“Feminist aesthetics” does not label a variety of aesthetics in the way that, for example, the terms “virtue theory” and “naturalized epistemology” qualify types of ethics and theories of knowledge. Rather, to refer to feminist aesthetics is to identify a set of perspectives that pursue certain questions about philosophical theories and assumptions regarding art and aesthetic categories. Feminists in general have concluded that, despite the seemingly neutral and inclusive theoretical language of philosophy, virtually all areas of the discipline bear the mark of gender in their basic conceptual frameworks. Those who work in aesthetics inquire into the ways that gender influences the formation of ideas about art, artists, and aesthetic value. Feminist perspectives in aesthetics are also attuned to the cultural influences that exert power over subjectivity: the ways that art both reflects and perpetuates the social formation of gender, sexuality, and identity, and the extent to which all of those features are framed by factors such as race, national origin, social position, and historical situation. These interests have broadened from early analyses of norms governing female appearance to include consideration of the disabled body and of transgender identities.
Aesthetics is by nature rather more interdisciplinary than are some other areas of philosophy, for this field articulates with art practices and the critical disciplines. Contributions to feminist perspectives in aesthetics have been made not only by philosophers but also by art historians, musicologists, and theorists of literature, film, and performance, and by artists themselves. There are practical implications for the discoveries that emerge from feminist investigations: analyses of the historical conceptual frameworks that govern aesthetics and philosophy of art help to account for the disproportionate numbers of men over women as influential practitioners of the arts, for example. Philosophical theories adapted by feminists also have been highly influential in the critical interpretation of art and popular culture and sometimes in the development of contemporary artistic practice. Feminist aesthetics pursues inquiries and critiques that reach into the values at the very foundations of philosophy, examining concepts that often do not directly refer to men and women at all, yet whose hierarchies are imbued with gendered significance.
The following sections each begin with critiques of theoretical traditions and feminist interventions and alternatives. These endeavors lead not only to revisions of philosophical positions but also to the dissemination of feminist perspectives in areas collateral to traditional aesthetics. This progression moves historically through topics that have animated the field, from early work to the most recent.
- 1. Art and Artists: Historical Background
- 2. Creativity and Genius
- 3. Aesthetic Categories and Feminist Critiques
- 4. Feminist Practice and the Concept of Art
- 5. The Body in Art and Philosophy
- 6. Aesthetics and Everyday Life
- 7. Conclusion
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Feminist perspectives in aesthetics first arose in the 1970s from a combination of political activism in the contemporary art world and critiques of the historical traditions of philosophy and of the arts. They have developed in conjunction with the postmodern debates about culture and society that have taken place in many fields in the social sciences and humanities. These debates often begin with an assessment of the western philosophical legacy, a legacy that is nowhere more challenged than in the art world itself. Therefore, the significance of many contemporary art movements, including feminist and postfeminist work, is dramatized and clarified by understanding the traditional values and theories that they address and challenge.
The richest historical target for feminist critiques of philosophies of art has been the concept of fine art, which refers to art that is created chiefly for aesthetic enjoyment. It includes at its core painting, music, literature, and sculpture, and it excludes crafts, popular art, and entertainment. Closely related to the concept of fine art are ideas about the creative genius of the artist, who is often conceived as possessing a unique vision expressed in art works. It was the fine art tradition of painting that art historian Linda Nochlin had in mind in 1971 when she asked her famous question, “Why have there been no great women artists?” (Nochlin 1971 ). Since the modifier “fine” already contains profound implications for the gender of artists, some background regarding the older history of ideas about art and artists is first needed in order to understand the variety of answers that can be provided to that question. This inquiry also positions us to understand the media, subject matter, and styles that contemporary feminist artists and art theorists have advanced. What is more, examination of the ancient roots of philosophy of art reveals a gendered value structure that persists to this day.
The term “art” has not always served as shorthand for the fine arts. Like most of the terms that refer to major conceptual anchors of the western intellectual tradition, its origins may be traced to classical antiquity. The Greek term that we now usually translate “art” is techne, a term that is equally well translated as “skill,” and that in its broadest sense was used to distinguish products of human endeavor from objects of nature. The types of techne that most resemble our modern concept of art are those that are “mimetic” or imitative, that is, that reproduce the look of an object or that express an idea in narrative or drama. Sculpture imitates the human form, for instance; music imitates sounds of nature and voices or—more abstractly—human emotions. Drama and epic poetry imitate lived events. That art’s nature is to be mimetic was widely assumed for centuries, and most commentators, including Aristotle, extolled the ability of the mimetic artist to capture with beauty and skill some truth about life and the world. The Roman historian Pliny the Elder recorded the acclaim for painters who were able to render their subjects in line and color so accurately that they were indistinguishable from their appearance in nature.
Probably the earliest philosophical discussion of art in the Greek tradition occurs in Plato’s Republic. Unlike most of his contemporaries, Plato regarded mimesis as dangerous. The Republic is an extended investigation of the nature of justice, in the course of which Socrates and his friends envision an ideal society that strictly censors and controls art forms such as drama, music, painting, and sculpture. According to Plato’s metaphysics, the abstract world of the Forms possesses a greater degree of reality than the physical world with its changing, unstable events and objects. Hence the more direct the apprehension of Forms, the closer a human mind can approach Truth. Imitations such as paintings mimic the mere appearance of physical objects, becoming (as he puts it in Republic X) three times removed from reality and the truth. Mimesis substitutes illusion for truth, and it does so in seductively pleasurable ways. What is more, arts such as tragic poetry rivet attention by engaging powerful emotions such as fear, enervating the virtues of a courageous person but paradoxically pleasing at the same time. According to Plato’s analysis of the human psyche, the nonrational elements of the soul are powerful forces that might divert the intellect from the cooler apprehension of wisdom; thus the pleasures that mimetic art delivers are sufficiently risky that art should be carefully curbed in a well-governed society.
Plato’s denigration of mimesis does not seem immediately to have anything to do with gender, although his influential system has important indirect implications that are rife with gendered significance. In his preference for the philosophical quest to attain knowledge of the Forms over indulgence in the pleasures of mimesis, for example, one can see a hierarchy of values that rank the eternal, abstract, intellectual world of ideal forms over the transient, particular, sensuous world of physical objects. This hierarchy supports the dualism between mind and body that is deeply correlated with gender asymmetry, and that was a fundamental target of critique in the early development of feminist perspectives in philosophy. Feminist philosophers take note of certain concepts that appear in “binary” combinations: mind-body; universal-particular; reason-emotion, sense, and appetite; and so forth—including male-female. These are not merely correlative pairs, they are ranked pairs in which the first item is taken to be naturally superior to the second (Gatens 1991: 92). Universality is considered superior to particularity because it provides more general knowledge, for example; reason is superior to emotion because it is supposedly a more reliable faculty. Both preferences represent a partiality for “objectivity” over “subjectivity,” concepts that have an especially complicated significance in aesthetics. What is more, the sorts of pleasures that mimesis arouses are emotional and appetitive, appealing more to the body than to the intellect. Therefore we can find in Plato’s peculiar assessment of mimetic arts an elevation of intellect and abstraction over emotion and particularity. While not explicitly invoked, gender is present in assumptions of this discussion, because “male” and “female” (sometimes conflated with “masculine” and “feminine,” though the terms are not synonymous) are root members of the pairs of opposites that have been present in western philosophy since Pythagoras. While there are no direct references to women creators in the Republic, this philosophy of art partakes of gendered concepts at its very core. The implications of such concepts for artists evolve into explicit form with the genesis of the modern category of fine art and its creators.
