Feminist Moral Psychology

First published Fri Jan 30, 2009; substantive revision Thu Jun 4, 2020

Moral psychology, broadly construed, deals with issues relating to motivation of moral action. More specifically, it concerns how we see or fail to see moral issues, why we act or fail to act morally, and whether and to what extent we are responsible for our actions. Fundamentally, it is concerned with our moral agency, the kind of beings we are or ought to be, morally speaking.

Feminist moral psychology deals with what feminists, in particular, have contributed to the field of moral psychology, or the ways in which their approach to these issues is motivated by feminist concerns, especially in connection to understanding and attempting to end women’s oppression. The feminist contribution to moral psychology has been at least three-fold. First, some feminists emphasize the role of emotion in action; in particular, they stress the motive of care in prompting action. They do so for the reason that emotion in general, and care in particular, have been ignored or denigrated in traditional moral theory due to their association with women. They believe that if we are to end women’s oppression, we should incorporate into our philosophical theories things associated with women and with the feminine and so previously left out. Other feminists, though, worry about how care in particular can be harmful to women, and believe that incorporating care into moral theory will perpetuate women’s oppression. Still other feminists challenge the internalist thesis that motivation is necessarily present in the rational agent who recognizes a reason to act morally. Second, feminist attention to oppression has led those feminists working in the field of moral psychology to acknowledge the role of systematic oppression in the psychology of both victims of oppression and oppressors themselves. One issue is the role that patriarchy plays in a person’s motivation and subsequent action. How does patriarchy affect women’s desires? Can women be autonomous if their desires are deformed by patriarchy? Does the satisfaction of women’s deformed desires contribute to their own oppression? What motivates those who perform sexist acts that contribute to women’s oppression? A related issue, the third that feminists working in the field of moral psychology are concerned with, is that of responsibility. To what extent are we responsible for our actions when they are motivated by desires deformed by patriarchy? Are victims of oppression in any way responsible for their own oppression? Are they responsible for resisting oppression? Are members of the dominant social group responsible for understanding oppression, and how can they come to understand it? Are men collectively responsible for women’s oppression, even when it is not the case that each man harbors sexist intentions?

1. Moral Motivation

Throughout the history of ethics, many moral philosophers have been concerned with the agent’s psychology, or what motivates an agent to act. Three stand out as the most prominent foes or friends of feminists: Hobbes, Hume, and Kant. Hobbes believed that self-interest motivates all action, including moral action. For Hobbes, all of a person’s actions aim at the person’s own good as determined by that person, and rationality requires acting in ways that promote one’s own good, which, for Hobbes, amounts to acting in ways that best satisfy one’s desires. Each rational person’s strongest desire is for self-preservation, which rationality dictates should never be sacrificed. Thus self-interest or desire-satisfaction prompts action, and both morality and rationality dictate acting accordingly. While Hume agreed with Hobbes that reason by itself cannot motivate action, he disagreed with Hobbes about the motive that prompted action, believing that instead of self-interest, the feeling or sentiment of sympathy or benevolence is necessary for prompting moral action. Reason’s role is to determine the means to our ends, not set the ends themselves, which are set by sentiment. Kant believed, against Hobbes and Hume, that not only could reason itself prompt action, but that it is the source of our moral nature. Reason, for Kant, needs to master desire, rather than dictate the satisfaction of desire, in order for the agent to be autonomous (see, for example, Deigh 1992, 1–2).

Feminists have weighed in on these debates. One main charge made by some feminists is that emotion has been associated historically with women, and for this reason moral philosophers, most of whom have been men, have either ignored it, denigrated it, or included it in moral theory but only as construed in a typically masculine way (Baier, 1987b; Gilligan 1982 and 1987; Held 1987; Tuana 1992, 1–12 and 113–121). Further, since reason has been associated with men, it has been valorized by the same theories. These feminists imply that traditional moral theory is sexist. Kant, by insisting that reason should master desire, denigrates emotion, and by insisting that reason alone can prompt action, ultimately leaves out emotion from morality. Hobbes, by appealing to the motive of self-interest in his description of persons in a State of Nature from which morality must be derived, construes emotion in a typically masculine way, as the motive appropriate for prompting actions with strangers in the so-called public sphere with which men have traditionally been associated (Calhoun 1988). Some of the feminists at issue favor Hume’s view that benevolence or sympathy is necessary for prompting moral action (Baier 1987a). Some of them believe that one step in the direction of ending women’s oppression, a goal they share with all feminists, is to incorporate into our philosophical theories those things that have been heretofore excluded precisely because of their association with women (Baier 1987b; Held, 1987). Such feminists reject both Kant’s view, that reason should master desire, and Hobbes’s view, that self-interest is the motive that prompts moral action, and favor including in moral theory those motives that have traditionally been associated with women. These are motives appropriate to prompting action with intimates in the so-called private sphere to which (at least white, middle class) women have historically been relegated. Foremost among them is the motive of care, exhibited by women who have been charged with the role of raising children. But feminists are not univocal in their views about the role of emotion in moral theory. Other feminists caution that incorporating “feminine” emotions into moral theory risks perpetuating women’s oppression by leaving unchallenged the view that women are essentially emotional beings, and men essentially rational beings (Tronto 1993, 241–247; Tuana 1992, 115–116).

Feminists’s responses on both sides of the issue have been multifarious. It is important to note that some philosophers, independent of feminist motivations, challenge the charge that traditional moral theory denigrates or ignores emotion, arguing that it can at least make room for it. For instance, Barbara Herman (1981) and Marcia Baron (1984) argue that Kant need not, or even should not, exclude emotion altogether from his theory. Herman argues against the view that in order for an act to have moral worth, it must be done without the presence of any inclination, but only from the moral motive, or, for the sake of duty. Herman agrees that acts having moral worth must be done from the moral motive, but argues that the received interpretation of Kant is wrong in assuming that inclination must not be present. Regarding morally obligatory actions, Herman argues that inclination may be present as long as the agent’s final motive is the moral one. Regarding morally permissible actions, Herman argues that the moral motive functions as a limiting condition, screening out inclinations that take as their object action conflicting with the Categorical Imperative. In the ordinary case, the agent has both inclination and the moral motive present, with inclination giving the moral motive its object. Baron takes the role of inclination one step further, arguing that inclination must be present in the perfectly moral person. This is because Baron understands the moral motive in a Kantian way rather than strictly as Kant understood it, as a commitment to morality instead of something we must hold before our minds each time we act. Thus it can function either as a primary motive, motivating the agent without the aid of inclination, or as a secondary motive, as a commitment to doing what is right, telling the agent to act as inclination directs. But these modest attempts to incorporate emotion into a moral theory that at first blush seems to ignore emotion or makes reason its master do not address the feminist charge that “feminine” motivation is left out of or denigrated by traditional moral theory, and is so because of its association with women.

