Notes to The Legal Concept of Evidence

1. It is an indication of the breadth and unsettledness of the field that philosophical surveys of legal evidence differ greatly on the issues that are covered. For other surveys, see, e.g., Schum 1998, Goldman 2005, and Jackson and Doran 2010.

2. The definition drafted by Stephen reads as follows:

“Evidence” means and includes—(1) all statements which the Court permits or requires to be made before it by witnesses…; such statements are called oral evidence (2) all documents produced for the inspection of the Court; all such documents are called documentary evidence.

3. To these three is sometimes added a fourth category of “demonstrative evidence” which “includes maps, charts, diagrams, models” (Schum 1994: 93). These devices serve as aids in presenting and understanding evidence.

4. As Schum, 1994: 19, observes, there is a distinction “between evidence and the actual or factual occurrence of the event(s) reported in evidence”. This distinction is also drawn by Wigmore (1937: 45, 318–320) and Keynes (1921: 181).

5. Bentham 1825 is a one-volume English translation of Dumont’s French edition of Bentham’s papers on evidence. Bentham 1827 is a five-volume edition that was prepared by John S. Mill. A statement similar to the one quoted in the text appears in the latter edition, in vol. 4, at 572:

Irrelevant evidence is evidence that bears no efficient relation to the fact which it is brought to prove: evidence which proves nothing: as well might one say, no evidence.

6. It states: “Relevant evidence is admissible unless any [legal rule] provides otherwise. Irrelevant evidence is not admissible”.

7. For a non-mathematical theory of probability that has been applied to legal fact-finding, see Cohen 1977, 1986, discussed in section 3.3.

8. However, evidence, although relevant, may be excluded at the court’s discretion. An example of such a power can be found in Rule 403 of the Federal Rules of Evidence in the United States; this provision allows the court to

exclude relevant evidence if its probative value is substantially outweighed by a danger of…unfair prejudice, confusing the issues, misleading the jury, undue delay, wasting time, or needlessly presenting cumulative evidence.

When evidence is excluded under Rule 403, it is notwithstanding that it is legally relevant under the aforementioned Rule 401 of the Federal Rules of Evidence. Cf. Pattenden, 1996–7, citing (mainly English) cases which suggest that to be legally relevant, the evidence must be logically relevant to the degree that is sufficient to offset any countervailing considerations (similar to the types mentioned in Rule 403) that may arise.

9. See, e.g., the definition of “relevance” in Rule 401 of the Federal Rules of Evidence in the United States: it is not enough that the evidence has a “tendency to make a fact more or less probable”; in addition, it must also be shown that “the fact is of consequence in determining the action.”

10. A similar definition of hearsay is provided in the United States’ Federal Rule of Evidence 801: an out-of-court statement is hearsay if offered “in evidence to prove the truth of the matter asserted in the statement”.

11. Sometimes, the relevance of an item of evidence is said to be conditional on the existence of another fact (Morgan 1929; US Federal Rules of Evidence 104(b)). But this doctrine of “conditional relevance” has been criticised on two separate arguments: first, that evidence that is said to be “conditionally” relevant is already relevant or, secondly, that no evidence is ever relevant in its own right (Ball 1980; Allen 1992, Wigmore 1983a, §14.1; cf. Nance 1990, Friedman 1994).

12. Tribe 1971 was one of the first to caution against the use of mathematical reasoning about probabilities in law. Among other objections, he raises the fear that “the overbearing impressiveness of numbers” (Tribe 1971: 1361) might “dwarf all efforts to put it into perspective with more impressionistic sorts of evidence” (Tribe 1971: 1360), and that allowing a criminal conviction on an explicit quantification of the risk of error will suggest, wrongly, that the law authorises “the imposition of criminal punishment when the trier recognizes a quantifiable doubt as to the defendant’s guilt” (Tribe 1971: 1374).

13. As acknowledged by Justice Harlan in the United States’ Supreme Court case of In Re Winship, 1970, 397 U.S. 358, 371–372. The most famous expression of this relative weighting of likely harms is the Blackstonian dictum that “it is better that ten guilty persons escape, than that one innocent suffer” (Blackstone 1770: 352).