Scholars disagree about how to date the rise of the special category of arts designated “fine arts” or “beaux arts.” Some claim that the concept begins to emerge in the Renaissance, while others argue that it is not until the eighteenth century that fine art really firms up as a distinct classification (Kristeller 1951–52; Shiner 2001). At this time the idea that art is essentially mimetic begins to recede, and it gradually gives way to a romantic concept of art as self-expression. The eighteenth century is also the period that produces many treatises comparing arts to one another according to shared principles and, even more importantly, develops influential theories about a particular kind of pleasure taken in objects of nature and art that becomes known as “aesthetic” enjoyment. This type of pleasure was central to the theories of taste that characterize the formative theories of aesthetics.
The focus on fine art singles out the purely aesthetic values of works of art and positions them so centrally that the very concept of art is narrowed. Art that is appreciated for its beauty or other aesthetic virtues is distinct from the sorts of arts that produce items for practical use, such as furniture, cushions, or utensils. The latter came to be designated “crafts,” and while their usefulness and skill-requirements were recognized, the making of a craft object was considered decidedly less of an original achievement than the creation of a work of fine art. Artistic creativity increasingly came to be regarded as a kind of personal expression that externalizes the vision of the individual artist in a work of autonomous value; craft, by contrast, aims at some practical function.
The significance of the fine art-craft distinction for the assessment of women’s creative production is substantial. While there are many objects that are excluded from the category of fine art whose makers are male, those objects of domestic use whose creation was predominantly the occupation of women were all marginalized by this category and its attendant values (Parker and Pollock 1981). Thereby the traditional domestic arts were removed from the history of art proper. This historical change suggests one reason that painting, for example, has had so few “great” female practitioners: historically women’s creative efforts were likely to be directed to the production of domestic wares; when these were shunted into the category of “craft,” women’s presence in the genre of visual arts shrank radically.
What is more, the rise of attention to the fine arts gave those arts a particularly public presence. The modern institution of the museum put paintings and sculptures on display; the concert hall made performances available to a larger public (Shiner 2001). This is a period of history when ideas of social propriety were especially divergent for men and women of the middle and upper classes, the chief consumers of the fine arts. While it was considered a domestic benefit for well-bred young ladies to be able to perform music at home for family and guests and to decorate the walls of the home with deft paintings, public exposure of such talents was widely regarded as improper and unfeminine. Therefore, what talents women exercised in areas such as music tended to remain in the amateur realm rather than be exerted in the more public professional world that monitored important developments of art forms. (There are notable exceptions such as the musicians Clara Schumann and Fanny Mendelssohn Hensel, but they are comparatively few.) Thus another reason women artists in many genres take a back seat to their male colleagues is that they withdrew from or were denied the kind of education and training that prepared them for the exacting standards of the public audience. (Nochlin notes how many women painters were trained by artist-fathers who were able to provide them with the kind of training that would otherwise be difficult to obtain; the same may be said of women musicians [Citron 1993; McClary 1991].) These historical explanations illuminate another pair of opposites marked by gender: public-private. This binary has been especially investigated by feminist political theorists but also has considerable significance for philosophy of art (Pollock 1988).
From the above we can see how the concept of “art,” considered in its aspect of “fine art,” is a gendered concept that selects as its paradigms mostly works that have been made by male creators. Awareness of fine art’s exclusionary criteria is evident in contemporary feminist art practice. Mindful of the effects that strict divisions between fine art and craft have exerted over female creativity, feminist artists who were active in the women’s movement of the 1970s, such as Faith Ringgold and Miriam Schapiro, incorporated craft materials such as fiber and cloth into their displays (Lauter 1993). Their work employs materials with domestic and feminine associations, calling attention to the long-overlooked labor of women in art traditions that are different from but no less worthy of attention than the fine arts of painting and sculpture. Indeed, craft objects themselves such as quilts are now occasionally the subject of exhibits in fine-art museums, another recognition that the problematic distinction between fine art and craft dissolves with changing cultural assessments. These sorts of work suggest that, from one point of view, women have not been so much absent from the history of art, as the history of art has screened out many of the forms to which they have traditionally directed their energies.
The area known as “Everyday Aesthetics,” discussed below, has taken up some of these insights and widened the attention of philosophy so that it more readily recognizes the role of creativity in domestic life. Perspectives on domesticity and the daily lives of women have dramatically influenced not only the materials of art but also subjects portrayed. There has been a notable increase of depictions of pregnancy and motherhood in art that manifests feminist thinking, for example (Liss 2009; Brand and Granger 2011). Feminist and postfeminist art has been groundbreaking in the theoretical exploration of the body in its varieties and meanings, including sexuality and maternity. (For an example of the tandem work of art and philosophy, see Dorothea Olkowski’s discussion of the art of Mary Kelly (Olkowski 1999).) The body in art is reviewed in Section 5 below.
In addition to principles of selection, another bias infuses gender into the idea of fine art: the very concept of the artist. For much of the modern period, the very best examples of fine art were understood to be the creative products of artists with special talent amounting to “genius,” and genius is a trait that possesses especially emphatic gender meaning.
While genius is a rare gift, according to most theorists the pool of human beings from which genius emerges includes only men. Rousseau, Kant, and Schopenhauer all declared that women possess characters and mentalities too weak to produce genius. This judgment represents a particular instance of more general theories that attribute to males the strongest and most important qualities of mind, in comparison to which females are but paler counterparts. At least since Aristotle, rationality and strong intellect have been regarded as “masculine” traits that women possess in lesser degrees than men. Women are standardly considered less intellectual but more sensitive and emotional. According to some theories of creativity, emotionality and sensitivity can be inspirational virtues, and so the field of aesthetics has been more responsive to the positive uses to which these traits might be put than are some other areas of philosophy. When it comes to genius, however, male artists get the best of both worlds: the great artistic genius is more than intellectually brilliant; he is also emotionally sensitive and fine-tuned, thus possessing characteristics that are traditionally labeled both “masculine” and “feminine.”
Christine Battersby has detailed the long and complicated history of the concept of genius, which has roots in antiquity (Battersby 1989). By the time it reaches its powerful Romantic form in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, it is especially exclusionary of women artists. The artistic genius was praised not only for the strong mentality that has always been attributed more heavily to men than to women, but also for a sensitivity and creativity that partakes equally of supposedly feminine attributes. Especially in the nineteenth century, such “nonrational” sources of inspiration were extolled for transcending the rules of reason and bringing something new into being. Womanly metaphors of conception, gestation, labor, and birth were liberally appropriated in descriptions of artistic creativity, at the same time that actual women artists were passed over as representatives of the highest aesthetic production.