Other philosophers writing particularly from a feminist view favor endorsing any traditional moral theory that incorporates “feminine” motivation. Annette Baier favors a Humean account over Kant’s, arguing that Hume is the “woman’s moral theorist”(1987). While Baier acknowledges that Hume had less than feminist views since he saw women as weaker than men in mind and body, she believes that nonetheless Hume’s theory squares with women’s moral wisdom, both in the concept of morality that many women have, and in their experiences that lead them to have it (38). Baier contrasts Hume’s moral theory with Kant’s, specifically in connection to Carol Gilligan’s conclusions about men’s and women’s moral reasoning (see below; 1982). Gilligan is a psychologist who set out to collect data about women’s moral reasoning, which she noted was not reflected in the experiments conducted just on males by another psychologist, Lawrence Kohlberg (see the entry on feminist ethics). Baier notes the following differences between Kant and Hume, which she takes to resemble those Gilligan suggested between the women she studied and Kohlberg’s men. Kant makes morality a matter of obedience to universal law through which we obtain freedom, but Hume makes it a matter of cultivating character traits directed at peace of mind and integrity; Kant takes reason to be the fundamental moral capacity, and Hume takes sympathy, or the heart’s responses to particular persons, to be this capacity; Kant takes the rules of justice to be morally binding, while Hume emphasizes convention and eradicating contradictions in the passions of sympathetic persons. Hume also emphasizes relations between unequals, such as in parents’ love for their children, which he believed to be the strongest bond the mind is capable of, and from which he builds his moral theory. Gilligan presented data from female and male subjects showing that by and large, females made decisions about moral dilemmas based on concrete situations in which the parties know details about each other, emphasizing feelings such as care for others, and preserving relations, while males for the most part decided on the basis of rule-following and justice while abstracting from the details of the case. This is not to say that Gilligan’s claims are free from controversy; rather, since she published the results of her study, her claims have been criticized for perpetuating sexist stereotypes (Tronto 1993), for being inaccurate both because there are not significant differences in the reasoning of males and females at different life stages (Walker 1993), and because any differences in moral reasoning have more to do with education or general cognitive development rather than gender (Greeno and Maccoby 1993), for being false because her sample size and characterizations are inadequate for drawing the conclusions she does about gendered reasoning (Luria 1993) and for invoking generalizations that can be used to support racist views (Moody-Adams 1991, 199). These objections aside, Baier argues that Gilligan’s data about females’ moral reasoning is aligned with Hume’s theory, while data about males’ moral reasoning is aligned with other justice-oriented theories such as Kant’s and Hobbes’s. Baier endorses Hume’s theory as more amiable to feminism since it speaks more accurately to women’s experiences than Kantian or other justice-oriented theories, particularly women’s experience of care-taking relationships that require knowing the particularities of the persons involved.

Since Gilligan’s findings were published, some feminists have gone beyond endorsing Hume’s theory by valorizing women’s caring in a new moral theory, the ethic of care, which is grounded at least in part on acting from the motive of care (see the entry on feminist ethics). What makes the feminist complaint against traditional moral theories different from that of philosophers such as Michael Stocker (1976), who argues that modern moral theories are “schizophrenic” because they pay attention only to reasons, values, and justification while saying little if anything about motives, is that it is lodged for the feminist reason that women’s voice has been excluded from moral theory, and that care, specifically, is the motive left out. The motive of care is prominent in relations among family members, particularly of mother to child. Since traditional moral theories are concerned primarily with mores that ought to govern relations between strangers in the public sphere, they leave out discussion of caring that goes on in relations in the so-called private sphere among intimates, especially the mother-child relation. And since women historically have been relegated to the private sphere, much of the moral life as they experience it within the family gets left out. Feminists who endorse the ethic of care thus aim to valorize care in moral theory, thereby giving women a moral voice equal to men’s.

Most care ethicists believe that the motive of care, not just acting in a caring way, is central to, and is a distinguishing feature of, the ethic of care (for example, Ruddick 1980; Noddings, 1984; Baier 1987b; Calhoun 1988; Held 1990), but at least one suggests that caring does not require any particular emotion toward the one cared for (Manning 1992, 64). Some feminists favor incorporating care into justice theories (Friedman 1987; Tronto 1993; Flanagan and Jackson 1987; Blum 1988), though others suggest that we altogether replace justice theories with an ethic of care (Gilligan, 1982 and 1987; Noddings 1984; Ruddick 1980). Those in the latter group believe that moral action is prompted by the motive of care rather than by reason itself.

Margaret Little argues that the motive of care plays a significant role in moral epistemology: it is essential for seeing the moral landscape, that is, for knowing what is morally called for in a given situation, and for getting us to moral truths (Little 2007). Little shares the same suspicion as the feminists cited above that care has been assigned a “lesser” role than reason because of its historical association with women. Little argues that when we care about a person, we have the right background disposition for morally relevant features to come into our consciousness. Caring makes us receptive to the particularities of a person, enables us to listen to their narrative, and makes us respect the person as a responsible subject. Only when we are so disposed do we know what is morally called for—caring about persons enables us to pick up on what is morally salient (424–25). Those who have merely an intellectual comprehension of the moral landscape but never respond appropriately have a clouded perception, much like a person who uses the term “green” correctly but has never seen the color and so lacks the concept of “green” (427). Little argues that the moral case is even worse than the color case because those who lack the appropriate emotions will not get morality right. Such is the case with the person who sees that certain things are painful and knows what pain is, yet does not see pain as evil. This person does not get morality right because, first, nonmoral terms cannot completely explain morality (e.g., they cannot explain the difference in the cruelty of kicking a dog, taunting someone verbally, and forgetting to invite the neighbor’s child to one’s daughter’s birthday party) (428). A second reason is that whether a feature plays a role in determining an act’s moral status is dependent, in a way that cannot be codified, on other relevant features. For instance, an act’s being fun may be a reason to do it, but it is also a feature that makes hunting animals morally problematic (428). Little concludes that affect, particularly care for persons, is a necessary component of apprehending moral properties themselves, contrary to traditional accounts, according to which moral knowledge is acquired strictly by reason whose verdicts are passed on to motivation which in turn issues in the appropriate response (420, 428).

