Voluntary Euthanasia

First published Thu Apr 18, 1996; substantive revision Fri Jan 18, 2019

The entry sets out five conditions often said to be necessary for anyone to be a candidate for legalized voluntary euthanasia (and, with appropriate qualifications, physician-assisted suicide), outlines the moral case advanced by those in favor of legalizing voluntary euthanasia, and discusses the five most important objections made by those who deny that voluntary euthanasia is morally permissible and who are, in consequence, opposed to its being legalized.

1. Introduction

When a person performs an act of euthanasia, she brings about the death of another person because she believes the latter’s present existence is so bad that he would be better off dead, or believes that unless she intervenes and ends his life, his life will very soon become so bad that he would be better off dead. Accordingly, the motive of the person who performs an act of euthanasia is to benefit the one whose death is brought about. (This also holds for many instances of physician-assisted suicide, but use of the latter term is usually restricted to forms of assistance which stop short of the physician ‘bringing about the death’ of the patient, for example, those involving means that have to be activated by the patient.)

It is important to emphasize the motive of benefiting the person who is assisted to die because well-being is a key value in relation to the morality of euthanasia (see Section 3 below). Nonetheless, the defensibility of the contention that someone can be better off dead has been the subject of extensive philosophical deliberation. Those who claim that a person can be better off dead believe this to be true when the life that remains in prospect for that person has no positive value for her (a possibility which is discussed by e.g., Foot, 1977; McMahan 2002; Bradley 2009), whereas some of those who hold that a person’s life is inviolable deny that a person can ever be better off dead (e.g., Keown in Jackson and Keown 2012). A Kant-inspired variant on this latter position has been advanced by Velleman (1999). He considers that a person’s well-being can only matter if she is of intrinsic value and so that it is impermissible to violate a person’s rational nature (the source of her intrinsic value) for the sake of her well-being. Accordingly, he holds that it is impermissible to assist someone to die who judges that she would be better off dead and competently requests assistance with dying. The only exception is when a person’s life is so degraded as to call into question her rational nature, albeit he thinks it unlikely that anyone in that position will remain competent to request assistance with dying. This position appears to be at odds with the well-established right of a competent patient to refuse life-prolonging medical treatment, at least when further treatment is refused because she considers that her life no longer has value for her and further treatment will not restore its value to her. (For further reasons to reject arguments for the inviolability of the life of a person, including Velleman’s, see e.g., McMahan 2002; Young 2007; Sumner 2011.)

Because our concern will be with voluntary euthanasia – that is, with those instances of euthanasia in which a clearly competent person makes a voluntary and enduring request to be helped to die (or, by extension, when an authorised proxy makes a substituted judgment by choosing in the manner the no-longer-competent person would have chosen had he remained competent) – a second key value is the competence of the person requesting assistance with dying. There will be occasion to mention non-voluntary euthanasia – instances of euthanasia where a person lacks the competence at the time when a decision is to be made to request euthanasia and has not previously competently declared a preference for it via an advance directive (see the entry on advance directives) – only when consideration is given to the claim that permitting voluntary euthanasia will lead via a slippery slope to permitting non-voluntary euthanasia. Nothing will be said here about involuntary euthanasia, where a competent person’s life is brought to an end despite an explicit expression of opposition to euthanasia, beyond saying that, no matter how honorable the perpetrator’s motive, such a death is, and ought to be, unlawful.

Debate about the morality and legality of voluntary euthanasia has been, for the most part, a phenomenon of the second half of the twentieth century and the beginning of the twenty first century. Certainly, the ancient Greeks and Romans did not believe that life needed to be preserved at any cost and were, in consequence, tolerant of suicide when no relief could be offered to a dying person or, in the case of the Stoics and Epicureans, when a person no longer cared for his life. In the sixteenth century, Thomas More, in describing a utopian community, envisaged such a community as one that would facilitate the death of those whose lives had become burdensome as a result of ‘torturing and lingering pain’. But it has only been in the last hundred years that there have been concerted efforts to make legal provision for voluntary euthanasia. Until quite recently there had been no success in obtaining such legal provision (though assisted suicide, including, but not limited to, physician-assisted suicide, has been legally tolerated in Switzerland for a number of decades). However, the outlook changed dramatically in the 1970s and 80s because of a series of court cases in The Netherlands which culminated in an agreement between the legal and medical authorities to ensure that no physician would be prosecuted for assisting a patient to die as long as certain guidelines were strictly adhered to (see Griffiths, et al., 1998). In brief, the guidelines were established to permit physicians to practise voluntary euthanasia in those instances in which a competent patient had made a voluntary and informed request to be helped to die, the patient’s suffering was unbearable, there was no way of making that suffering bearable that was acceptable to the patient, and the physician’s judgements as to diagnosis and prognosis were confirmed after consultation with another physician.

The first legislative approval for voluntary euthanasia was achieved with the passage in the parliament of Australia’s Northern Territory of a bill enabling physicians to practise voluntary euthanasia. Subsequent to the Act’s proclamation in 1996, it faced a series of legal challenges from opponents of voluntary euthanasia. In 1997 the challenges culminated in the Australian National Parliament overturning the legislation when it prohibited Australian territories from enacting legislation to permit voluntary euthanasia on constitutional grounds. Australia is a federation consisting of six states and two territories. Unlike the territories, the states do have the constitutional right to enact such legislation and in 2017 the state of Victoria did just that. The legislation came into effect in 2019. Several other states are currently considering similar legislation.