As the nineteenth century drew on … the metaphors of male motherhood became commonplace—as did those of male midwifery. The artist conceived, was pregnant, laboured (in sweat and pain), was delivered, and (in an uncontrolled ecstasy of agonized—male—control) brought forth. These were the images of ‘natural’ childbirth that the male creators elaborated. (Battersby 1989: 73).
The description of genius with feminine images did not serve to bridge the gulf between male and female artists, partly because of the different ways that their creativity was conceived. Actual childbirth was regarded as an outgrowth of women’s “natural” biological role; their own particular emotions and sensitivities were similarly regarded as manifestations of what nature bestowed upon them. Their artistic expression was thereby categorized less as achievement than as natural display; consequently the expression of feeling in women’s art was often seen as a manifestation of temperament, while strong feelings expressed in the work of men were interpreted as emotions conveyed with mastery and control. By this way of thinking, emotions in women’s art are a byproduct of nature; in contrast, the genius of the male artist produces a new creation that transcends the dictates of nature (Korsmeyer 2004: ch.3).
While by and large disparate evaluations of the capabilities and social roles of men and women have inhibited women’s historical accomplishments in the fine arts, they have not prevented them entirely. Art and music historians have reevaluated the record of fine art and brought a number of women practitioners to the attention of both scholars and general audiences. While there have been relatively few women artists recognized as “great,” they have not been altogether absent from the historical record. What is more, there are certain art forms in which women were the pioneers, such as the prose novel. The novel is a relatively new art form in the west, and it began as popular story-writing whose market demand also afforded opportunities for women writers to earn money. Their works were not always highly praised, for there was a lot of critical disdain for the wide appeal of their stories. Some of them, however, such as George Eliot and Charlotte Brontë, created works of lasting acclaim and even earned that contested accolade, “genius.”
At the same time, a general skepticism about the soundness of the canon of great arts of the past has informed a good deal of feminist scholarship in the critical disciplines, which has reassessed the historical record in painting, music, sculpture, and literature and revised the canon to include neglected works by women. Rediscovery of the work of women of the past was one of the major efforts of feminist scholars during so-called second-wave feminism of the 1970s and 80s, a period that also saw the founding of women’s studies programs at many colleges and universities in North America and Europe. Especially in the early years of such studies, an important goal of scholarship was to give women a fair shot at recognition in order to attain the goal of sexual equality in the arts. As we shall see shortly, this proved to be an initial stage in the development of work in feminist aesthetics.
There has been considerable debate among feminist scholars concerning how to assess the values associated with genius and artistic accomplishment. Some have argued that the idea of genius itself is suspect because of the great disparities in education available to people, and the concept ought simply to be discarded. In addition, valorizing the accomplishments of one individual perpetuates the neglect of joint and communal creativity in favor of a kind of masculine heroism. (In fact, earlier feminist art was often collaborative, an explicit rejection of the idea of individual creativity in favor of joint efforts among women.) Other feminists disagree and have located alternative criteria at work in women’s achievements, arguing that one can discern traditions of female genius at work in the body of art produced by women (Battersby 1989).
Critical attention to the values surrounding genius and the valorization of individual creativity has occasioned some practical recommendations regarding museum displays and the sorts of objects considered worthy of public attention. In fact, recent years have seen increased attention to works produced outside the academic fine art systems, including the creative products of under-represented social minorities. Hilde Hein pursues this point by suggesting that museums might divert traditional interest in “masterworks” and aim at understanding more commonplace objects and their meanings, thus inverting the usual hierarchy of values manifest in museum and gallery displays (Hein 2010). Hein maintains that the nonhierarchical values promoted by feminist theory might motivate museums to reconsider their visitors and the objects on display, reducing the distance between viewer and object that the concept of the masterwork of genius induces (Hein 2011, 2014). Sue Spaid goes even further, advancing a relational collaboration among curators, artists, and viewing public (Spaid 2020; also Reilly 2018).
The debate over creativity is a particular entry into broader discussions over whether women’s art might represent a kind of “gynocentric” tradition different from the androcentric traditions of male artists (Ecker 1986; Hein and Korsmeyer 1993, sect. II). If this is to mean that the works of women artists always manifest certain feminine aesthetic qualities due to their makers’ gender, then many feminists respond negatively, arguing that other social positions (historical, national, ethnic, racial, sexual orientation, and so forth) impose too many differences on women to yield any feminine common denominator to their work (Felski 1989, 1998). On the other hand, some scholars argue that women artists and writers often produce a counter-voice within their ambient traditions which might be considered to claim its own “aesthetic.” Where one stands in this debate depends much on the scope of evidence considered relevant to the question (Devereaux 1998). Claims for a tradition of feminine aesthetics have been widely criticized for essentializing women and ignoring their many social and historical differences (Meagher 2011). At the same time, as Cornelia Klinger observes, speculations about a women’s art tradition seem, in retrospect, to be more sophisticated than the label “essentialism” implies, because they move beyond egalitarian liberalism and recognize the enduring influences of gender in aesthetic productions (Klinger 1998, 350; Eaton 2008). As with virtually all philosophical questions, those concerning commonalities among women artists are revisited from time to time. (In 2015 a conference in Cork, Ireland, was devoted to the topic of “Aesthetics and the Feminine” (Edwards 2016).)
The latter perspective characterizes those scholars who defend the idea that experiences of female embodiment can be manifest in distinctive expressive styles that yet accommodate difference. The most elaborate theoretical framework supporting this approach is provided by work loosely described as “French feminisms.” Hélène Cixous famously proposed the notion of écriture féminine, positing that the expression of women’s lived experience might be impressed in women’s literary production in linguistic styles that offer alternatives to standard objective description and linear temporal development (Cixous 1975/1981). Although they proceed from varying theoretical foundations, including different interpretations of psychoanalytic theory, Luce Irigaray’s notion of writing the body and Julia Kristeva’s positing of modes of semiotic expression that escape patriarchal symbolic discourse, propose parallel methods to distinguish creativity distinct from androcentric styles (Irigaray 1974 ). They need not characterize the writing only of women, however; Kristeva’s theory of the semiotic posits that poetic language taps expressive pre-symbolic resources flowing from infantile experiences in the mother-child dyad (Kristeva 1984). With or without the psychoanalytic frameworks employed by their originators, such ideas have proven fruitful resources for feminist scholars working in a variety of philosophical traditions. For example, Jane Duran has examined the fiction of writers as different as the British novelist Margaret Drabble and the African-American writer Toni Cade Bambara to disclose how expressing embodied experience shares certain traits that are manifest quite differently when inflected by race, social position, and cultural legacy (Duran 2007).
The critique of tradition that fosters “writing the feminine” proceeds from the discovery of a lack at the heart of artistic representation, an absence of voices positioned to express the subjectivities of those who occupy the margins of social power. In counterpoint, Ewa Plonowska Ziarek notes that worlds of art have also provided a wealth of resources to uncover realities of gender, sexuality, social position, and race. However, the project of developing feminist aesthetics has often been eclipsed by the political urgencies thereby disclosed, sidelining feminism within aesthetics and aesthetics within feminism. Ziarek examines the works of modernist women writers, arguing that the very artistic form of their works unifies the efforts of feminism and political practice in “complex relations between political and aesthetic transformations, their relation to gender and race differences, and the role of materiality in political contestation and aesthetic invention” (Ziarek 2012a, 392; Ziarek 2012b).
