moderation, and in matters requiring endurance as courage (Plutarch On Moral Virtue 440E–441D). Practical knowledge, then, is a single, comprehensive knowledge of what is good and bad in each of these kinds of circumstance.
Attending to this identification of virtue and practical knowledge is a good way to understand the central Stoic teaching that virtue is living in agreement with nature (SVF III 16). Nature includes not only what produces natural impulses but also the rest of the government of the cosmos, the natural world. The universe is governed by right reason that pervades everything and directs (causes) the way it functions – with the exception of the only rational animals there are, the adult human beings: their actions are governed by themselves, i.e., by assenting to, or withholding assent from particular impulses. Nature is even identified with Zeus, who is said to be the director of the administration of all that exists (DL VII 87–9). Since reason governs the universe for the good, everything happens of necessity and for the overall good. Virtue, then, includes understanding both one’s individual nature as a human being and the way nature arranges the whole universe. At this point, we can appreciate the role of logic and physics as virtue since these entail knowledge of the universe. This understanding is the basis for living in agreement with the government of the universe, i.e., with nature, by making one’s decisions and actions be such as to agree with Zeus’s or nature’s own plans, so far as one can understand what those are.
It is in this context that we can best understand the Stoic teaching about indifferents, such as health and wealth. An individual’s health is vulnerable to being lost if right reason that governs the universe requires it for the good of the whole. If happiness depended on having these assets and avoiding their opposites, then, in these cases, happiness would be impossible. However, if virtue is living in agreement with nature’s government of the universe and if virtue is the only good, one’s happiness is entirely determined by his patterns of assent and is therefore not vulnerable to being lost. If one understands that the good of the whole dictates that in a particular case one’s health must be sacrificed, then one recognizes that his happiness does not require health. We should not, however, see this recognition as tantamount to renunciation. If the Stoic notion of happiness has any relation at all to the ordinary sense, renunciation cannot be a part of it. Rather, the Stoic view of living in accordance with nature should imply not only understanding the way right reason rules the universe but agreeing with it and even desiring that things happen as they do. We can best appreciate the notion that virtue is the good, then, if we take virtue as both acknowledging that the universe is well governed and adopting the point of view, so to speak, of the government (DL VII 87–9).
A refinement of the Stoic approach to indifferents gives us a way of understanding what living in agreement with nature might look like. After all, such things as health and wealth cannot just be dismissed since they are something like the raw material of virtue. It is in pursuing and using them that one exercises virtue, for instance. In the attempt to integrate preferred indifferents into the pursuit of the good, Stoics used an analogy with archery (On Ends III.22). Since he aims to hit the target, the archer does everything in his power to hit the target. Trying everything in his power reflects the idea that such factors as a gust of wind – chance happenings that cannot be controlled or foreseen – can intervene and keep him from achieving the goal. To account for this type of factor, it is claimed that the goal of the archer is really trying everything in his power to attain the end. The analogy with the art of living focuses on this shift from the goal of hitting the target to the goal of trying everything in one’s power to hit the target (On Ends V.17–20). It is the art of trying everything in one’s power to attain such preferred indifferents as health and wealth. However, if right reason, which governs the universe, decides that one will not have either, then the sage follows right reason. At this point the analogy with archery breaks down since, for the sage, trying everything in one’s power does not mean striving until one fails; rather, it means seeking preferred indifferents guided by right reason. By this reasoning, one should see that virtue and happiness are not identified with achieving heath and wealth but with the way one seeks them and the evaluative propositions one assents to. Finally, the art of living is best compared to such skills as acting and dancing (On Ends V. 24–5).
This way of relating preferred indifferents to the end, i.e., to happiness, was challenged in antiquity as incoherent. Plutarch, for instance, argues that it is contrary to common understanding to say that the end is different from the reference point of all action. If the reference point of all action – what one does everything to achieve – is to have preferred indifferents such as health, then the end is to have preferred indifferents. However, if the end is not to have preferred indifferents (but, say, always to act prudently), then the reference point of all action cannot be the preferred indifferents (On Common Conceptions 1070F–1071E). The Stoics are presented with a dilemma: either preferred indifferents are integral to the end or they are not the object of choice.
The Stoics are extreme eudaimonists compared to Plato or Aristotle, although they are clearly inspired by Socratic intellectualism. While Plato clearly associates virtue and happiness, he never squarely faces the issue whether happiness may require other goods, e.g., wealth and health. Aristotle holds happiness to be virtuous activity of the soul; but he raises – without solving – the problem of bodily and external goods and happiness. For these two, virtue, together with its active exercise, is the dominant and most important component of happiness, while Stoics simply identify virtue and the good, and so make it the only thing needed for a happy life. Still, Stoics do not reduce happiness to virtue, as though ‘happiness’ is just a name for being perfectly just, courageous, and moderate. Rather they have independent ways of describing happiness. Following Zeno, all the Stoics say it is a good flow of life. Seneca says the happy life is peacefulness and constant tranquility. However, we should keep in mind that, while they do not reduce happiness to virtue, their account of happiness is not that of the common person. So in recommending virtue because it secures happiness the Stoics are relying on happiness in a special, although not idiosyncratic, sense. In fact, their idea of happiness shares an important feature with the Epicurean, which puts a premium on tranquil pleasures. In Stoicism as well, deliverance from the vicissitudes of fate leads to a notion of happiness that emphasizes tranquility. And, as we shall see, tranquility is a value for the Skeptics.
