Supplement to The Problem of Evil

The Validity of the Argument

That the argument is deductively valid can be seen as follows. First, let us introduce the following abbreviations:

  • \(\textit{State}(x)\): \(x\) is a state of affairs
  • \(\textit{Dying}(x)\): \(x\) is a state of affairs in which an animal dies an agonizing death in a forest fire
  • \(\textit{Suffering}(x)\): \(x\) is a state of affairs in which a child undergoes lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer
  • \(\textit{Bad}(x)\): \(x\) is intrinsically bad or undesirable
  • \(\textit{Omnipotent}(x)\): \(x\) is omnipotent
  • \(\textit{Omniscient}(x)\): \(x\) is omniscient
  • \(\textit{MorallyPerfect}(x)\): \(x\) is morally perfect
  • \(\textit{PreventsExistence}(x,y)\): \(x\) prevents the existence \(y\)
  • \(\textit{God}(x)\): \(x\) is God
  • \(\textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(x,y)\): \(x\) has the power to prevent the existence of \(y\) without hereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good

The argument just set out can then be formulated as follows:

  • (1) \(\exists x [ \textit{State}(x) \,\wedge\) \( ( \textit{Dying}(x) \vee \textit{Suffering}(x) ) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{Bad}(x) \,\wedge \) \( \forall y ( \textit{Omnipotent}(y) \rightarrow \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,x) ) ]\)
  • (2) \(\forall x [ \textit{State}(x) \rightarrow \forall z \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(z,x) ]\)
  • (3) \(\forall x \forall y [ ( \textit{Bad}(x) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,x) \,\wedge\) \( \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(y,x) ) \rightarrow \neg ( \textit{Omniscient}(y) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{MorallyPerfect}(y) ) ]\)

Therefore, from (1), (2), and (3),

  • (4) \(\forall x \neg [ \textit{Omnipotent}(x) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{Omniscient}(x) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{MorallyPerfect(x)}]\)
  • (5) \(\forall x [ \textit{God}(x) \,\rightarrow\) \( (\textit{Omnipotent}(x) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(x) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(x) )]\)


  • (6) \(\neg \exists x [God(x)]\)

The premises here are (1), (2), (3), and (5), and they can be shown to entail the conclusion, (6), as follows.

The Inference from (1), (2), and (3) to (4)

  • (i) \(\textit{State}(A) \wedge (\textit{Dying}(A) \vee \textit{Suffering}(A)) \,\wedge\) \( \textit{Bad}(a) \,\wedge\) \( \forall y (\textit{Omnipotent}(y) \rightarrow \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(y,A))\)
    From (1), via EE (Existential Elimination).
  • (ii) \(\forall z \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(z,A)\)
    From (2) and 1st conjunct of (i) by UE and MP.
  • (iii) \(\textit{Omnipotent}(G)\)
    Assumption for conditional proof (‘\(G\)’ arbitrary)
  • (iv) \(\textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(G,A)\)
    From 4th conjunct of (i), by instantiating ‘\(G\)’ and using MP.
  • (v) \(\neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(G,A)\)
    From (ii), by UE.
  • (vi) \(\textit{Bad}(A) \wedge \textit{HasPowerToPreventWithout}(G,A) \,\wedge\) \( \neg \textit{PreventsExistence}(G,A))\)
    Conjoin 3rd conjunct of (i) with (iv) and (v).
  • (vii) \(\neg(\textit{Omniscient}(y) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))\)
    From (3) and (6), by UE and MP.
  • (viii) \(\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \rightarrow \neg(\textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))\)
    Conditional Proof, (iii)–(vii).
  • (ix) \(\neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))\)
    From (viii), by the equivalence of \(A \rightarrow B\) with \(\neg(A \wedge \neg B)\), double negation elimination, and associativity of conjunctions.
  • (x) \(\forall x \neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(x) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(x) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(x))\)
    From (ix), via UI (Universal Introduction), since ‘\(G\)’ was arbitrary.

The Inference from (4) and (5) to (6)

  • (i) \(\neg(\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))\)
    From (4), via universal insantiation, and where ‘\(G\)’ is arbitrary.
  • (ii) \(\textit{God}(G) \,\rightarrow\) \((\textit{Omnipotent}(G) \wedge \textit{Omniscient}(G) \wedge \textit{MorallyPerfect}(G))\)
    From (5) by universal instantiation.
  • (iii) \(\neg \textit{God}(G)\)
    From (i) and (ii) by modus tollens.
  • (iv) \(\forall x \neg(\textit{God}(x))\)
    From (iii) by universal generalization, since ‘\(G\)’ was arbitrary.
  • (v) \(\neg \exists x (\textit{God}(x))\)
    From (iv), by interdefinability of quantifiers.

Return to The Problem of Evil

Copyright © 2015 by
Michael Tooley

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free