The foregoing has reviewed feminist reflections on theories of art, noting how the histories of women in the arts inform contemporary feminist debates and practices. Equally important are assessments of the values that comprise the conceptual frameworks of aesthetics, from which some of the most influential tools of feminist critical analysis emerge.
A good deal of feminist criticism has been focused on eighteenth-century philosophy because of the many influential works on beauty, pleasure, and taste that were written at that time and that became foundational texts for contemporary theories. “Taste” refers to a capacity that permits good judgments about art and the beauties of nature. While the metaphor for perception is taken from the gustatory sense, these theories are actually about visual, auditory, and imaginative pleasure, since it is widely assumed that literal taste experience is too bodily and subjective to yield interesting philosophical problems. Judgments of taste take the form of a particular kind of pleasure—one that eventually became known as “aesthetic” pleasure (a term that entered English only in the early nineteenth century).
The major theoretical concepts of this period are riddled with gendered significance, although tracing gender in the maze of writings of this time is a task complicated by the unstable role of sexuality in theories of aesthetic pleasure. According to its most austere analysis—which came to dominate aesthetics and philosophy of art for a time—aesthetic enjoyment has nothing to do with sexuality at all: Aesthetic pleasure is not a sensuous, bodily gratification; it is free from practical considerations and purged of desire. The two kinds of desire that most interrupt aesthetic contemplation are hunger and sexual appetite, which are the “interested” pleasures par excellence. Aesthetic pleasures are contemplative and “disinterested” (to use Kant’s term from the Critique of Judgment, 1790). It is disinterestedness that rids the perceiver of the individual proclivities that divide people in their judgments and that clears the mind for common, even universal agreement about objects of beauty. Ideally, taste is potentially a universal phenomenon, even though its “delicacy,” as Hume put it, requires exercise and training. To some degree, the requirements of taste may be seen as bridging the differences among people. But there is an element of leisure embedded in the values of fine art, and critics have argued that taste also ensconces and systematizes class divisions (Shusterman 1993; Mattick 1993).
Even as theorists extolled the possibilities for universal taste, however, they often drew gender distinctions regarding its exercise. Many theorists argued that women and men possess systematically different tastes or capabilities for appreciating art and other cultural products. The most noticeable gender distinctions occur with the two central aesthetic categories of the eighteenth century, beauty and sublimity. Objects of beauty were described as bounded, small, and delicate—“feminized” traits. Objects that are sublime, whose exemplars are drawn chiefly from uncontrolled nature, are unbounded, rough and jagged, terrifying—“masculinized” traits. These gender labels are unstable, however, for the terrors of nature have an equally strong history of description as “feminine” forces of chaos (Battersby 1998). What is more, gendered meanings in the sublime are intensified by surrounding discourse about the strange, exotic, and foreign. Meg Armstrong argues that “exotic” bodies become subjected to aesthetic discourse in theories of the sublime, noting that Burke singles out the black female body as a special object of terror (Armstrong 1996). In short, aesthetic objects take on both gendered and racialized meanings with the concepts of beauty and sublimity (Bindman 2002). Moreover, so do aesthetic appreciators. As Kant put it in his earlier Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (1763), a woman’s mind is a “beautiful” mind. But a woman is incapable of the tougher appreciation and insight that sublimity discloses (Wiseman 1993, Kneller 1993). The preclusion of women from the experience of the sublime limits their competence to apprehend the moral and existential weight of the might and magnitude of both nature and art. Women’s supposed weaker constitutions and moral limitations, as well as their social restrictions, contributed to a concept of sublimity that marks it as masculine. Debates over the nature and concept of sublimity gave rise to feminist debates over whether one can discern in the history of literature an alternate tradition of sublimity that counts as a “female sublime” (Freeman 1995, 1998; Battersby 1998, 2007; Mann 2006).
The careful purging of sensual pleasure from aesthetic enjoyment mingles with the paradoxical employment of female bodies as examples of aesthetic objects. Among the things that are naturally agreeable to human nature, Hume lists music, good cheer, and “the fair sex.” And Kant states, “The man develops his own taste while the woman makes herself an object of everybody’s taste.” (Kant 1798 [1978: 222]) Edmund Burke frankly eroticizes beauty when he speculates that the grace and delicacy of line that mark beautiful objects are reminiscent of the curves of the female body (Burke 1757/1968). If women are the objects of aesthetic pleasure, then the actual desire of the perceiver must be distanced and overcome in order for enjoyment to be purely aesthetic. This outcome is one implication of the notion of disinterested pleasure. This requirement, it would seem, assumes a standard point of view that is masculine and heterosexual. But of course women are also subjects who exercise taste. This implies that women are unstably both aesthetic subject and object at the same time. As a rule, the connoisseur, the so-called man of taste, was indeed male, and female bodies—in reality or represented in art—figured among the objects of aesthetic pleasure. However, women were also participants in the development of aesthetic ideals, and Terry Robinson argues that they actively shaped the concept of the beautiful female body (T. Robinson 2018).
Disinterestedness has a long history; it characterizes the popular aesthetic attitude theories of the twentieth century, which argued that a prerequisite for any kind of full appreciation of art is a distanced, relatively contemplative stance towards a work of art. Similar assumptions about the most suitable way to view art lie behind the formalist criticism that dominated visual art interpretation for decades, and that also characterize interpretive norms in other art forms such as literature and music (McClary 1991, 4; Devereaux 1998; Brand 2000). The value of disinterested aesthetic enjoyment has come under heavy critical scrutiny on the part of feminists. Some have deconstructed this idea and argued that a supposedly disinterested stance is at least sometimes actually a covert and controlling voyeurism and as such ought to be abandoned as an aesthetic ideal. Others caution against discarding standards of disinterested, impartial judgment altogether, arguing that such a move relinquishes the important normativity of aesthetic evaluations (Eaton 2008, 2012). Nonetheless, even if disinterestedness and related standards of objectivity are retained, feminists continue to draw attention to the ways in which the mere act of looking can manifest relations of social power. Anne Eaton proposes an alternative notion of “situatedness,” importing into aesthetics a version of feminist standpoint theory to draw attention both to audience positions of appreciation and to the perspectives evoked in works of art (Eaton 2009).
Criticisms of theories that mandate disinterested or distanced aesthetic enjoyment have given rise to influential feminist theories of the perception and interpretation of art. The type of art that has come in for particular scrutiny in terms of the implications of disinterested enjoyment is visual art, and a good deal of argument about what has become known as “the male gaze” has been produced by film theorists and art historians, and subsequently investigated by philosophers. The phrase “male gaze” refers to the frequent framing of objects of visual art so that the viewer is situated in a “masculine” position of appreciation. By interpreting objects of art as diverse as paintings of the nude and Hollywood films, these theorists have concluded that women depicted in art are standardly placed as objects of attraction (much as Burke had lined up women as the original aesthetic object); and that the more active role of looking assumes a counterpart masculine position. As Laura Mulvey puts it, women are assigned the passive status of being looked-at, whereas men are the active subjects who look (Mulvey 1989). Art works themselves prescribe ideal viewing positions. While many women obviously also appreciate art, the stance they assume in order to appreciate works in the ways disposed by tradition requires the donning of a masculine perceptual attitude.