In November 2000, The Netherlands passed legislation to legalize the practice of voluntary euthanasia. The legislation passed through all the parliamentary stages early in 2001. The Belgian parliament passed similar legislation in 2002 and Luxembourg followed suit in 2009. (For a very helpful comparative study of relevant legislation see Lewis 2007. See also Griffiths, et al. 2008.)

In Oregon in the United States, legislation was introduced in 1997 to permit physician-assisted suicide after a referendum strongly endorsed the proposed legislation. Later in 1997 the Supreme Court of the United States ruled that there is no constitutional right to physician-assisted suicide; however, the Court did not preclude individual states from legislating in favor of physician-assisted suicide (so the Oregon legislation was unaffected). Since that time the Oregon legislation has been successfully utilised by a significant number of people and similar legislation has been passed in the state of Washington in 2009, in Vermont in 2013, and more recently still in California, Colorado, Hawaii, Maine, New Jersey and the District of Columbia. A series of judicial decisions in the state of Montana in 2008 and 2009 established that the state could not prohibit physician-assisted suicide but legislation has not yet been introduced to codify the legal situation. A number of other states are currently considering physician-assisted suicide bills. A similar legal position to that in Montana has obtained in the nation of Colombia since the late 1990s as a result of a majority ruling by its Constitutional Court in favor of the legality of physician-assisted suicide. In Canada, the province of Quebec introduced legislation permitting medical aid in dying in 2014. The legislation came into effect in 2016 at around the same time that the Canadian National Parliament passed legislation permitting both physician-assisted suicide and voluntary euthanasia throughout all of the Canadian federation. (For a brief account of events leading up to the enactment of the various pieces of legislation in the United States and in Canada see Sumner 2017.)

With that brief sketch of the historical background in place, we will proceed first to consider the conditions that those who have advocated making voluntary medically assisted death legally permissible have typically insisted should be satisfied. Consideration of the proposed conditions will establish a framework for the moral interrogation that will follow in Sections 3 and 4. Section 3 will outline the positive moral case put forward by those who want voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide to be legally permissible. Section 4 will be devoted to scrutinising the most important of the objections that have been levelled against that case by those opposed to the legalization of voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide.

2. Five Conditions Often Proposed as Necessary for Candidacy for Voluntary Euthanasia

Advocates of voluntary euthanasia typically contend that if a person

  1. is suffering from a terminal illness;
  2. is unlikely to benefit from the discovery of a cure for that illness during what remains of her life expectancy;
  3. is, as a direct result of the illness, either suffering intolerable pain, or only has available a life that is unacceptably burdensome (e.g., because the illness has to be treated in ways that lead to her being unacceptably dependent on others or on technological means of life support);
  4. has an enduring, voluntary and competent wish to die (or has, prior to losing the competence to do so, expressed a wish to be assisted to die in the event that conditions (a)-(c) are satisfied); and
  5. is unable without assistance to end her life,

then there should be legal and medical provision to facilitate her being allowed to die or assisted to die.

It should be acknowledged that these conditions are quite restrictive, indeed more restrictive than many think appropriate. In particular, the first condition restricts access to voluntary euthanasia to those who are terminally ill. While that expression is not free of all ambiguity, for present purposes it can be agreed that it does not include those who are rendered quadriplegic as a result of accidents, or sufferers from motor neurone disease, or individuals who succumb to forms of dementia like Alzheimer’s Disease, to say nothing of those afflicted by ‘existential suffering’. Those who consider that cases like these show the first condition to be too restrictive (e.g., Varelius 2014) may, nonetheless, agree that including them as candidates for legalized voluntary euthanasia is likely to make it far harder in many jurisdictions to gain sufficient support for legalization (and so to make it harder to help those terminally ill persons who wish to die). Even so, they believe that voluntary euthanasia should be permitted for those who consider their lives no longer worth living, not just for for the terminally ill. The fifth condition further restricts access to voluntary euthanasia by excluding those capable of ending their own lives, and so may be thought unduly restrictive by those who would wish to discourage terminally ill patients from attempting suicide. There will be yet others who consider this condition to be too restrictive because competent patients can always refuse nutrition and hydration (see, e.g., Bernat, et al., 1993; Savulescu 2014). Though this is true, many competent dying persons still wish to have access to legalized medically assisted death, rather than having to rely on refusing nutrition and hydration, so that they may retain control over the timing of their deaths and avoid needlessly prolonging the process of dying.

The second condition is intended simply to reflect the fact that it is normally possible to say when someone’s health status is incurable. So-called ‘miracle’ cures may be proclaimed by sensationalist journalists, but progress toward medical breakthroughs is typically painstaking. If there are miracles wrought by God that will be quite another matter entirely, but it is at least clear that not everyone’s death is thus to be staved off.