Although the ethic of care is still in a fairly developmental stage, defended more fully in a 2006 book by Virginia Held, it has been criticized by some feminists as being merely a feminine, but not a feminist, moral theory. A feminine ethic gives weight to the experiences and intuitions of women, but it need not aim at ending women’s oppression; a feminist ethic has as one of its aims ending women’s oppression. If care is a motive that women experience mainly in connection with their being in a position of exploitation, then one worry is that valorizing it in moral theory does not overcome, but may even perpetuate, its role in women’s oppression. Sarah Hoagland, for instance, criticizes the ethic of care for at least three reasons: that it is grounded in the unequal relationship of a mother having natural care for her child which may not, especially in a male child, ever be reciprocated; that it fails to acknowledge the real conflict that some mothers feel between resentment and tenderness; and that in appealing to the feminine which is itself a product of the masculine world, it risks perpetuating women’s oppression (Hoagland 1991, 253, 254, and 256). Marilyn Friedman critiques the kind of care involved in the ethic of care. While men’s caring, as revealed in earning a paycheck and providing material goods for the family, has to do with protection and material forms of help that men control, women’s caring, as revealed in emotional work, has to do with admitting dependency and sharing or losing control, which contributes to their own oppression (Friedman 1993, 175 and 177). Lawrence Blum, et.al., argue that women’s caring reinforces the suppression of the self and leads to a denial of their autonomy, and makes mothers judge their success solely in terms of the success of their children, making them lose touch with their own needs (Blum, et.al. 1973–74, 231–32, 235, and 239). Claudia Card argues that sometimes the caring that women engage in is not virtuous, but instead is misplaced gratitude to men who either have the power to abuse them or offer women the privilege of service in exchange for “protection” (Card 1993, 216). Women’s caring is often a survival strategy, and so Gilligan is wrong to think that women’s reasoning can deepen and correct the ethics of the more privileged (207). Card believes that too often women do not discriminate good from bad relationships, and end up assuming responsibility for maintaining any relationships they come to be involved in by trying to satisfy everyone because they are afraid to say “no.” Barbara Houston cautions that if care, like anything else in ethics, is declared good or right or just, it had better be so for women (Houston 1987, 261). While Houston agrees with the feminist intention to reclaim womanly virtues as virtues in the face of their absence from contemporary moral theory, she cautions that these virtues, including care, should win the liberation of women, make women’s subordination a primary moral concern, make it a recognizable moral problem rather than a nonmoral matter, challenge the status quo of women’s social position, and not further women’s oppression (255).

In spite of the vast amount of attention feminists have paid to the ethic of care, and perhaps in light of the worries about care and women’s oppression, some feminists have turned their attention away from making the motive of care central in moral theory. Jean Hampton tries to salvage Hobbesian moral theory, and believes that feminists should make the motive of self-interest part of their moral theory because without it women lose themselves in slavish action (1993). They become just like Amy, a girl that Gilligan describes in one of her discussions of gendered moral reasoning. Hampton reads Gilligan’s much-discussed case of Amy and Jake in the following way. Amy reasons from the care perspective, seeing morality as being responsive to others’ needs, not hurting others, and being in service to them. She loses herself in moral dilemmas, not being able firmly to assert herself or let her interests count, but always places the needs of others first. She borders on servility and lacks self-worth. Jake, on the other hand, a representative male moral reasoner, reasons from the justice perspective, seeing morality as a set of traffic rules that amount to pursuing one’s own interests without interfering with the interests of others. Jake is insensitive to the needs of others, and sees the world from his own self-centered viewpoint, believing that one’s own self ought to come first in moral dilemmas. Hampton argues that neither is the ideal moral view, but that Amy suffers more because she is highly exploitable. Hampton favors a contractarian morality over the ethic of care, since on the former a person is prompted by self-interest in putting forward claims with other potential contractors to the hypothetical bargain from which morality is ultimately derived. A Hobbesian hypothetical bargainer will not make or keep contracts that do not provide an expectation of self-benefit. Hampton argues that self-interest, not care, is the motive women should have if they are to avoid being exploited, since self-interest ensures that a person insists on her own worth in bargaining schemes and relations with others. To address other feminists’s worries about contractarianism excluding from bargains those from whom others do not expect to benefit in interactions, including typically the disenfranchised, Hampton modifies contractarianism by building in the Kantian assumption that all persons have intrinsic value and thus must have their interests respected.

One important issue relating to moral motivation that feminists have said only a bit about is the internalism/externalism debate (see the entry on moral motivation). Generally stated, internalism is the view that there is a logical or necessary connection between two concepts, typically reasons, motives, and obligations. According to one version of internalism, which David Brink calls “agent internalism,” in virtue of the concept of morality, moral obligations (or moral reasons, on a two-step internalism linking obligations, reasons, and motives) necessarily motivate the agent to act morally (see Brink 1986, 28). The agent’s having a reason to act morally, whether or not the agent recognizes it, entails having a motive to act morally. Externalism is the denial of the necessity condition. According to another version of internalism, if an agent judges that it is right for her to φ in circumstances C, then either she is motivated to φ, or she is irrational (Smith, 1994, 61; Korsgaard 1996). Motivation is necessarily present in the rational agent who recognizes a reason to act morally; having a reason to act morally entails having a motivation, at least in the rational agent. The corresponding externalist view is that judging that an act is right either need not motivate the rational agent (weak externalism) or does not motivate the rational agent (strong externalism).

Two issues relating to the internalism/externalism debate bear on women’s oppression. First, on agent internalism, if the agent lacks the relevant motivation, the agent does not have a reason to act morally (see Brink 1986, 29). Then for agents who lack a motivation to act in ways preventing women’s oppression, they lack a reason to do so. This means that oppressors who lack the relevant motivation do not act against reason when they act in ways contributing to women’s oppression. Second, on the other version of internalism described above, if the agent fails to be motivated by a moral reason, the agent still has the reason but is irrational (Smith 1994; Korsgaard 1996). Then agents who recognize that they have a reason to be self-respecting, for instance, but who fail to be so, are irrational. This runs the risk of impugning the rationality of oppressed persons who fail to see their intrinsic worth as persons due to their social circumstances.

Although feminists have not addressed the problems for feminism related to agent internalism, at least two feminists have identified problems with internalism in general, as a logical thesis about the connection between motives and reasons and/or obligations. Peggy DesAutels explores the phenomenon of having a moral commitment to the ethic of care yet failing to follow through on it even when the agent is competent and does not ignore her moral commitments (2004). DesAutels approaches the issue of internalism from an empirical rather than a conceptual point of view, which sets apart her approach from that of standard internalists. She takes herself to be following feminist theorists such as Carol Gilligan and Margaret Urban Walker in examining moral issues, including that of the internalism/externalism debate, as they present themselves in richly detailed concrete situations, which, she believes, makes her account feminist (71). DesAutels argues that moral attentiveness requires “nonpassive vigilance of thought where we attempt to counter known psychological tendencies and subtle social influences that prevent us from seeing and responding to the demands of care” (72). Two interferences with the demands of care are moral oblivion, or, being completely or mostly unaware of a moral demand, and being unresponsive to moral situations. DesAutels urges that we attempt to improve both our own psychologies and the social contexts in which they are embedded by, for instance, becoming more receptive to the subtle ways in which sexism occurs. She is suggesting that, contra internalism, it is possible to make a moral judgment yet fail to be appropriately motivated, due to sexist influences; sexism can make us unaware of a moral demand or unresponsive to it. Attention to the impact of sexism and other forms of oppression that are revealed in concrete situations is a lens that reveals a limitation of internalism as a purely conceptual issue about what it means to have a moral reason.