Theories of the male gaze come in several varieties: Psychoanalytic theories dominate film interpretation, (Mulvey 1989, 2019; Doane 1991; Chanter 2008); but their presumptions and methodology are contested by philosophers more attuned to cognitive science and analytic philosophy (Freeland 1998a; Carroll 1995; Cunliffe 2019). Versions of the male gaze can be found in the existentialist feminism of Simone de Beauvoir (Beauvoir 1949/2011); and there are empirically-minded observations that confirm the dominance of male points of view in cultural artifacts without adopting any particular philosophical scaffolding. These theories differ in their diagnosis of what generates the “maleness” of the ideal observer for art. For psychoanalytic theorists, one must understand the operation of the unconscious over visual imagination to account for the presence of desire in objects of visual art. For others, historical and cultural conditioning is sufficient to direct appreciation of art in ways that privilege masculine points of view. Despite many significant theoretical differences, analyses of the gaze converge in their conclusion that much of the art produced in the Euro-American traditions situates the ideal appreciator in a masculine subject-position. There is debate over the dominance of the male position in all art, for appreciative subjects cannot be understood simply as “masculine” but require further attention to sexuality, race, and nationality (Silverman 1992; hooks 1992, 1995; Yancy 2016). Sometimes a facile reading of the gaze tempts one to exaggerate the sharpness of gender distinctions into the male viewer and the female object of the gaze, though most feminists avoid such over-simplification. Despite their differences, theories of the gaze reject the idea that perception is ever merely passive reception. All of these approaches assume that vision possesses power: power to objectify—to subject the object of vision to scrutiny and possession. (For example, seeing oneself as the exotic Other in orientalist paintings heightens the political aura of art produced in dominant western cultures (Al-Saji 2019).) Since social norms frame and amplify the operation of perception, there may be inflections of gender in the very act of seeing (Tullman 2017). Examinations of aesthetic perception have provided theoretical tools of inestimable value in calling attention to the fact that looking is rarely a neutral operation of the visual sense. As Naomi Scheman states:
Vision is the sense best adapted to express this dehumanization: it works at a distance and need not be reciprocal, it provides a great deal of easily categorized information, it enables the perceiver accurately to locate (pin down) the object, and it provides the gaze, a way of making the visual object aware that she is a visual object. Vision is political, as is visual art, whatever (else) it may be about (Scheman 1993: 159).
Not only what is seen but what is rendered invisible or shadowy demands additional examination, as with M.G. Davidson’s analysis of the way that photographs of black women subtly train the white male gaze and with Paul Taylor’s study of the complexities of the phrase “Black is beautiful” (Davidson 2016; Taylor 2016). Occluding persons from nondominant cultures and social groups in visual production can exert powerful political force (Ortega 2019b; Ortega, Pitts, and Medina 2019).
Theories of the gaze stress the activity of vision, its mastery and control of the aesthetic object. These theories reject the separation of desire from pleasure, reinstating into the core of beauty the sort of erotic, covetous gaze that was eliminated from aesthetic disinterestedness. While not all art invites understanding in terms of the gaze, much does; perhaps nowhere is the ideology of extreme disinterested contemplation more questionable than when applied to paintings of female nudes, which one feminist scholar argues virtually define the modern fine art of painting (Nead 1992). Aesthetic ideologies that would remove art from its relations with the world disguise its ability to inscribe and to reinforce power relations. The erotic in art is one of those relations, and denying its presence disguises both its persuasive sway and its aesthetic force (Eaton 2012). With visual art, those relations are manifest in vision itself: the way it is depicted in a work and the way it is directed in the observer outside the work. Becoming attuned to the prescribed viewing-position of a work of visual art brings desire and suppressed heteroeroticism into focus and illuminates other presumptions about the ideal audience for art, such as sexual identity and race (Roelofs 2009, 2014). Depictions of the body in art are continuous with pornographic and erotic representations, other areas of feminist investigations (Maes and Levinson 2012; Eaton 2007, 2012, 2017, 2018; Kania 2012; Shusterman 2021).
Many of these critical investigations can be ordered into a sustained critique of aesthetic practices, in particular, of what is presented in the name of beauty. Of all the concepts within aesthetics, for feminist consideration there is none so central, so contested, so rejected, and so embraced as beauty. Beauty is an enormous category of value, for so many disparate things are beautiful that generalizing about its nature is a formidable challenge. Beauty is among the oldest of philosophical value concepts, with Plato numbering among its formative theorists. Plato focused on beauty as an abstract form whose essence is bestowed on the particular items that instantiate it, and in keeping with this foundational model, philosophers have usually treated beauty in the most general of terms. Combined with the modern notion of disinterested attention, this approach to aesthetic value seems to aim at the highest level of universality of appreciation. Yet at the same time, as noted above, one of the central exemplars of beauty has been the (young, pretty, pale-skinned) female body, which exerts erotic attraction and promises satisfaction of physical desire. Critiques of the gender-inflection in supposedly neutral theories, as well as its racialized implications, numbered among the early feminist revisions in aesthetics. These theoretical efforts merged with social critiques of beauty norms that circulated in the late twentieth century. What is more, for some time, beauty was rather sidelined in the art world as well (Danto 2003). As a result, beauty fell out of favor, and for quite a while one could find little original work published on the subject.
All that began to change around 1990, and since the turn of the last millennium there has been a veritable explosion of interest in beauty among philosophers, artists, critics, and cultural theorists—feminists among them (Brand 2000, 2013; Higgins, Maira, and Sikka 2017). While some of this work continues to consider the general traits of beauty in art and nature, quite a lot of it focuses on the norms of appearance of the human body, and the “violation” of “standard” norms according to race, disability, age, history, and variant sexual morphologies. Such standards govern not only artistic depictions, but also the way that real people shape and reshape their own bodies to conform to reigning standards of attractiveness (Devereaux 2013; Wegenstein 2012). Feminists and critical race theorists have been especially mindful of diversity and suspicious of general norms and the harms that they can occasion. Yet at the same time feminists have recognized the pull of pleasure and the importance of beauty in life as well as art. Seeking to avoid the dogma of universalism, Janet Wolff proposes an aesthetics of “uncertainty” that recognizes that norms of beauty are grounded in communities and are thus ineluctably political, and yet does not relinquish the value of beauty (Wolff 2006).
Similar recognition of the potentials for both danger and pleasure in beauty is found in investigations that seek to decenter notions of beauty with reference to race, indigenous people, and subaltern cultures (e.g. Brand 2000, 2013, and Felski 2006). Nor is this a theoretical effort alone; artists are major participants in the reclamation of beauty that takes as many forms as humanity offers. The upshot of this work is not to reinstate beauty back on its abstract pedestal, but to retain its pleasures while being alert to its dangers. As Monique Roelofs observes, “the menace and promise of the beautiful as a bearer of aesthetic value, a dimension of experience, and a category of cultural criticism turn on the ways in which we may dislocate its relational functioning” (Roelofs 2013: 73). The functions of beauty include the seductions of advertising, a pervasive social phenomenon that reinforces and manipulates ideals of femininity and thus represents another important target for feminist examinations (Michna 2016; Widdows 2019). In addition, the growing field of somaesthetics has increasingly focused on the body, the care of the self, and gendered ideals of beauty that affect men as well as women (Hyvönen 2020), as well as the performative body in dance (Banes 1998; Bresnahan, Katan-Schmid and Houston 2020) and competitive sports (Morgan and Edgars 2021).