The third condition recognises what many who oppose the legalization of voluntary euthanasia do not, namely, that it is not only a desire to be released from pain that leads people to request help with dying. In The Netherlands, for example, pain has been found to be a less significant reason for requesting assistance with dying than other forms of suffering like frustration over loss of independence (see e.g., Marquet, et al., 2003; Onwuteaka-Philipsen, et al., 2012; Emanuel, et al., 2016). Sufferers from some terminal conditions may have their pain relieved but have to endure side effects that, for them, make life unbearable. Others may not have to cope with pain but, instead, with having to rely on forms of life support that simultaneously rob their lives of quality (as with, e.g., motor neurone disease). Yet others struggle with psychological distress and various psychiatric conditions and believe these conditions ought to be counted among the forms of suffering that qualify competent individuals to access medical assistance with dying. There has been greater recognition of, and support for, this position in The Netherlands and Belgium than elsewhere, probably because legislation in those jurisdictions makes the role of unbearable suffering central to the determination of the eligibility of competent individuals for medical assistance with dying. Even so, inclusion of these forms of suffering highlights legitimate issues to do with the competence of at least some of those who suffer from them. (For a helpful recent study of the handling of requests for assistance with dying by psychiatric patients in The Netherlands see Kim, et al., 2016.)

A final preliminary point is that the fourth condition requires that the choice to die not only be uncoerced and competent but that it be enduring. The choice is one that will require time for reflection, and, almost certainly, discussion with others, so should not be settled in a moment. Nonetheless, as with other decisions affecting matters of importance, adults are presumed to choose voluntarily and to be competent unless the presence of defeating considerations can be established. (See the entry on decision-making capacity.) The burden of proof of establishing lack of voluntariness, or lack of competence, is on those who refuse to accept an adult person’s choice. There is no need to deny that this burden can sometimes be met (e.g., by pointing to the person’s being in a state of clinical depression). The claim is only that the onus falls on those who assert that an adult’s choice is not competent.

Clearly the five conditions set out above are likely to require some refinement if complete agreement is to be reached but there is sufficient agreement for us to proceed without further ado to consideration of the cases for and against legalization of voluntary euthanasia. (However, for a fuller discussion of issues concerning the definition of ‘euthanasia’ see, e.g., Beauchamp and Davidson 1979.)

3. A Moral Case for Voluntary Euthanasia

One central ethical contention in support of voluntary euthanasia is that respect for persons demands respect for their autonomous choices as long as those choices do not result in harm to others. Respect for people’s autonomous choices is directly connected with the requirement for competence because autonomy presupposes competence (cf., Brock 1992). People have an interest in making important decisions about their lives in accordance with their own conception of how they want to live. In exercising autonomy, or self-determination, individuals take responsibility for their lives; since dying is a part of life, choices about the manner of their dying and the timing of their death are, for many people, part of what is involved in taking responsibility for their lives. Many are concerned about what the last phase of their lives will be like, not merely because of fears that their dying might involve them in great suffering, but also because of the desire to retain their dignity, and as much control over their lives as possible, during this phase. A second contention in support of voluntary euthanasia was mentioned at the beginning of this entry, namely the importance of promoting the well-being of persons. When someone is suffering intolerable pain or only has available a life that is unacceptably burdensome (see the third condition above), and he competently requests medical assistance with dying, his well-being may best be promoted by affording him that assistance. When harnessed together, the value to individuals of making autonomous choices, and the value to those individuals who make such choices of promoting their own well-being, provide the moral foundation for requests for voluntary euthanasia. Each consideration is necessary for moral justification of the practice, but taken in isolation neither suffices (see, e.g., Young 2007, 2017; Sumner 2011, 2017).

The technological interventions of modern medicine have had the effect of stretching out the time it takes for many people to die. Sometimes the added life this brings is an occasion for rejoicing; sometimes it drags out the period of significant physical and intellectual decline that a person undergoes with the result that life becomes no longer worth living. Many believe there is no single, objectively correct answer as to when, if at all, a person’s life becomes a burden and hence unwanted. If they are right, that simply points up the importance of individuals being able to decide autonomously for themselves whether their own lives retain sufficient quality and dignity to make life worth living. Others maintain that individuals can be in error about whether their lives continue to be worth living (cf., Foot 1977). The conditions outlined above in Section 2 are intended by those who propose them to serve, among other purposes, to safeguard against such error. But it is worth adding that in the event that a person who considers that she satisfies those conditions is judged by her medical attendants to be in error about whether it would be worth her continuing to live, the likely outcome is that those attendants will refuse to provide medical assistance with dying. (Evidence that will be mentioned below shows that this happens frequently in jurisdictions in which medically assisted dying has been legalized.) Unless a patient is able to be transferred to the care of other medical professionals who accept her assessment, she will have to rely on her own resources (e.g., by refusing nutrition and hydration). Even so, other things being equal, as long as a critically ill person is competent, her own judgement of whether continued life is a benefit to her ought to carry the greatest weight in any end-of-life decision making regardless of whether she is in a severely compromised and debilitated state. The idea that a competent individual’s autonomous judgment of the value to her of continued life should trump an assessment by others of her well-being should not be thought surprising because precisely the same happens when a competent patient refuses life-prolonging treatment.