James Lindemann Nelson argues that internalists who endorse a necessary connection between moral judgment and motivation fail to capture the idea that the agent’s judgment might come in degrees of confidence in the correctness of her judgment or the exigency of the values involved (2004, 84). Nelson argues that the belief-motivation relationship is more complex in the real world than internalists admit. He takes internalism and externalism to be points on a scale registering the relationship between an agent and the moral understandings considered authoritative in her moral-social world. Thus contra internalism, it is not the case that if the agent acts immorally, she simply must not have believed the relevant moral judgment. Rather, the connection between moral belief and action should be sensitive to the highly variegated character of the moral-social world and the different locations within it that real people inhabit (89). Nelson rejects the standard view of internalism as a logical connection between belief and motivation, in favor of the view that internalism reflects the degrees to which a person grasps moral beliefs and to which she acts on these beliefs. So if one lacks a strong sense of what one ought to do, this need not mean that one completely lacks an authentic belief about what one ought to do. Nelson understands his account to be feminist because it critiques the forms of social life. That is, it is sensitive to the fact that a person’s own moral beliefs and reasons may not be consistent with the moral beliefs and reasons held widely in her society, especially when it is a sexist one. A person might truly believe that her society takes something to be morally required, but not be fully motivated by her society’s moral requirements because they dictate sexist behavior. Nelson’s account allows a person to refuse to fully embrace motivating reasons that are endorsed by her society, and still have moral authority.

Feminists might also question whether the internalist is correct in thinking that if an otherwise rational person fails to be motivated by her moral judgment, then she is irrational. Consider an example that I will return to in Section 2, Thomas Hill’s well-known case of the Deferential Wife, who is utterly devoted to her husband, buying clothes he prefers, having sex when he is in the mood, and moving where he wants. She tends not to form her own interests, values, and ideals, and counts them as less important than her husband’s when she does. She believes that women are mentally and physically equal, if not superior to men, but that it is women’s proper role to serve their husbands. She does not believe that her rights are being trampled on because she is glad and proud to serve her husband. She is confused about her worth as a person, and is servile, or, lacking in self-respect, despite being glad and proud to serve her husband (Hill 1973). A legitimate explanation for the Deferential Wife’s confusion about her worth is her socialization in a patriarchal society which sends her many messages of inferiority. Her confusion about her worth prevents her from being motivated by a reason to be self-respecting. An internalist might impugn her rationality: if she truly recognizes that she has a reason to be self-respecting, yet remains unmoved, she must be irrational. But the internalist’s judgment that she is irrational seems at odd with feminist aims, since it fails to acknowledge the role that socialization plays in whether she is motivated by the reasons she has. It places the blame for failing to be motivated by a reason squarely on the victim of such circumstances and her rational capacities, when it may be the case that the Deferential Wife reasons correctly, understands what it means to have intrinsic worth, sees that if a person had intrinsic worth she would respect herself, but gets the facts wrong about her own worth due to her experiences. The feminist objection is that a person’s social circumstances are a better explanation of the disconnection between reasons and motivations than a failure of rationality (Superson 2010).

2. Deformed Desires

One kind of motivation that has received and continues to receive a fair bit of attention from feminists is what they call “deformed desires,” “adaptive preferences,” or “repressive satisfactions.” Deformed desires are significant for issues such as autonomy, agency, and responsibility (see Section 3).

John Stuart Mill was perhaps the first philosopher to acknowledge the concept of desires deformed by patriarchy, but Sandra Bartky was one of the first philosophers to name them (Mill 1861; Bartky 1990a). Bartky describes repressive satisfactions as those that “fasten us to the established order of domination, for the same system which produces false needs also controls the conditions under which such needs can be satisfied” (Bartky 1990a, 42). Mill, Bartky, and Martha Nussbaum attribute the cause of such “false needs” to various factors, including unequal education, indoctrination to believe that women are fit mainly for domesticity and other nonintellectual pursuits, psychological manipulation, women’s fear of moving into new positions that remain unequal and unprotected, denial of autonomy, lack of information or false information about fact, lack of reflection or deliberation about norms, and lack of options (Bartky 1990a, 42; Nussbaum 1999a, 149). Jon Elster describes how a person acquires deformed desires, which is that she adapts her preferences according to her opportunities and without her control or awareness. Elster dubs this kind of adaptation the “sour grapes” phenomenon, according to which the fox’s conviction that he is prevented from eating grapes that are out of his reach causes him to believe that grapes are sour and so to prefer not to eat them. Let’s apply this phenomenon to the case of women under patriarchy. The Deferential Wife (described in Section 1) who lives in a world in which women are routinely denied educational opportunities and access to the best jobs, and so become economically dependent on men, is more likely to desire to be servile to her husband and children. A female student who lives in a patriarchal culture that teaches women to look to men for protection, security, and strength rather than to cultivate these traits in themselves, is more likely to want to date males in power, such as her professor, because she sees them as exhibiting these traits. One of Bartky’s examples is that of female narcissism, or an infatuation with the female body, which occurs when women seem enthusiastically to embrace unachievable, alienating, sexist standards of femininity that are informed by what Bartky calls “the fashion-beauty complex.” Women living in a patriarchal culture in which they are judged and objectified according to these standards are likely to adopt the standards and prefer to fulfill them.