Feminist analyses of aesthetic practices of the past have influenced the production of feminist art of our own times, and the latter in turn has contributed to a dramatic alteration of the climate of the art world. The changes that have beset the worlds of art in the twentieth century, perhaps most dramatically in the fields of the visual arts, are frequently the subject of philosophical discussions in the analytic tradition regarding the possibility of defining art (Danto 1981; Davies 1991; Carroll 2000). One challenge to defining art stems from the fact that contemporary artists frequently create with the intention of questioning, undermining, or rejecting values that defined art of the past. The early and mid-twentieth century extravagances of Dada and Pop Art are most often the target of philosophical inquiries, which seek to discover commonalities among artworks that have few to no perceptible defining similarities.
As we have seen, the category of fine art has been a focus of feminist scholarly scrutiny because its attendant values screened out much of women’s creative efforts or actively dissuaded their attempts to practice certain genres. However, the dissolution of the values of fine art long preceded the art scene that feminists entered in the 1970s. In spite of sweeping changes in the concepts of art and its purposes that characterize much art of the last century, the numbers of women practitioners in arts such as painting, sculpture, and music remained small. Therefore, while fine art may have historical importance for women’s artistic influence, it clearly was not the perpetuating cause of their exclusion from the worlds of art. The anti-art and avant garde movements so frequently discussed by contemporary analytic philosophers were just as male-dominated as classical music or Renaissance sculpture. Moreover, values surrounding the artistic “genius” were just as vigorous as ever. Therefore, feminist art practices began as activist movements (such as the Guerrilla Girls of New York City) to secure women more visibility and recognition in the artworld (Guerrilla Girls 2020). Feminist artists not only demanded that their work be taken seriously, they mounted a critique of the traditional thinking that lay behind their exclusions from the powerful centers of culture.
For these reasons, feminist art itself also furnishes numerous examples that subvert older models of fine art, but with added layers of meaning that distinguish it from earlier iconoclastic movements. Because of the gendered significance of the major concepts of the aesthetic tradition, feminist challenges often systematically deconstruct the concepts of art and aesthetic value reviewed above. Feminist art has joined—and sometimes has led—movements within the artworld that perplex, astound, offend, and exasperate, reversing virtually all the aesthetic values of earlier times. As art critic Lucy Lippard put it, “feminism questions all the percepts of art as we know it” (Lippard 1995: 172). Feminist artists have challenged the ideas that art’s main value is aesthetic, that it is for contemplation rather than use, that it is ideally the vision of a single creator, that it should be interpreted as an object of autonomous value (Devereaux 1998). Feminism itself came under internal criticism for its original focus on white, western women’s social situations, a familiar critique in feminist circles that has a presence in aesthetic debates. By the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, the energies of feminist and postfeminist artists of diverse racial and national backgrounds have made the presence of women in the contemporary artworld today powerful and dramatic (Deepwell 2020). Self-referential explorations of identity and agency—often through performance art—have been led by women of color such as Adrian Piper, who is also a philosopher (Piper 1996), as well as by lesbian and trans artists whose work gives rise to queer feminist art histories (Jones and Silver 2015).
In many discussions of contemporary art, “feminist” is a label for work produced during the active phase of second-wave feminism from the later 1960s to about 1980. The term “postfeminist” is now in use for a subsequent generation of artists who pursue some of the ideas and interests of the earlier period. These terms are far from precise, and there are many artists practicing today who continue to identify themselves with the term “feminist.” Perhaps an even larger group does not attend particularly to labels, but their work is so provocative about the subjects of gender and sexuality that it has become a focus for feminist interpretation. (The photographic art of Cindy Sherman is a case in point.)
In brief, feminist artists share a political sense of the historic social subordination of women and an awareness of how art practices have perpetuated that subordination—which is why the history of aesthetics illuminates their work. The more politically-minded artists, especially those who participated in the feminist movement of the 1970s, often turned their art to the goals of freeing women from the oppressions of male-dominated culture. (Examples of such work include the Los Angeles anti-rape performance project of Suzanne Lacy and Leslie Leibowitz, In Mourning and in Rage (1977), and Womanhouse (1972), a collaboration of twenty-four artists.) Feminist artists opened up previously taboo subjects such as menstruation and childbirth for artistic presentation, and they began to employ female body images widely in their work. All of these moves were controversial, including within the feminist community. For example, when Judy Chicago made her large collaborative installation “The Dinner Party” in the early 1970s, she was both praised and criticized for the thematic use of vaginal imagery in the table settings that represented each of thirty-nine famous women from history and legend (Chicago and Lucie-Smith 1999). Critics objected that she was both essentializing women and reducing them to their reproductive parts; admirers praised her transgressive boldness. Since that time, the increasing numbers of artistic portrayals of the female body and its cycles has rendered these subjects less taboo and transgressive, although they remain provocative and sometimes disturbing. Early in his writing of feminist criticism for The Nation, Arthur Danto characterized such work by feminist artists as ‘disturbatory’ (Argüello 2017; Brand Weiser 2021).
Postfeminist artists, such as Kiki Smith and Jenny Saville, build upon the efforts of their predecessors in exploring the body, gender, and sexual identity. Postfeminist art, often highly theoretical and deeply serious, also tends to be playful and parodic in style, such as the work of Vanessa Beecroft. It tends to be less overtly political than the art of earlier feminists. Influenced by postmodern speculations that gender, sexuality, and the body itself are creations of culture that are malleable and performative, postfeminist art confounds and disrupts notions of stable identity (Grosz 1994; Butler 1990, 1993). Such art can be seen as individualistic compared to the social agendas of earlier feminism, but perhaps for this reason this sort of art is also more attuned to differences among women. These presentations of the female body tend to draw attention to the position it has in culture: not only the sexed body, but also bodies marked by racial and cultural differences (James 2010). In the 1970s and 80s, Cuban-American artist Ana Mendieta produced a series of works making use of her own body to form silhouettes and shapes. All of this activity is theoretically charged and often philosophically motivated (Reckitt 2001, Heartney 2013). At the same time, it should be stressed that the kinds of art that qualify to be labeled “feminist” are hugely varied and heterogeneous. And as time passes and political climates shift, the interventions of artists and their visionary critiques alter accordingly. Twenty-first century theorizing about feminist art now includes acknowledgement of the many forms of global feminisms and increased frequency of feminist content that deals with war and politics. Robinson and Buszek offer a refreshed definition of “feminist art” that is not a simple classification of a type of art, but rather indicates the space where feminist politics and the domain of art-making intersect (Robinson and Buszek 2019; also Armstrong and de Zegher 2006).