Clearly, the Stoic account of virtue and happiness depends on their theory about human nature. For Aristotle, virtue is perfection of the human function and the Stoics follow in this line of thinking. While their notion of virtue builds on their notion of the underlying human nature, their account of the perfection of human nature is more complex than Aristotle’s. It includes accommodation to the nature of the universe. Virtue is the perfection of human nature that makes it harmonious with the workings of fate, i.e. with Zeus’s overall plan, regarded as the ineluctable, though providential, cause of what happens in the world at large.
9. Pyrrhonian Skeptics
Pyrrho, a murky figure, roughly contemporary with Epicurus and Zeno the Stoic, left no writings. In the late, anecdotal tradition he is credited with introducing suspension of judgment (DL IX 61). He became the eponymous hero for the founding of Pyrrhonian skepticism in the first century B.C. (See entry on Pyrrho and on Ancient Skepticism.) Having discovered that for every argument examined so far there is an opposing argument, Pyrrhonian Skeptics expressed no determinate opinions (DL IX 74). This attitude would seem to lead to a kind of epistemic paralysis. The Skeptics reply that they do not abolish, e.g., relying on sight. They do not say that it is unreliable and they do not refuse, personally, ever to rely on it. Rather, they have the impression that there is no reason why we are entitled to rely on it, in a given case or in general, even if we go ahead and rely on it anyhow (DL IX 103). For example, if one has the visual impression of a tower, that appearance is not in dispute. What is in dispute is whether the tower is as it appears to be. For Skeptics, claiming that the tower is as it appears to be is a dogmatic statement about the object or the causal history of the appearance. As far as the Skeptic is concerned, all such statements have failed to be adequately justified, and all supporting arguments can be opposed by equally convincing counter-arguments. Lacking any grounds on which to prefer one dogmatic statement or view over another, he suspends judgment.
Such views have an obvious impact on practical and moral issues. First of all, the Skeptics argue that, so far as we have been given any compelling reason by philosophers to believe, there is nothing good or bad by nature (Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism [=PH] III 179–238, Adversus Mathematicos [=M] XI 42–109). And just in case he does find such reasons compelling, the Skeptic will resist the temptation to assent by posing a general counter-argument: what is good by nature would be recognized by everyone, but clearly not everyone agrees – for instance, Epicurus holds that pleasure is good by nature but Antisthenes holds that it is not (DL IX 101) – hence there is nothing good by nature (see section 4 of the entry on Moral Skepticism). The practical consequences of suspending judgment are illustrated by two traditions about the life of Pyrrho. In one, Pyrrho himself did not avoid anything, whether it was wagons, precipices, or dogs. It would appear that, suspending judgment about whether being hit by a wagon was naturally good or bad, Pyrrho might walk into its path, or not bother to get out of the way. His less skeptical friends kept him alive – presumably by guiding him away from busy roads, vicious dogs, and deep gorges. Another tradition, however, says that he only theorized about suspension of judgments, and took action to preserve himself and otherwise lead a normal life, but doing so without any judgments as to natural good and bad. Living providently, he reached ninety years of age (DL IX 62).
In any event, Pyrrho’s suspension of judgment led to a certain detachment. Not knowing what was good or bad by nature, he was indifferent where dogmatists would be unhappy or at least anxious. For instance, he performed household chores usually done by women (DL IX 63–66). Thus Pyrrho’s skepticism detached him from the dogmatic judgments of a culture in which a man’s performing women’s work was considered demeaning. In turn, his skepticism and suspension of judgment led to freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) (DL IX 68). It is significant that this psychological state, so important for Epicureans as part of the end of life, should play a key role in Pyrrhonian skepticism at its beginning with Pyrrho, but certainly in its development with Sextus Empiricus.
While suspension of judgment in moral matters brings freedom from disturbance, it does not lead to immoral behavior – anymore than it leads to the foolhardy behavior of the first tradition about Pyrrho’s life. Sextus generalizes the Skeptic teaching about appearances to cover the whole area of practical activity. He says the rules of everyday conduct are divided into four parts: (1) the guidance from nature, (2) compulsion that comes from bodily states like hunger and thirst, (3) traditional laws and customs about pious and good living, (4) the teachings of the crafts (PH, I 21–24). The Skeptic is guided by all of these as by appearance, and thus undogmatically. For instance, he would follow the traditional laws about pious and good living, accepting these laws as the way things appear to him to be in matters of piety and goodness but claiming no knowledge and holding no beliefs.