Several features distinguish deformed desires from nondeformed desires. One is that even though most if not all of our desires are formed in a social context, deformed desires are formed in response to unjust social conditions such as those found in a patriarchal society in which men are deemed superior to women. A second feature is that satisfaction of deformed desires benefits not the subject who has them as in the typical case of desire-satisfaction, but, according to Bartky, a social order whose interest lies in domination. For example, a woman’s desire to conform to the “fashion-beauty complex,” when satisfied, leaves her with an inferior body image, and demands her time and money which in turn stands in the way of her pursuit of her career goals, while men gain economically. A female student’s desire to date her professor, when satisfied in the typical case, reinforces the stereotypes that women need to be with a (powerful) man for self-validation and that they are not intellectual. Men benefit when they, but not women, are taken seriously in the pursuit of their careers. One question feminists such as Bartky have raised is whether women actually do benefit from satisfying their deformed desires (Bartky 1982; 1990a, 36). While it is not implausible to think that women do achieve some benefits (e.g., narcissistic pleasures from conformity to the fashion-beauty complex, getting dates with men), feminists typically acknowledge that these benefits are often merely short-run: conformists to beauty standards risk self-hatred when they inevitably fall short, and conformists to dating standards requiring female passivity and submission often end up in autonomy-denying relationships with men. Some feminists argue that conformity to patriarchal standards perpetuates women’s oppression by perpetuating stereotypes about them, which harms, rather than benefits, all women (e.g., Cudd 1988). Thus feminists admit that while women in some ways benefit from deformed-desire satisfaction, they are wrong about the harms involved and the “real” benefits of conformity, which are enjoyed by men. In fact, Bartky suggests that it is not merely error that is involved, but deception, since “false needs” or deformed desires are “produced through indoctrination, psychological manipulation, and the denial of autonomy” (Bartky 1990a, 42). A third feature of deformed desires, then, is that typically they involve deception about what their bearer truly wants, or even what is truly in the bearer’s own interest or will promote her welfare.

One significant issue relating to deformed desires is autonomy, which is commonly defined as self-determination or self-direction. On the face of it, an agent’s satisfying her deformed desires seems to stand in the way of promoting her autonomy, for if the satisfaction of deformed desires in reality benefits the system of domination and the privileged persons in it, then satisfying deformed desires does not seem to be an indication of the agent’s self-determination, but rather the agent’s subordination to the system and its ends. Another way that deformed desires are suspect for reasons relating to autonomy is that they are unchosen, the result of adaptation to one’s opportunities and without one’s awareness or control, as Elster’s “sour grapes” phenomenon describes. Moreover, the more deformed desires an agent has in her total desire set, the greater the likelihood that she will be under their sway, since they will not be counteracted by nondeformed desires. And the more likely the agent is under the sway of her deformed desires, the less likely she will be self-determining. The issue bears on women’s oppression because if the agent acts mostly from her deformed desires, she is likely to contribute to her own oppression.

There are differing views on whether women have deformed desires, to what extent they do, and what their effect is on the agent’s autonomy. On the one extreme, some philosophers deny that women even have deformed desires, so obviously such desires can have no hold on women or interfere with their autonomy. Christina Hoff Sommers believes that since women’s preferences are no longer the product of undemocratic indoctrination and are now taken into account by women’s having the right to vote, they are therefore authentic and it would be patronizing and illiberal to criticize women’s preferences (1994, 259–260). Many evolutionary psychologists agree with Sommers that women’s preferences are authentic rather than adaptive ones formed in response to limited options. According to Catherine Wilson, these evolutionary psychologists believe further that we live in a just world where women’s preferences match what they receive and that the distribution of the components of well-being is also just—women get what they really want (2004, 101–102). So what explains why women tend not to prefer new experiences, competition, accumulation, and social rewards to the same extent as men? According to Wilson, many evolutionary psychologists attribute women’s and men’s different traits, values, preferences, and interests not to discrimination against women, but to differential parental investment (105). What this means, for these evolutionary psychologists, is that females invest more than males in nurturing their offspring since it is more costly for a female than a male to replace a child. This phenomenon goes hand-in-hand with a greater competition among males over mating opportunities, since mating with many partners increases the likelihood of having more offspring. Wilson attributes these ideas to the evolutionary psychologists’s belief that we are all playing a game that is won by an individual’s having more viable offspring than others of her or his sex (105). This sets up a “winning human female strategy,” evidenced by thousands of years of evolution, that consists of the following norms: finding the fittest male to be one’s mate, withholding sex to get commitment, and exchanging fidelity and domestic service for lifelong sustenance (106). These female norms, in turn, according to the evolutionary psychologists at issue, reflect female preferences. Women’s lower status is explained, then, not by discrimination, but by their authentic preferences. Since women prefer to nurture children, be faithful to their mate, and avoid making their mate jealous, they do not adopt male norms and preferences associated with success in the world.

Many feminists reject the notion that women have no deformed desires but have only authentic preferences. Martha Nussbaum responds to Sommers by citing plenty of examples of deformed desires in women, and notes that even conservative economists like Gary Becker, as well as philosophers from Plato to Aquinas to Kant, acknowledge their existence (1999a, 152). Catherine Wilson directly takes on the evolutionary psychologists she discusses who reject the notion of women’s having adaptive preferences. In order to evaluate the claims made by evolutionary psychologists about women’s preferences, Wilson believes that we can rely on sources such as our direct personal and social experiences, mediated social experiences such as impressions from novels, films, and the media, and various psychological and sociological data. She chooses to rely on novels, which, she admits, are somewhat unreliable but nevertheless reflect both the stories of “everywoman” and certain features of the social world, since they are constrained by plausibility considerations (110). The novels describe women who initially follow the standard theory of evolutionary psychology to find a wealthy mate when they are young and have the greatest bargaining power, but through their characters suggest that what women really want in a mate is “youth, good looks, manners, intelligence, a gentle demeanor, and attentiveness” (110). The novels suggest that those whose opportunities to achieve wealth and power are restricted end up not fully using their intellect and emotions, and that they would not make the choices they make under better conditions, as Elster’s “sour grapes” phenomenon predicts. Wilson concludes that the view that women have deformed desires is a more plausible hypothesis than the view that women have different preferences from men and get what they really value.

But the debate goes on amongst philosophers. Harriet Baber comes close to suggesting that women do not have deformed desires or adaptive preferences (Baber 2007). Baber argues against Nussbaum’s view that disadvantaged women who have adaptive preferences might get what they want when they satisfy these preferences, but they are not better off because their desires are deformed. In contrast, Baber believes that adaptation is irrelevant to whether preference-satisfaction contributes to one’s welfare: if I want something, getting it is good for me regardless of how I acquired that desire (110). Baber’s explanation for the choices that deprived women make is that they are making the best of a bad situation, choosing not necessarily what they would prefer all things considered, but rather what they would prefer given their options. While Nussbaum believes that Jayamma, who settles for a low-paying job with poor working conditions because she believes this to be her lot in life, lacks a conception of herself as a person with rights that can be violated and a belief that she is wronged, Baber believes that she has just settled for second best, since she would grab a raise if it were offered to her (Nussbaum 2000, 113; Baber 111). Similarly, Nussbaum believes that Vasanti, who stays in an abusive marriage for years, does not see herself as having rights that are violated, but has a deformed preference to put up with abuse as part of women’s lot, while Baber denies that Vasanti has such a preference, suggesting instead that she prefers a bundle that includes putting up with abuse along with having a home and basic necessities (Nussbaum 2000, 68–69; Baber 113–114). Baber argues further that when women do, in fact, acquire adaptive preferences, as is the case with Srey Mom, once sold into slavery, who now at least partly wants to remain a prostitute when given the chance to go into the community where she will be ostracized, we beg the question if we assume that their choices are uninformed or cooly calculated (121). Baber’s view in the end is that it is an empirical question whether the women in the cases described are rational self-interested choosers who make the best of a bad situation, or whether they are damaged by deformed preferences. She maintains that they, as well as most members of traditionally disadvantaged groups who succumb to bad treatment, are rational self-choosers (122).