Possibly there is no topic more discussed in feminist art and philosophy today than “the body.” This interest represents continued explorations and critiques of traditional mind-body dualism, the role of sexual morphology in the development of gender and the self, and the venerable association of women with matter and physicality. All these subjects link gender analysis to the history of philosophical concepts, both in the west (which most of this entry has emphasized) and in eastern traditions (Man 2000, 2015, 2016). Both the artistic and the theoretical modes of exploration of the body can be viewed as complementary elements of feminist aesthetics. This topic covers very broad territory and includes the mutual involvement of aesthetic norms with ethical judgments; aesthetic standards and implications about bodies that appear deviant from standard concepts of “normal”; and the participation of the bodily senses in aesthetic appreciation (Irvin 2016).
To begin with the last topic mentioned above: Both artists and philosophers have reevaluated the senses and the orthodox materials that are fashioned into objects of art. As we saw when considering philosophies of taste and the formation of the idea of the aesthetic, the literal sense of taste has customarily never been considered a truly “aesthetic” sense, its pleasures and mode of apprehension being too bodily and sensuous to qualify. Vision and hearing are the aesthetic senses proper, according to traditional theory. This judgment is under question now, as the senses themselves are under reevaluation (Howes 1991). Early speculation about the possible gendering of sense experience was ventured by theorists such as Irigaray and Cixous, and a number of artists indirectly probe the issue by employing foodstuffs as the medium for their works (Korsmeyer 2004, chs. 4–5). The presence of actual food—as opposed to the depictions of still life painting—in art installations confounds traditional aesthetic ideals on a number of fronts. It challenges the idea that art has lasting value, because it literally decays. And while such art is to be viewed, it synaesthetically teases the senses of taste and smell as well. But it often does so without the benefits that actual eating provides, for art made from food is not necessarily itself a meal. In fact, rather than pleasing to the sense of taste, this art frequently trades on the arousal of disgust in the sensuous imagination. (Janine Antoni, for example, has fashioned large sculptures from lard and from chocolate, employing her mouth, teeth, and tongue as the carving tools. Hardly appealing to the gustatory sense, this work nonetheless arouses a somatic response at the same time that it invites rumination on the venerable hierarchy of the senses that puts the distance senses of sight and hearing above the bodily senses of touch, smell, and taste.)
A number of artists today are using food that can be eaten, inviting the public into a participatory relationship with their works (Smith 2013). The uses of food on the part of female artists are particularly significant, given the traditional association of women with the body, with feeding and nurturance, and with transience and mortality. Not only these venerable concepts but also the versions they manifest in the contemporary social order are present in today’s art scene, such as Kara Walker’s 2014 work A Subtlety, a giant sculpture of sugar and molasses that explores eroticism, race, and the legacies of American slavery (Davidson 2016). The very presence of such creations in the artworld today has contributed to consternation on the part of professionals and public alike about just how art is to be defined and conceived. There is no particular feminist “definition” of art, but there are many uses to which feminists and postfeminists turn their creative efforts: exploring gender and sexuality as well as criticizing the traditions of art and of beauty imposed by aesthetic standards of the past.
The sense of taste is but one zone where the aesthetic dimensions of bodily sensation are recognized and explored, in dramatic contrast to the traditional idea that aesthetic “distance” is required for the true apprehension of art. Erotic desires, sexuality, and bodily sensation in general are increasingly central elements both of art and of aesthetic discourse, and feminist investigators have been among the important contributors to this movement (Lintott 2003; Lorde 2007; Grosz 2008; Lintott and Irvin 2016).
Critical consideration of norms of female beauty and the artistic depiction of women influences the ways that feminist artists employ their own bodies in creating art (Brand 2000, 2013; Steiner 2001; Banes 1998). The work of artists across the globe utilizes bodies in different cultural and political contexts, dramatizing the recognition prevalent in contemporary feminist theory that there is no such thing as the female body, only bodies marked by the differences of their historical situation, their geographical location, their social position, their race (Hobson 2005; Tate 2009; Roelofs et al 2009; Taylor 2016). A wide spectrum of identities and desires are explored in text, image, and performance, including sexual morphology—transgender, female, male, intersex. Revaluation of bodies with abilities and disabilities represents yet another way in which aesthetic investigations have political impact (Silvers 2000; Millett-Gallant 2010; Siebers 2010). The most dramatic uses of artists’ bodies occur with the relatively new genre of performance art, in which feminists have been pioneers.
A good deal of performance art has been highly controversial, partly because of the exposure of the bodies of the artists in ways that not only challenge norms of female beauty but are deliberately gross or even borderline pornographic. The art tradition was long accustomed to pictures of nude females arranged in alluring poses. A performance artist who manipulates her body in ways that reverse the values of that tradition confronts the audience with a direct and emotionally difficult challenge to those values. Karen Finley, to mention a well-known case, called attention to the sexual exploitation of women by smearing her body with foodstuffs resembling blood and excrement. This is an especially political use of disgust—an emotion that in earlier times was explicitly precluded from aesthetic arousal but that has become a major feature of the comprehension and appreciation of contemporary art (Korsmeyer 2011). What at first disgusts, however, may come to lose its stigma, and displays of the body are also deployed to induce acceptance. Regarding what at first appear as disfigurements with aesthetic openness can broaden both our sensibilities and our social horizons (Irvin 2017; Protasi 2017). Artists have contributed to changes in the social imagination about gender fluidity. While the concept of the sexed body has seemed in the past to be dictated by nature, transgender and non-binary artists are among those who challenge the idea that morphology at birth must determine the course of one’s life (Mostovoy in Brand Weiser 2018; Vaid-Menon 2020).
Feminist explorations of embodiment and the deliberate arousal of disgust as an aesthetic response have at least two kinds of political and philosophical import. First of all, they invert feminine ideals that frame restrictive norms for personal appearance. This can be done humorously, boldly, sadly, aggressively, casually; much depends on the individual work. There are numerous ways to challenge the traditional aesthetic values expected in the female body, with disturbing emotional effects that make the audience question those values and their comprehensiveness. In addition, the arousal of disgust often occurs when artists move from consideration of the exterior of the body to its warm, dark, sticky interior where unmentionable substances are kept hidden away. The deliberate cultivation of that which is not pretty but is grossly material is the occasion for presenting formerly taboo aspects of bodies: menstrual blood, excrement, internal organs. Female artists are not the only ones who explore interiority and materiality in art, of course. However, because of the traditional linkage of gross matter with the “feminine” (now the terrible feminine, not the highly socialized feminine of Burke’s beauty principle), when female artists explore such themes they cannot but allude to venerable conceptual frameworks. This is a complex and delicate territory for feminist investigation: the ancient category of the feminine that includes the element of untamed nature and the gross matter of existence. Feminist uses of these types of objects play upon myths of nature and culture, of horror and sublimity, and of death and life. Rather than keeping these themes in the uncanny but clean realms of myth, however, the presentation of entrails, blood, and—sometimes literally—flesh confronts the audience with a particular and disturbing presence of the artist herself. Indeed, such theorizing extends beyond art into lived reality with philosophical attention to such intrinsically female events as childbirth, a transformative experience in which some theorists find elements of the sublime (Lintott 2011).