Sextus says that the end of life is freedom from disturbance in matters of belief, plus moderate states in matters of compulsion. Suspension of judgment provides the former in that one is not disturbed about which of two opposing claims is true, when (as always seems to happen) one cannot rationally decide between them. Matters of compulsion cover such things as bodily needs for food, drink, and warmth. While the Skeptic undeniably suffers when hungry, thirsty, or cold, he achieves a moderate state with respect to these sufferings when compared to the person who both suffers them and believes they are naturally bad. The Skeptic’s suspension of judgment about whether his suffering is naturally bad gives him a certain detachment from the suffering, and puts him in a better condition than those who also believe their suffering is naturally bad (PH I 25–30).
As a consequence, the Skeptic conception of the end of life is similar in some ways to Epicurean and Stoic beliefs. For Epicureans the end is freedom from pain and distress; the Stoic identification of virtue and the good promises freedom from disturbance. While Pyrrho and Sextus hold freedom from disturbance to be the end of life, they differ from the former over the means by which it is achieved. Both the Epicureans and Stoics, for example, hold that a tranquil life is impossible in the absence of virtue. By contrast, Sextus does not have a lot to say in a positive vein about virtue, although he does recommend following traditional laws about piety and goodness, and he indicates that the Skeptic may live virtuously (PH I 17). Rather, it is for the Skeptics an epistemic attitude embodied in a distinctive practice, not virtue, that leads to the desired state. This alone would seem to be enough to disqualify Pyrrhonism as a form of eudaimonism.
Sextus does however offer his skeptical practice as a corrective to the dogmatists’ misleading path to eudaimonia: it is not possible to be happy while supposing things are good or bad by nature (M XI 130, 144). It is the person who suspends judgment that enjoys the most complete happiness (M XI 160, 140). It is important to observe that Sextus proposes his skeptical practice as an alternative to dogmatic theories. For the Skeptic makes no commitments, or even assertions, regarding the supposedly objective conditions that are supposed by other philosophers to underlie our natural, human telos. Accordingly, some have objected that the kind of tranquility and happiness that the Skeptic enjoys could just as well be produced through pharmacology or, we might add, Experience Machines. More generally speaking, the objection is that skeptical tranquility and happiness comes at a cost we should not be willing to pay. By refusing to accept the world is ever as it appears, the Skeptic becomes a detached, passive spectator, undisturbed by any of the thoughts that pass through his mind. Such detachment might seem to threaten his ability to care about other people as he observes all that happens to them with the same tranquil indifference. Also, he would seem to be at best a moral conformist, unable or at least unwilling to engage in any moral deliberation, either hypothetically or as a means to directly address a pressing moral issue.
Sextus provides an example of the latter situation when he imagines the Skeptic being compelled by a tyrant to commit some unspeakable deed, or be tortured (M XI 164–66). Critics propose that the Skeptic’s choice will necessarily reveal his evaluative convictions, and thus his inconsistency in claiming to have no such convictions. But Sextus replies that he will simply opt for one or the other in accordance with his family’s laws and customs. In other words, he will rely on whatever moral sentiments and dispositions he happens to have. These cognitive states will be neither the product of any rational consideration nor will they inform any premises for moral reasoning or philosophical deliberation. Like Sartre’s existentialism, Sextus’ skepticism offers a way to respond to moral dilemmas without supposing there is a correct, or even objectively better, choice.
We should note that it is not entirely fair to ask whether the Pyrrhonist’s moral life is one that we, non-Skeptics, would deem good or praise-worthy. For, as Sextus would say, we are part of the dispute regarding what kind of life is morally good and praise-worthy. To claim that nothing really matters to the Skeptic, for example, presupposes some account of the mental state of caring. In the end, the question of how or whether a Skeptic might be morally good is equivalent to asking what role belief, or knowledge, plays in the moral goodness of people and their actions. If we suppose that one must, at a minimum, have adequately justified evaluative beliefs informing her actions in order for those actions, and the underlying character, to count as morally good, then the Skeptic will be immoral, or at least amoral. On the other hand, if the Skeptic manages to undermine our confidence in that supposition, we will have to suspend judgment regarding whether the Skeptic, or anyone else for that matter, is in fact capable of performing morally good and praise-worthy action, or whether their reasoned account of eudaimonia is true.
The question we should ask here is whether and in what respect those with strong, rational convictions will be better off than the Skeptic when confronting moral dilemmas, or even everyday moral choices. If, like the Skeptic, one suspects that the dogmatists’ have no knowledge, let alone adequately justified beliefs to guide them, then it seems that they are no better or worse off than those who simply conform to moral customs and norms.
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Other Internet Resources
- Greek Ethics and Moral Theory, (PDF document), by Gisela Striker, Tanner Lectures on Human Values, delivered at Stanford University, May 1987.