Suppose, for the sake of argument, that it is agreed that we should respect a person’s competent request for medical assistance with dying (e.g., so as to enable her to achieve her autonomously chosen goal of an easeful death). It might be thought that in such an eventuality different moral concerns will be introduced from those that arise in connection with competent refusals. After all, while competent patients are entitled to refuse any form of medical treatment, they are not entitled to insist on the administration of forms of medical treatment that have no prospect of conferring a medical benefit or are not being provided for reasons to do with scarcity of medical resources or affordability. While each of these points is sound, it remains the case that medical personnel have a duty to relieve suffering when that is within their capacity. Accordingly, doctors who regard medical assistance with dying as an element of appropriate medical care will consider it morally permissible to agree to a request for assistance with dying by a competent dying patient who wishes to avoid unnecessary suffering. The reason for claiming only that this is morally permissible rather than morally obligatory will be explained in a subsequent paragraph. (For further reflections on the issue of responses to requests for medical assistance see, for instance, Dworkin in Frey, et al. 1998; Sumner 2011; Young 2017.)

Notwithstanding this response, as was seen earlier, at least some proponents of voluntary medically assisted dying wish to question why medical assistance with dying should be restricted to those covered by, in particular, the first three conditions set out above in Section 2. If people’s competent requests for medically assisted death should be respected why impose any restrictions at all on who may have access to medically assisted death? Why, for example, should those suffering from depression, or forms of dementia, not be eligible for medically assisted dying? Most proponents of voluntary medically assisted dying hold that there are at least two reasons for restricting access to it to those who satisfy the conditions set out earlier (or, a modified set that takes account of the concerns canvassed in the discussion of those proposed conditions). First, they contend that there are political grounds for doing so, namely, that because legalizing medically assisted dying for competent individuals is politically contested, the best hope for its legalization lies in focusing on those forms of suffering most likely to effect law reform. That is why some proponents deny the eligibility even of sufferers from conditions like ‘locked-in’ syndrome, motor neurone disease, and multiple sclerosis for voluntary medically assisted dying since, strictly, they are not terminally ill, and reliance has to be placed in consequence on their claim to be suffering unbearably. Second, and relatedly, most proponents of the legalization of medical assistance with dying have been cautious about supporting medically assisted death for those suffering from, for example, depression and dementia, because not only are they not terminally ill, but their competence to request assistance with dying is apt to be called into question, particularly in instances where they have given no prior indication of their preference for such assistance. Restricting access to medical assistance with dying to those whose suffering is less likely to be disputed avoids becoming embroiled in controversy. Some critics of the restrictive approach (e.g., Varelius 2014) take a harder line still and claim that it should not even be necessary for a person to be suffering from a medical condition to be eligible for medical assistance with dying; it should be enough to be ‘tired of life’. Only in a few jurisdictions, viz., Switzerland, The Netherlands and Belgium, has this issue been seriously broached. Regardless of what may happen in those jurisdictions, those seeking the legal provision of medical assistance with dying in other jurisdictions seem likely to maintain that if such assistance is to be seen as a legitimate form of medical care it has to be provided in response to a medical condition (rather than because someone is ‘tired of life’), and, indeed, restricted to those who satisfy the conditions outlined earlier in Section 2 (or some similar set of conditions). In short, these latter hold that making an autonomous request for assistance with dying is necessary, but should not be sufficient, for triggering such assistance.

There is one final matter of relevance to the moral case for voluntary medically assisted death on which comment must be made. The comment concerns a point foreshadowed in a previous paragraph, but it is also linked with the remark just made about the insufficiency of an autonomous request for assistance with dying to trigger that assistance. It is important to make the point that respect has to be shown not only for the dying person’s autonomy but also for the professional autonomy of any medical personnel asked to lend assistance with dying. The value (or, as some would prefer, the right) of self-determination does not entitle a patient to try to compel medical professionals to act contrary to their own moral or professional values. Hence, if voluntary euthanasia is to be legally permitted, it must be against a backdrop of respect for professional autonomy. Similarly, if a doctor’s view of her moral or professional responsibilities is at odds with her patient’s competent request for euthanasia, she should make provision, where it is feasible to do so, for the transfer of the patient to the care of a doctor who faces no such conflict. Given that, to date, those who contend that no scope should be permitted for conscientious objection within medical practice have garnered very little support for that view, making use of referrals and transfers remains the most effective means of resolving such disagreements.

Opponents of voluntary euthanasia have endeavored in a variety of ways to counter the very straightforward moral case that has been laid out above for its legalization (see, for example, Keown 2002; Foley, et al. 2002; Biggar 2004; Gorsuch 2006). Some of the counter-arguments are concerned only with whether the moral case warrants making the practice of voluntary euthanasia legal, whereas others are concerned with trying to undermine the moral case itself. In what follows, consideration will be given to the five most important counter-arguments. (For more comprehensive discussions of the morality and legality of medically assisted death see Keown 2002; Biggar 2004; Gorsuch 2006; Young 2007; Sumner 2011.)

4. Five Objections to the Moral Permissibility of Voluntary Euthanasia

4.1 Objection 1

It is sometimes said (e.g., Emanuel 1999; Keown in Jackson and Keown 2012) that it is not necessary nowadays for people to die while suffering from intolerable or overwhelming pain because the provision of effective palliative care has improved steadily, and hospice care is more widely available. Some have urged, in consequence, that voluntary euthanasia is unnecessary.