While most feminists agree that women have deformed desires, they differ in their views about whether, and to what extent, deformed desires interfere with their bearer’s autonomy. Arguably more radical feminists, such as Mary Daly, Andrea Dworkin, and Catharine MacKinnon sometimes speak as if all of women’s desires are deformed, and that women’s autonomy is entirely compromised as a result (Daly 1978; Dworkin 1987; MacKinnon 1987b and 1987c). One explanation for why deformed desires take such a hold on women might be the fact that they are tied integrally to an agent’s identity. Sandra Bartky argues that the norms of femininity, for instance, are imposed on women during the construction of their subjectivities rather than when they are fully formed subjects, and that a woman’s conforming to these norms is essential to her sense of herself as a sexually desiring and desirable subject such that expecting her not to conform threatens her with at least desexualization (2002, 25). This explanation aside, in other places, these same radical feminists cited above join other feminists in suggesting that only some of women’s desires are deformed, and that women are not entirely under the sway of their deformed desires since these desires can be outweighed by competing desires women have for their own welfare. MacKinnon, for one, suggests that victims of sexual harassment find harassment to be devastating to their self-respect and health and do not enjoy their harasser’s attention, rape victims who appear disinterested are in reality silenced and do not have a desire to be raped, and pornography models operate not from free will and a desire to display their bodies in pornographic poses, but from constraint and inequality (1987a, 54; 1987d, 114; 1987d, 180 and 194). Writing about date rape, Lois Pineau suggests that women know which sexual encounters are enjoyable, and thus consensual, even though they play out patriarchal roles of coyness and submission and men interpret their desires along these lines. Although women appear to want to be dominated by men in sex, what they really find enjoyable is communicative sex where the partners seek to know and respect each other’s desires just like participants in a good conversation (1989, 239). Deep down, Pineau and MacKinnon are arguing, women really know what they want and what is good for them despite patriarchy’s influence on them and their desires; they have competing nondeformed desires for their own welfare. Many other feminists seem to be assuming this kind of position when they object to patriarchal practices, since these practices are at odds, they believe, with what women want. On this view, then, women have deformed desires, but these desires do not have such a strong hold on their bearer that they cannot be overridden by other desires the bearer has for her own welfare. This view holds out promise that women can exhibit at least some degree of autonomy in following their nondeformed desires, and thus be motivated to act in ways that do not contribute to their own oppression.

Indeed, Uma Narayan explicitly acknowledges that women under patriarchy have both deformed desires and nondeformed desires, and believes that women can be fully autonomous because they “bargain” with patriarchy in the context of both the external constraints it imposes on women and the internal constraints it imposes in the form of deformed desires (2002). Narayan contrasts the “bargainers with patriarchy” with both the “dupes of patriarchy,” who completely subscribe to patriarchal norms and practices of their culture and impose them on themselves, having none but deformed desires, and the “prisoners of patriarchy,” who are constrained against their will and consent by external forces imposed by their culture (418, 422). The bargainers with patriarchy, then, face the external constraints of patriarchy, and have both deformed and nondeformed desires. Narayan takes as her case study Sufi Pirzada Muslim women who are expected to wear a burqua, or, “to veil” (she uses the term “veiling” to include burqua-wearing), arguing that they are bargainers with patriarchy who in the face of external and internal constraints do what they believe is best for themselves. On this point, her view is similar to Baber’s, though Narayan is less dismissive of the reality of deformed desires than is Baber. Contrary to the popular Western opinion that these women veil because they are duped into patriarchal norms associated with veiling, Narayan argues that the situation is more complex, because veiling women acknowledge that the burqua is uncomfortable and makes them injury prone, worry about their reputation with their families and communities if they do not veil, and are aware of the economic and political implications of not veiling. Narayan analogizes their situation to that of Western women who do not want to be seen in public without makeup—both are bargainers with, rather than dupes of, patriarchy. Narayan defines autonomy quite liberally, as the view that a person is autonomous as long as she is a “normal adult” with no serious cognitive or emotional impairments and is not subject to literal or outright coercion from others (429). Under this definition, the presence of deformed desires does not threaten their bearer’s autonomy, even if she is partly under their sway, so long as they do not seriously impair her. Narayan believes that bargainers with patriarchy, such as veiling women, are autonomous because, despite their choices being constrained by patriarchy, they can make genuine, reflective choices within these constraints. And even though their critical abilities, which seem to be at the heart of autonomy, can be distorted by patriarchy, sometimes the starkness of patriarchal constraints has the opposite effect, causing a person to face head on the conflict in her desires and to choose to act in ways that are at odds with patriarchy.

Another account that challenges the position that adaptive preferences automatically undercut autonomy is defended by Donald Bruckner (2007). Bruckner objects to Elster’s view of the “sour grapes” phenomenon that the fox’s preference change is irrational because it is not autonomous, occurring merely through a causal mechanism irrelevant to rationality (307). Bruckner argues that both adaptive preference change and adaptive preference formation are often rational. Adaptive preferences are like other preferences in that they guide a person’s deliberation and give her reasons for action (311). Bruckner gives the example of Veronica, who initially prefers to become an Olympic competitor in tennis, but after years of practice realizes that even though she is very talented at tennis, she will not achieve Olympic status, and so downgrades her aspirations and comes to prefer to be a local star, a change in preference that might occur behind her back and thus be non-autonomous (313). Bruckner believes that she should adapt her preferences thusly, as doing so would better promote her own subjective well-being. He argues that there should be a presumption in favor of the normativity of any of our preferences, even ones caused by factors out of our control, since any of an agent’s preferences are still her own and thus give her a reason to act (316). The real test, then, for deformed desires, ones formed in response to unjust social conditions, is whether they are truly the agent’s own, and so autonomously held. On Bruckner’s account, the agent’s not endorsing her new preference upon reflection makes her new preference not fully her own, and so irrational. Thus while one condition for the rationality of an adaptive preference for Elster is that it be autonomously acquired, for Bruckner, it is that the preference be autonomously retained (319). If the agent reflectively endorses her adaptive preference in a way that is responsive to her feasible set, and not simply her false beliefs about her feasible set, even though she limits her potential and lowers her sights, it is rational for her to retain this preference (319–320). Bruckner agrees with Nussbaum that certain moral and political conditions interfere with an agent’s repudiation of her limited desires, and urges that the agent’s adaptive preferences count as her own, that is, as autonomous, only if certain moral conditions are met, such as those proposed by Nussbaum’s capabilities approach that defends the provision of certain capabilities, liberties, and opportunities to all citizens (322–323). Nussbaum’s capabilities approach, unlike Bruckner’s view, invokes an objective notion of the good.