14. Kaplow 2012 proposes a radical reform of the law. The evidential threshold should be set at the level that maximizes social welfare. Unlike the conventional ex post perspective, which focuses on the likelihood of acts that have allegedly been committed and on the “direct operational costs” of “erroneous assignment of liability” (at 746), Kaplow’s theory adopts an ex ante perspective that considers the likely impact of the choice of evidential threshold on social behavior at large. Demanding stronger evidence as a prerequisite to imposing liability would make it more difficult to attract legal sanctions. This will decrease the deterrence of the law (as a result of people knowing that it is now easier to get away with harmful acts) and reduce its chilling effect (people will be less likely to exercise excessive caution and refrain from engaging in benign acts for fear of having sanctions mistakenly imposed on them). Conversely, lowering the evidential demand will have the opposite effects. The optimal threshold is one that maximizes deterrence while minimizing chilling. For detailed criticisms of Kaplow’s proposal on practical, conceptual, and other grounds, see Allen and Stein 2013.

15. Adopting insights from contextualist theories of epistemic justification, Amaya argues in favour of context-sensitive standards of justification for legal fact-finding. On her coherence based theory of justification, contextual factors such as the stakes involved in the case constrain (i) the size of the set of factual hypotheses and evidence which the fact-finder must attend to (these are ground materials for constructing alternative theories of the case), (ii) the number of alternative theories of the case that must be considered, and (iii) the degree of coherence that the most coherent of the alternative theories must satisfy (Amaya 2015: 525–531).

16. There is a large literature on Bayesian analysis in legal fact-finding. Monographs include Eggleston 1983, Schum 1994, Robertson and Vignaux 1995. Special journal issues include Boston University Law Review, 1986, vol. 66, nos. 3 and 4 (Symposium issue, Probability and Inference in the Law of Evidence), republished as Tillers and Green 1988 and International Journal of Evidence and Proof, 1997, vol. 1 (Allen and Redmayne (eds), special issue on Bayesianism and Juridical Proof). Four practitioner guides on communicating and interpreting statistical evidence in the administration of criminal justice have been published by the Royal Statistical Society; of these, two are especially relevant: Aitken, Roberts and Jackson 2010 and Roberts and Aitken 2014. Variations of Bayesian analysis have been suggested: for, e.g., the quasi-objective Bayesianism proposed by Goldman (2002 and 2005) incorporates an objective element.

17. Haack’s “epistemological argument that under certain conditions, a congeries of evidence warrants a conclusion to a higher degree than any of its components alone would do” (Haack 2008a: 253) is one that is long recognised in the legal literature on the analysis of circumstantial evidence: see, e.g., Wills 1852: 161–164.

18. See Amaya 2015: 94–103, for a comprehensive survey of other holistic theories of evidence and legal proof.

19. For other models of legal fact-finding based on abductive reasoning and inference to the best explanation, see Josephson 2001; Schum 2001; Abimbola 2001; Amaya 2009, 2015.

20. For a rigorous and detailed treatment of coherence, see the coherence-based theory of justification for legal fact-finding proposed by Amaya (2008, 2011, 2013, 2015).

21. It is unclear whether it is enough to satisfy the standard of proof beyond reasonable doubt for the prosecution’s hypothesis to survive the challenges or tests that it has been put through at the trial. On Cohen’s theory, the criminal standard is satisfied only by a maximization of the weight of evidence. Weight is ascertained by comparing the evidence made available at the trial with the supposed totality of relevant facts and not the supposed totality of discoverable relevant facts. On Cohen’s theory, if a “vital eyewitness has died without disclosing what he saw”, the prosecution’s case would lack maximal weight and must fail, and this is irrespective, it seems, of how much other evidence is adduced in the case (Cohen 1986: 642; cf. Nance 2008: 280, n. 7, noting that this conclusion is not easy to reconcile with actual criminal litigation).

22. Cohen’s work has influenced another theory of weight which is even more complex than his. According to Stein (2005: 81), probability estimates differ in weight, depending on its “evidential credentials”. The larger the extent to which the evidence “confirms the specific facts that form the examined hypothesis” (Stein 2005: 82) and the more “resilient” the probability assessment is (in the sense of its ability to survive changes in informational base with the introduction of new evidence) (Stein 2005: 48), the greater the weight. This leads him to propose the principle of maximal individualization, according to which the court must receive and consider all “case-specific evidence” pertaining to the dispute and must not make any finding against a litigant unless it rests on argument and supporting evidence that have been exposed to and that survive “maximal individualised examination” (Stein 2005: 100). The latter bears resemblance to Cohen’s idea of weight as a matter of testing hypothesis. On the difficulties in pining down and assessing Stein’s theory, see Redmayne (2006), Pardo (2007) and Nance (2007a).

Copyright © 2015 by
Hock Lai Ho <>

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