There are several flaws in this contention. First, while both good palliative care and hospice care make important contributions to the care of the dying, neither is a panacea. To get the best palliative care for an individual involves trial and error, with some consequent suffering in the process; moreover, even the best care fails to relieve all pain and suffering. Perhaps even more importantly, high quality palliative care commonly exacts a price in the form of side-effects such as nausea, incontinence, loss of awareness because of semi-permanent drowsiness, and so on. A rosy picture is often painted as to how palliative care can transform the plight of the dying. Such a picture is misleading according to those who have closely observed the effect of extended courses of treatment with drugs like morphine. For these reasons many skilled palliative care specialists acknowledge that palliative care does not enable an easeful death for every patient. Second, even though the sort of care provided through hospices is to be applauded, it is care that is available to only a small proportion of the terminally ill and then usually only in the very last stages of the illness (typically a matter of a few weeks). Notwithstanding that only relatively few of the dying have access to hospice care it is worth drawing attention to the fact that in, Oregon, to cite one example, a high proportion of those who have sought physician-assisted suicide were in hospice care. Third, and of greatest significance for present purposes, not everyone wishes to avail themselves of palliative or hospice care. For those who prefer to die on their own terms and in their own time, neither option may be attractive. As previously mentioned, a major source of distress for many dying patients is the frustration that comes with being unable to satisfy their autonomous wishes. Fourth, as also indicated earlier, the suffering that occasions a desire to end life is not always traceable to pain caused by illness. For some, what is intolerable is their forced dependence on others or on life-supporting machinery; for these patients, the availability of effective pain control is not the primary concern. (In relation to the preceding matters see Rietjens, et al., 2009 and Onwuteaka-Philipsen et al. 2012 for findings for The Netherlands; and, for Oregon, Ganzini, et al. 2009.)

4.2 Objection 2

A second, related objection to the moral and legal permissibility of voluntary euthanasia turns on the claim that we can never have sufficient evidence to be justified in believing that a dying person’s request to be helped to die is competent, enduring and genuinely voluntary.

It is certainly true that a request to die may not reflect an enduring desire to die (just as some attempts to commit suicide may reflect only temporary despair). That is why advocates of the legalization of voluntary euthanasia have argued that a cooling off period should normally be required before euthanasia is permitted to ensure that the request is enduring. That having been said, to claim that we can never be justified in believing that someone’s request to die reflects a settled preference for death is to go too far. If a competent person discusses the issue with others on different occasions over time, and remains steady in her resolve, or privately reflects on the issue for an extended period and does not waver in her conviction, her wish to die surely must be counted as enduring.

But, it might be asked, what if a person is racked with pain, or mentally confused because of the measures taken to relieve her pain, and is, in consequence, unable to think clearly and rationally about the alternatives? It has to be agreed that a person in those circumstances who wants to die should not be assumed to have a truly voluntary and enduring desire to die. However, there are at least two important points to make about those in such circumstances. First, they do not account for all of the terminally ill, so even if it is acknowledged that such people are incapable of agreeing to voluntary euthanasia that does not show that no one can ever voluntarily request help to die. Second, it is possible in at least some jurisdictions for a person to indicate, in advance of losing the capacity to give competent consent, how she would wish to be treated should she become terminally ill and suffer either intolerable pain or an unacceptable loss of control over her life (cf., for instance, Dworkin 1993). ‘Living wills’ or ‘advance directives’ are legal instruments for giving voice to people’s wishes while they are capable of giving competent, enduring and voluntary consent, including to their wanting help to die. As long as they are easily revocable in the event of a change of mind (just as civil wills are), they should be respected as evidence of a well thought-out conviction. (For more detailed consideration of these instruments see the entry on advance directives.)

Perhaps, though, what is really at issue in this objection is whether anyone can ever form a competent, enduring and voluntary judgement about being better off dead, rather than continuing to suffer from an illness, prior to suffering such an illness (cf., Keown in Jackson and Keown 2012). If this is what underlies the objection it is surely too paternalistic to be acceptable. Why is it not possible for a person to have sufficient inductive evidence (e.g., based on the experience of the deaths of friends or family) to know her own mind, and act accordingly, without having had direct experience of such suffering?

4.3 Objection 3

According to the traditional interpretation of the ‘doctrine of double effect’ it is permissible to act in a way which it is foreseen will have a bad effect, provided only that

  1. the bad effect occurs as a side-effect (i.e., indirectly) to the achievement of the act that is directly aimed at;
  2. the act directly aimed at is itself morally good or, at least, morally neutral;
  3. the good effect is not achieved by way of the bad, that is, the bad must not be a means to the good; and
  4. the bad effect must not be so serious as to outweigh the good effect.

Hence, it is permissible, according to the doctrine of double effect, to, for example, alleviate pain (a good effect) by administering a drug such as morphine, knowing that doing so will shorten life, but impermissible to administer the same drug with the direct intention of terminating a patient’s life (a bad effect). This latter claim is said to apply regardless of whether the drug is given at the person’s request.

This is not the appropriate forum for a full consideration of the doctrine, for which see the entry on the doctrine of double effect. However, there is one very important criticism to be made of the application of the doctrine that has direct relevance to the issue of voluntary euthanasia.