Bruckner’s account of reflective endorsement foreshadows Andrea Westlund’s procedural autonomy account, one consistent with a subjective notion of the good (Westlund 2003). Westlund takes up the case of the Deferential Wife (discussed in Section 1 and earlier in this section), who tends not to form her own interests, but when she does, counts them as less important than her husband’s preferences. Westlund’s account is “dialogical,” according to which an autonomous agent has an attitude of responsibility for her self and her commitments, and is prepared to engage in a dialogue with herself and (even hypothetical) others who have different, critical perspectives, in order to offer justifying reasons for her desires. Westlund argues that the Deferential Wife fails this test of autonomy because she fails to give good reasons why she ranks her husband’s preferences higher than her own. But another character, the extreme anti-feminist, who is also deferential, counts as autonomous because she gives proper uptake to queries about her deference, even though we might disagree with her reasons for being so (e.g., the Bible tells her to be subservient to her husband). The procedure of exhibiting genuine dialogical responsiveness rather than offering pat answers or remaining tightly gripped by one’s commitments, and not the content of her desires, determines her autonomy.

In an attempt to bridge the gaps between subjective and objective good, between seeing women with adaptive preferences as full agents and as victims, and between respecting women’s autonomous choices and promoting their flourishing, Serene Khader defends a perfectionist definition of adaptive preferences (Khader 2011). Khader’s definition invokes objective value in the form of basic flourishing that is defined by some actual (not hypothetical) cross-cultural deliberative process. She defines adaptive preferences as those that are inconsistent with basic flourishing, are formed under conditions nonconducive to basic flourishing, and that we believe people might be persuaded to transform when they scrutinize them and are exposed to conditions more conducive to flourishing (42). This definition is both procedural and substantive, because it identifies preferences as adaptive according to the conditions under which they are formed, as well as the content of the preferences themselves. The underlying premise is the “Flourishing Claim” that when people have options for flourishing, they tend to choose in ways that promote their flourishing (51). By “flourishing,” Khader means “basic flourishing,” or flourishing at a minimal level rather than excellence, since the object is to get cross-cultural agreement. Beyond this, she keeps the concept vague, intending for it to include things like adequate nutrition (62–63). Khader also wants to separate “inappropriately adaptive preferences,” which are harmful to their bearers and adapted to bad social conditions, from merely adaptive preferences, which may not have these features (52–53). She cautions that we cannot read off preferences from behavior, because, in agreement with Narayan and Baber, she believes that women might simply be making the best of available options.

Unlike feminists who locate the main problem with adaptive preferences as lying with their obstruction of the agent’s autonomy, Khader rejects the view of adaptive preferences as autonomy deficits. She agrees that adaptive preferences can block the well-being of those who have them, but she argues that both procedural and substantive autonomy accounts either yield results that do not square with our intuitions, or commit us to invoking policies that are coercive and so anti-liberal. The general charge against procedural autonomy accounts is that they inevitably sneak in an objective notion of the good when they are supposed to be neutral, and that those who fail them are believed to lack mental capacities to understand or scrutinize their choices. The general charge against substantive autonomy accounts is that they inevitably involve disrespect for cultural diversity, with the result that those who fail them are deemed to have bad values that render inoperative their capacities to scrutinize their preferences (105). Either way, autonomy accounts have it that those with adaptive preferences are unable to make their own decisions, which is false and condescending (103, 105).

Aside from their connection to autonomy, deformed desires can harm their bearer by functioning as one factor, possibly the most damaging one, in psychological oppression. In general, psychological oppression, as Sandra Bartky defines it, is to be weighed down in one’s mind, to have a harsh dominion exercised over one’s self-esteem, or “to internalize intimations of inferiority” (Bartky 1990b, 22). Psychological oppression contributes to a group’s oppression in various ways. It can hide the badness of oppressors and the beneficiaries of oppression by making them and their actions appear legitimate and by allowing them to carry on without overt acts of violence that they would otherwise use to maintain a group’s oppression (Bartky 1990b, 23). Psychological oppression contributes to a group’s oppression also by molding the oppressed and co-opting them so that their choices and decisions harm them while benefiting the privileged, thereby sustaining the system of oppression. Women’s coming to prefer the kinds of social roles that tend to subordinate them will make them less able to choose or give them fewer choices to make (Cudd 2006, 157, 181).

In addition to the role deformed desires play in psychological oppression, acting on some deformed desires can compromise the bearer’s moral agency. Consider again the case of the Deferential Wife described above: her deformed desire is that she wants to be servile to her husband and children. A debate surfaced in the philosophical literature about how to explain the wrongness of the Deferential Wife’s servility, and each explanation revealed that servility was problematic for moral agency. Thomas Hill attributes the problem to confusion about her rights—how they can be waived and when they can be forfeited—with the result that the Deferential Wife fails to acknowledge her own moral status and to see her rightful place in the moral community (1973). Marilyn Friedman attributes the problem to the Deferential Wife’s uncritically deferring to her husband’s preferences by failing to assess them in accord with her own principles, merely satisfying his wishes and whims taken as given, and becoming an accomplice to his goal-seeking behavior. Her lack of effective moral judgment makes her less than a whole person who exhibits moral integrity (1985, 146–147). Marcia Baron attributes the problem to the Deferential Wife’s lacking a critical examination of her reasons for deferring to her husband’s preferences (1985, 398). Each of these explanations is committed to the thought that acting on a desire to be servile can compromise moral agency. This, too, is significant for oppression, since those whose moral agency is compromised in these ways are easily exploitable (see Hampton, 1993).