The provocative ideas of French philosopher and psychoanalyst Luce Irigaray have provided inspiration for a number of feminist artists who seek to bring forth a “sexuate” perspective in their work that does not borrow from the patriarchal tradition, for the latter, according to Irigaray, has always eclipsed the expression of the “feminine.” The body and its morphology are central to Irigaray’s philosophical method, as she insists that sexuate being pervades one’s existence, and that the pretense of shedding one’s sex when writing or speaking in standard, familiar idioms and syntax causes the feminine to disappear into the masculine/neutral discourse that dominates the patriarchal order. As she puts it in the title of one of her widely-read essays, “Any theory of the subject has always been appropriated by the masculine” (Irigaray 1974 [1985: 133]). One of Irigaray’s projects is to evoke feminine subjectivity that can be represented in its own terms, not just as an absence in the symbolic order. While the intricacies of her philosophy are opaque and sometimes difficult to pin down, her suggestive ideas have furnished inspiration for many feminist artists. The psychoanalytic work of Bracha Ettinger concerning subjectivity and gendered consciousness is equally developed in her writings and in her visual art and indeed can be considered as much theory as aesthetic production (Ettinger 2006; Pollock 2008).
Feminist interpretive theories include approaches that are both competing and complementary, and they represent some of the same rivalries that are present in contemporary philosophy, broadly construed. Adaptations of psychoanalytic theory have an especially large presence in the interpretation of performance, literature, film and visual arts. Some feminists employ the discourse of Jacques Lacan, whose concept of the symbolic order has been widely applied to understand the power of patriarchy embedded in cultural forms of every kind (Copjec 2002). Julia Kristeva, who analyzes the artistic experience of “abjection” as a threat to self arising from both the allure and the horror of self-disintegration and reabsorption into the body of the mother, has been especially provocative for understanding the aesthetic arousal of disgust and the strong sexual and gendered elements of horror (Kristeva 1982; Creed 1993, Ortega 2019a). Far from a mere application of a theory to aesthetics, the feminist uses of abjection have explored and enlarged the concept in order to understand not only the psychological development of individuals but also the construction of social and political relations (Chanter 2008).
The uses of psychoanalytic theory in aesthetics mark an area of controversy that is importantly discipline-based. Many philosophers, especially those of the analytic and postanalytic traditions, reject the assumptions required by these approaches as empirically baseless and theoretically otiose. They argue that empirical, particularist analyses of individual works have more explanatory power to illuminate the positions that gender manifests in art (Freeland 1998a, 1998b; Carroll 1995). Thus differences over interpretive theory represent divisions both within philosophy itself and in transdisciplinary scholarship. Debates over appropriate tools to understand the meaning of art and the power of culture should lay to rest once and for all any idea that “feminist aesthetics” describes a unitary set of ideas.
As is evident from the foregoing discussion, one can find in feminist philosophy avenues of thought that direct inquiry away from the worlds of art and to the presence of aesthetic features in lived experience. Art and aesthetic qualities are obviously not merely theoretical objects; they are cultural products with considerable authority to frame and to perpetuate social relations and values. Therefore feminist aesthetics contains a component where theories of interpretation are directed to particular works of culture. Such perspectives are poised to illuminate the changes in social institutions that are depicted in popular art forms such as literature and film, revealing the large-scale influence that aspects of the political feminist movement have had over marriage and family relations (S.T. Ross 2016). Aesthetic norms are not limited to art but extend into virtually all aspects of life, including dress, personal adornment, and comportment. With dress, for example, perceived aesthetic incongruity has political resonance, as with Muslim women who choose to wear the hijab in countries where such garb has not been a historical norm (Sheth 2009, 2019). Feminist perspectives extend to the aesthetic frames of lived experience and the subtle forces they exert (Archer and Ware 2018).
The turn of attention to the body and its appearance, as well as to domestic environments, has contributed to an area of interest loosely labeled “everyday aesthetics.” Scholarship on everyday aesthetics includes examination of craft practices, which are often pursued in the home where many women continue to work, and to artistic traditions that do not feature a distinction between “fine art” and “craft,” such as the cultural traditions of Asia (Saito 2007, 2017; Mandoki 2007; Leddy 2012; Light and Smith 2004). Cooking, eating, arranging furniture and shelves, gardening—all these quotidian activities have aesthetic features (for gardening see S. Ross 1998; Miller 1993). Such activities are not always uplifting or even pleasant, but attention to their sensuous character, the rhythm they impose on the day, week, or year, and their place in the patterns of life, disperses aesthetic attention to regions that are relatively new to theory, if widely familiar in experience.
Feminist analyses both contribute to the development of this field of interest and occupy a place within it. For example, there is a growing body of philosophy that explores issues about food and eating, which are topics that hitherto had little to no position in the field at all (Korsmeyer 1999). This new subject has several sources of development, including feminism, for it can be considered an area of scholarship that has been nurtured by the overall critical questioning of dominant conceptual frameworks in philosophy, including those that overlooked matters relevant to the practical and physical realities of living.
Of special pertinence for topics concerning women and gender in everyday aesthetics is the rise of attention to a subject absent in previous philosophies: pregnancy and motherhood—topics also explored in contemporary feminist and postfeminist art, as noted above (Lintott and Sander-Staudt 2011). The aesthetics of the body here explores the maternal body, its changes during pregnancy, birth, and nursing, and the everyday demands of parenthood, within and among which feminists have explored the beautiful, the sublime, the novel and unsettling, the comforting and tranquil—as manifest in the events and activities one encounters every day. The area of inquiry here is not the depiction of these subjects in art or literature, or their dramatization in theater or film, but the aesthetics of the lived experience itself. Raising children has an inevitable sensuousness that provides its own aesthetic dimensions, and sometimes what is off-putting or disgusting to others becomes part of the relationship of mother to child (Irvin 2011). Attending to the intimacy of sensation and to the presentation of one’s own body serves to detach theorizing in aesthetics away from art worlds and to everyday practice, and theory has expanded accordingly. In such ways are traditional philosophical categories modified and adapted as feminist perspectives continue to probe the dimensions of the aesthetic.
The topics included under the designation “feminist aesthetics” extend through philosophy, history, critical disciplines, and art practices. Theories of perception, appreciation, and interpretation have been developed in all of these areas. While much of this thinking began with examination of philosophical tradition and the conceptual frameworks it affords, feminist perspectives have also opened the field in many directions, such that theorizing in the twenty-first century has taken different directions from the critical perspectives that began to probe gender analysis in the 1970s. Of special note is the diffusion of interests from overtly political and strategic analyses of women in society and culture, to exploration of the variant forms that gender can assume, a shift that also distinguishes aspects of the transition from feminism to postfeminism. A wider attention to issues of diverse identity, particularly attentive to racially inflected differences, characterizes both feminist theory in general and aesthetics today. Thus feminist work is more and more likely not to focus on women as an exclusive topic but to consider other modes of identity as well. And feminists have employed philosophies of divergent stripes in their own quests, elaborating and refining them, and—most importantly—formulating ideas that are independent of any particular theoretical allegiances. The changing emphases of feminist perspectives in aesthetics and philosophy of art over the last five decades are evident in philosophy, art theory, criticism and commentary on the arts, and in the practice of artists themselves, testimony to the degree to which philosophy and cultural production travel hand in hand, which is an abiding characteristic of the field of aesthetics itself.
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