On the most plausible reading, the doctrine of double effect can be relevant to the permissibility of voluntary euthanasia only when a person’s death is bad for her or, to put it another way, a harm to her. Sometimes the notion of ‘harm’ is understood simply as damage to a person’s interests whether consented to or not. At other times, it is understood, more strictly, as damage that has been wrongfully inflicted. On either understanding of harm, there can be instances in which death for a person does not constitute a harm for her because it will either render her better off, or, as some would insist, no worse off, when compared with remaining alive. Accordingly, in those instances, the doctrine of double effect can have no relevance to the debate about the permissibility of voluntary euthanasia. (For extended discussions of the doctrine of double effect and its bearing on the moral permissibility of voluntary euthanasia see, e.g., McIntyre 2001; Woodward 2001; Cavanaugh 2006; Young 2007; Sumner 2011.)

4.4 Objection 4

As was noted earlier in Section 3, there is a widespread belief concerning the moral acceptability of so-called passive (voluntary) euthanasia, wherein life-sustaining or life-prolonging measures are withdrawn or withheld in response to a competent patient’s request. The reason why passive (voluntary) euthanasia is said to be morally permissible is that the patient is simply allowed to die because steps are not taken to preserve or prolong life. This happens, for example, when a dying patient requests the withdrawal or the withholding of measures whose administration would be medically futile, or unacceptably burdensome. By contrast, active (voluntary) euthanasia is said to be morally impermissible because it is claimed to require an unjustifiable intentional act of killing to satisfy the patient’s request (cf., for example, Finnis, 1995; Keown in Jackson and Keown 2012).

Despite its popularity and widespread use, the distinction between passive and active euthanasia is neither particularly clear nor morally helpful. (For a fuller discussion, see McMahan 2002.) Whether behavior is described in terms of acts or omissions (a distinction which underpins the alleged difference between active and passive voluntary euthanasia and that between killing a person and letting her die), is often a matter of pragmatics rather than anything of deeper moral importance. Consider, for instance, the practice (once common in hospitals) of deliberately proceeding slowly to a ward in response to a request to provide assistance for a patient who has been assigned a ‘not for resuscitation’ code. Or, consider ‘pulling the plug’ on a respirator keeping an otherwise dying patient alive, as against not replacing the oxygen supply when it runs out. Are these acts or omissions? If the answers turn on merely pragmatic considerations the supposed distinction between passive euthanasia and active euthanasia will be hard to sustain.

Even supposing that the distinction between acts and omissions, and the associated distinction between killing and letting die, can be satisfactorily clarified (on which see the entry doing v. allowing harm), there remains the issue of whether these distinctions have moral significance in any particular circumstance. Consider a case of a patient suffering from motor neurone disease who is completely respirator dependent, finds her condition intolerable, and competently and persistently requests to be removed from the respirator so that she may die. Even the Catholic Church in recent times has been prepared to agree that it is permissible, in a case like this, to turn off the respirator. No doubt this has been because the Catholic Church considers such a patient is only being allowed to die. Even were it to be agreed, for the sake of argument, that such a death should be regarded as an instance of letting die, this concession would not show that it would have been morally worse had the patient been killed at her request (active voluntary euthanasia) rather than being allowed to die (passive voluntary euthanasia). Indeed, supporters of voluntary medically assisted death maintain that since death is beneficial in such an instance (or, at the very least, leaves the dying person no worse off), actively bringing about the death is morally to be preferred to just allowing it to happen because the desired benefit is achieved sooner.

Opponents of voluntary euthanasia claim, however, that the difference between active and passive euthanasia is to be found in the agent’s intention: if someone’s life is intentionally terminated she has been killed, whereas if she is just no longer being aggressively treated, her death should be attributed to the underlying disease. Many physicians would say that their intention in withholding or withdrawing life-sustaining medical treatment in such circumstances is simply to respect the patient’s wishes. This is plausible in those instances where the patient competently requests that aggressive treatment no longer be given (or, the patient’s proxy makes such a request). But it will often be implausible. In many cases the most plausible interpretation of a physician’s intention in withholding or withdrawing life-sustaining measures is that it is to end the patient’s life. Consider the palliative care practice of ‘terminally sedating’ a patient after a decision has been made to cease aggressive treatment. Suppose (as sometimes happens) that this is then followed by withholding artificially supplied nutrition. In these latter instances the best explanation of the physician’s behavior is that the physician intends thereby to end the life of the patient. What could be the point of the action, the goal aimed at, the intended outcome, if not to end the patient’s life? (Cf. Winkler 1995.) No sense can be made of the action as being intended to palliate the patient’s diseased condition, or to keep the patient comfortable. Nor is it appropriate to claim that what kills the patient is the underlying disease. What kills the patient is the act of depriving her of nutrition (i.e., of starving her to death). The point can be generalized to cover many more instances involving either the withdrawal or the withholding of life-sustaining medical treatment. In short, there is no good reason to think that whereas so-called passive voluntary euthanasia is morally acceptable active voluntary euthanasia never can be.

But we can go further. Giving titrated doses of morphine that reach levels beyond those needed to control pain, or removing a respirator from a sufferer from motor neurone disease, seem to many of us to amount to intentionally bringing about the death of the person being cared for. To be sure, as was acknowledged above, there are circumstances in which doctors can truthfully say that the actions they perform, or omissions they make, will bring about the deaths of their patients even though it was not their intention that those patients would die. So, for instance, if a patient refuses life-prolonging medical treatment because she considers it futile, it can be reasonable to say that her doctor’s intention in complying with the request was simply to respect her wishes. Nevertheless, as we have seen, there are other circumstances in which it is highly stilted to claim, as some doctors continue to do, that they had no intention of bringing about death.

These considerations should settle matters but do not do so for those who maintain that killing, in medical contexts, is always morally unjustified – a premise that underwrites much of the debate surrounding this fourth objection. But this underlying assumption is open to challenge and has been challenged by, for instance, Rachels 1986 and McMahan 2002. One of the reasons the challengers have given is that there are cases in which killing a competent dying person when she requests assistance with dying, is morally preferable to allowing her to die, namely, when taking the latter option would serve only to prolong her suffering against her wishes. Further, despite the longstanding legal doctrine that no one can justifiably consent to be killed (on which more later), it surely is relevant to the justification of an act of killing that the person killed has autonomously decided that she would be better off dead and so asks to be helped to die.

4.5 Objection 5

It is sometimes said that if society allows voluntary euthanasia to be legalized, we will then have set foot on a slippery slope that will lead us eventually to support other forms of euthanasia, including, in particular, non-voluntary euthanasia. Whereas it was once the common refrain that that was precisely what happened in Hitler’s Germany, in recent decades the tendency has been to claim that experience with legalized euthanasia in The Netherlands and Belgium, in particular, has confirmed the reality of the slippery slope.

Slippery slope arguments come in various versions. One (but not the only) way of classifying them has been to refer to logical, psychological and arbitrary line versions. The common feature of the different forms is the contention that once the first step is taken on a slippery slope the subsequent steps follow inexorably, whether for logical reasons, psychological reasons, or to avoid arbitrariness in ‘drawing a line’ between a person’s actions. (For further discussion see, e.g., Rachels 1986; Brock 1992; Walton 1992.)

We need first to consider whether, at the theoretical level, any of these forms of argument is powerful enough to refute the case for the legalization of voluntary euthanasia. We will then be in a position to comment on the alleged empirical support from the experiences of Hitler’s Germany and, more recently, of legalized euthanasia in The Netherlands and elsewhere, for the existence of a slippery slope that will supposedly come into being with the legalization of voluntary euthanasia.

To begin with, there is nothing logically inconsistent in supporting voluntary euthanasia while maintaining the moral inappropriateness of non-voluntary euthanasia. Undoubtedly, some advocates of voluntary euthanasia wish also to lend their support to some acts of non-voluntary euthanasia, for example, for those in persistent vegetative states who have never indicated their wishes about being helped to die, or for certain severely disabled infants for whom the outlook is hopeless. (See, e.g., Kuhse and Singer 1985; Singer 1994; Stingl 2010; Sumner 2017.) Others believe that the consent of the patient is strictly required if euthanasia is appropriately to be legalized. The difference is not a matter of logical acumen; it is to be explained by reference to the importance placed on key values by the respective supporters. Thus, for example, those who insist on the necessity for a competent patient request for medical assistance with dying typically believe that such a request is the paramount consideration in end-of-life decision making (even when it is harnessed to the value of individual well-being), whereas those who consider a person’s best interests to be the paramount consideration are more likely to believe in the justifiability of instances of non-voluntary euthanasia like those mentioned above.

Next, it is hard to see why moving from voluntary to non-voluntary euthanasia is supposed to be psychologically inevitable. Why should those who support the legalization of voluntary euthanasia, because they value the autonomy of the individual, find it psychologically easier, in consequence, to endorse the killing of those who are not able competently to request assistance with dying? What reason is there to believe that they will, as a result of their support for voluntary euthanasia, be psychologically driven to endorse a practice of non-voluntary euthanasia?

Finally, since there is nothing arbitrary about distinguishing voluntary euthanasia from non-voluntary euthanasia (because the line between them is based on clear principles), there can be no substance to the charge that only by arbitrarily drawing a line between them could non-voluntary euthanasia be avoided were voluntary euthanasia to be legalized.

What, though, of Hitler’s Germany and the recent experience of legalized voluntary euthanasia in The Netherlands and elsewhere? The former is easily dismissed as an indication of an inevitable descent from voluntary euthanasia to non-voluntary. There never was a policy in favor of, or a legal practice of, voluntary euthanasia in Germany in the 1920s to the 1940s (see, for example, Burleigh 1994). There was, prior to Hitler coming to power, a clear practice of killing some disabled persons. But it was never suggested that their being killed was justified by reference to their best interests; rather, it was said that society would be benefited. Hitler’s later revival of the practice and its widening to take in other groups such as Jews and gypsies was part of a program of eugenics, not euthanasia.

Since the publication of the Remmelink Report in 1991 into the medical practice of euthanasia in The Netherlands, it has frequently been said that the Dutch experience shows that legally protecting voluntary euthanasia is impossible without also affording shelter to the non-voluntary euthanasia that will follow in its train (see, e.g., Keown 2002). In the period since that report there have been a further four national studies of the practice of euthanasia in The Netherlands. These studies were carried out in 1995, 2001, 2005 and 2010 respectively (see, e.g., Rietjens, et al. 2009; Onwuteaka-Philipsen, et al. 2012). The findings from these national studies have consistently shown that there is no evidence for the existence of such a slippery slope. Among the specific findings the following are worth mentioning: of those terminally ill persons who have been assisted to die about sixty per cent have clearly been cases of voluntary euthanasia as it has been characterised in this entry; of the remainder, the vast majority of cases were of patients who at the time of their medically assisted deaths were no longer competent. It might be thought that these deaths ought to be regarded as instances of non-voluntary euthanasia. But, in fact, it would be inappropriate to regard them as such. Here is why. For the overwhelming majority of these cases, the decisions to end life were taken only after consultation between the attending doctor(s) and close family members, and so can legitimately be thought of as involving substituted judgements. Moreover, according to the researchers, the overwhelming majority of these cases fit within either of two common practices that occur in countries where voluntary euthanasia has not been legalized, namely, that of terminal sedation of dying patients, and that of giving large doses of opioids to relieve pain while foreseeing that this will also end life. In a very few cases, there was no consultation with relatives, though in those cases there were consultations with other medical personnel. The researchers contend that these instances are best explained by the fact that families in The Netherlands strictly have no final legal authority to act as surrogate decision-makers for incompetent persons. For these reasons the researchers maintain that non-voluntary euthanasia is not widely practised in The Netherlands.

That there have only been a handful of prosecutions of Dutch doctors for failing to follow agreed procedures (Griffiths, et al., 1998), that none of the doctors prosecuted has had a significant penalty imposed, that a significant proportion of requests for medical assistance with dying are rejected as unjustifiable, and that the Dutch public have regularly reaffirmed their support for the agreed procedures suggests that, contrary to the claims of some critics, the legalization of voluntary euthanasia has not increased the incidence of non-voluntary euthanasia. A similar picture to the one in The Netherlands has emerged from studies of the operation of the law concerning physician-assisted suicide in Oregon. Indeed, in a recent wide-ranging study of attitudes and practices of voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide covering two continents, a prominent critic of these practices has concluded (in agreement with his co-authors) that little evidence exists of abuse, particularly of the vulnerable (see Emanuel, et al., 2016). Unfortunately, insufficient time has elapsed for appropriate studies to be conducted in the other jurisdictions that have legalized either voluntary euthanasia or physician-assisted suicide. Finally, some commentators have pointed out that there may, in reality, be more danger of the line between voluntary and non-voluntary euthanasia being blurred if euthanasia is practised in the absence of legal recognition, since there will, in those circumstances, be neither transparency nor monitoring (which cannot be said of The Netherlands, Belgium, Oregon and so on).

None of this is to suggest that it is not necessary to ensure the presence of safeguards against potential abuse of legally protected voluntary euthanasia. This is particularly important for the protection of those who have become incompetent by the time decisions need to be taken about whether to assist them to die. Furthermore, it is, of course, possible that the reform of any law may have unintended effects. However, if the arguments outlined above are sound (and the experience in the The Netherlands, Belgium and Luxembourg, along with the more limited experience in several states in the United States, is, for the present, not only the best evidence we have that they are sound, but the only relevant evidence), that does not seem very likely.

It is now well-established in many jurisdictions that competent patients are entitled to make their own decisions about life-sustaining medical treatment. That is why they can refuse such treatment even when doing so is tantamount to deciding to end their life. It is plausible to think that the fundamental basis of the right to decide about life-sustaining treatment – respect for a person’s autonomy and her assessment of what will best serve her well-being – has direct relevance to the legalization of voluntary euthanasia (see, e.g., Dworkin in Frey et al., 1998; Young 2007, 2017; Sumner 2011). In consequence, extending the right of self-determination to cover cases of voluntary euthanasia does not require a dramatic shift in legal policy. Nor do any novel legal values or principles need to be invoked. Indeed, the fact that suicide and attempted suicide are no longer criminal offences in many jurisdictions indicates that the central importance of individual self-determination in a closely analogous context has been accepted. The fact that voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide have not been more widely decriminalized is perhaps best explained along a similar line to the one that has frequently been offered for excluding the consent of the victim as a justification for an act of killing, namely the difficulties thought to exist in establishing the genuineness of the consent. But, the establishment of suitable procedures for giving consent to voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide is surely no harder than establishing procedures for competently refusing burdensome or otherwise unwanted medical treatment. The latter has already been accomplished in many jurisdictions, so the former should be achievable as well.

Suppose that the moral case for legalizing voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide does come to be judged more widely as stronger than the case against legalization, and they are made legally permissible in more jurisdictions than at present. Should doctors take part in the practice? Should only doctors perform voluntary euthanasia? These questions ought to be answered in light of the best understanding of what it is to provide medical care. The proper administration of medical care should promote the welfare of patients while respecting their individual self-determination. It is these twin values that should guide medical care, not the preservation of life at all costs, or the preservation of life without regard to whether patients want their lives prolonged should they judge that life is no longer of benefit or value to them. Many doctors in those jurisdictions where medically assisted death has been legalized and, to judge from available survey evidence, in other liberal democracies as well, see the practice of voluntary euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide as not only compatible with their professional commitments but also with their conception of the best medical care for the dying. That being so, doctors of the same conviction in jurisdictions in which voluntary medically assisted death is currently illegal should no longer be prohibited by law from lending their professional assistance to competent terminally ill persons who request assistance with dying because of irremediable suffering or because their lives no longer have value for them.

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Other Internet Resources

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Robert Young <Robert.Young@latrobe.edu.au>

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