Feminists have identified other harmful modes of psychological oppression aside from deformed desires. Stereotyping delivers messages of inferiority that the stereotyped can come to believe about themselves and then live up to. Stereotyping contributes to psychological oppression by threatening a person’s self-determination (Bartky 1990b, 23–24). Philosophers and others have recently identified the phenomenon of “stereotype threat,” which is the idea that members of subordinate groups to whom stereotypes are applied, when made aware of the stereotypes prior to performing a task such as taking a test, underperform on that task because they are preoccupied by fears of confirming those stereotypes (Saul 2013, 41). Cultural domination, or being forced to see things from the perspective of a socially dominant group, cultivates feelings of incapability and denies the values and experiences of the oppressed (Bartky 1990B, 25). Sexual objectification psychologically oppresses women because it splits a woman into two parts, identifying her as a mere bodily part or function, thereby inferiorizing her (Bartky 1990b, 26). Terror, brought about from violence and the threat of violence, inhibits coping strategies in everyday living, contributes to psychoses and neuroses, lessens trust in others, and makes victims withdraw and become less likely to strike back (Cudd 2006, 159–160). False consciousness, which is the set of false beliefs formed under and supportive of oppression, such as the belief that a woman’s place is in the home, maintains harmful stereotypes and thereby perpetuates oppression (Cudd 2006, 178–179). Members of oppressed groups often experience feelings of humiliation, degradation, shame, and low self-esteem in response to stereotyping, unequal treatment, harassment, and social distancing. These feelings diminish confidence and reinforce stereotypes of weakness, vulnerability, and inferiority (Cudd 2006, 163–165). Philosophers such as Samantha Brennan have recently identified another contributor to psychological oppression, that of microinequities (Brennan 2013). Brennan defines microinequities as small, unjust or undeserved inequalities that fall short of full-blown inequities only on the basis of their size (184). They are ways in which persons, due to features such as gender and race, are singled out, or overlooked, ignored, or otherwise discounted (184, citing Sandler 1986, 3). They are covert, often unintentional, unrecognized by the one who commits them, and hard to prove (Brennan 184, citing Rowe 2008, 45). Microinequities have a cumulative negative effect: they affect your self-value and self-esteem directly as well as indirectly, when few members of the group make it to the top because of the microinequities themselves (1880. Thus, feminists have shown that not only deformed desires, but these and other similar factors operate through women’s own psychology to help sustain their own oppression.

3. Responsibility

3.1 Responsibility of Oppressors for Oppression

Responsibility for a group’s oppression seems to be distinct from responsibility for other immoral acts that individuals perform. One reason is that oppression is a difficult concept for many to grasp, partly because it can take subtle forms, partly because it is in many ways “normalized” such that participants and even victims become oblivious to it, and partly because it is institutionalized and part of the very structure of society, which means that often it is carried out independently of anyone’s harboring any bad attitudes toward persons in subordinate groups (see Maybee 2002, for a clear discussion of this phenomenon). Another reason responsibility for oppression is distinctive is that persons may contribute to a group’s oppression simply by participating in a system of oppression, but not directly harboring sexist (or racist, etc.) intentions or even acting in ways that directly harm others, which are two factors that we ordinarily use to implicate individuals for immoral actions. On the one hand, holding all men responsible for women’s oppression in virtue of men’s (perhaps unwilling) participation in the system seems to be too strong a view, but on the other hand, freeing from responsibility all men on the grounds that they do not harbor ill intentions or cause direct harm to women seems to be too weak, since it seems that someone is responsible for maintaining any system of oppression. Charles Lawrence, a race theorist, notes that “The racist acts of millions of individuals are mutually reinforcing and cumulative because the status quo of institutionalized white supremacy remains long after deliberate racist actions subside” (Lawrence 1993, 61). But even though institutionalization of racism and sexism may seem to free from responsibility individuals who participate in these systems because the systems continue without deliberate racist or sexist acts, it is arguably the case that certain individuals directly help to ensure that the system is maintained through their actions, and it is unclear that negligence, ignorance, or self-deception about the existence of systematic injustice are innocent motives. A group’s oppression is likely to be sustained if no one is held responsible and no subsequent action taken to end it. Rather than invoking either extreme position, most feminists argue that responsibility for sustaining oppression should be determined by factors such as whether ignorance of or failure to attend to systematic oppression is excusable, the nature of the indirect harm caused by mere participation in the system of oppression, and whether a person’s opting out of an oppressive system will have any impact on that system. Another complication in assigning responsibility is that it is often difficult to separate an individual’s own sexist behavior from systematic sexism.

The literature reveals a variety of feminist views on the responsibility of members of the dominant group for the oppression of members of subordinate groups. Cheshire Calhoun defends one of the more lenient positions (Calhoun 1989). Calhoun argues that in “normal moral contexts,” where a person has generally good moral reasoning skills and generally is able to figure out which actions are right, wrong, or controversial, a person’s moral ignorance is inexcusable. But in “abnormal moral contexts,” those in which a subgroup of society “makes advances in moral knowledge faster than they can be disseminated to and assimilated by the general public and subgroups at special moral risk,” a person’s moral ignorance is excusable (396). Such is the case when feminists have moral knowledge that the general public lacks because the public is not familiar with either sophisticated analyses of oppression, or the special new terminology and new categories that are not shared by nonfeminists (e.g., “marginalize,” “the Other,” “marriage as prostitution”). In abnormal moral contexts where ignorance is the norm, persons lack a motive to be morally reflective, so it is not the case that they ought to have known better. Calhoun concludes that many men are not responsible for their participation in women’s oppression on the grounds that they are not culpably ignorant of the moral knowledge that feminists have. Nevertheless, Calhoun argues that we should reproach participants in oppressive systems, since excusing them has the effect of sanctioning their wrongdoing or letting it pass. Her hope is to motivate people to act otherwise and to treat them as capable of self-legislation rather than mere products of social conditioning. Similarly, Samantha Brennan urges that in order to motivate change, the appropriate response to microinequities is to raise awareness about their occurrence, but not to trace back each one of them to a specific person upon whom sole responsibility falls (Brennan 2013, 193).

Michele Moody-Adams defends a less lenient view about responsibility for oppression than Calhoun’s, dismissing in many cases the role of culture as a factor that justifies willful moral ignorance and that on these grounds exempts from responsibility those who act wrongly (Moody-Adams 1994). Her target is the view that being from a certain culture and adopting its practices absolves a person from responsibility for his actions. More specifically, she questions whether being unable to know, due to one’s upbringing in a culture, that certain actions are wrong, and being unable to question the morality of the society’s practices, absolves a person from responsibility for his actions. She defines “affected ignorance” as “choosing not to know what one can and should know” (296), as when we “ask no questions” when we suspect wrongdoing, or when we fail to acknowledge our human fallibility by hiding behind and blaming our culture for our own wrongdoing. Moody-Adams believes that moral ignorance is more a matter of our failings as human beings, and less a matter of “cultural limitations,” than some might believe. She argues against the moral ignorance position by noting that cultures are both created and transmitted by the people in them, that people modify or even radically revise them through their individual actions, and that people often act against cultural norms and sometimes act on desires that are in line with these norms but in ways not sanctioned by the culture (305). In short, cultures persist only because individuals capable of responsible action persist (292–293). Absolving from responsibility members of a culture for the wrongdoings that take place in the context of their culture misunderstands the tight connection between culture and agency, and denies the humanity of those who are rationally unimpaired and commit wrongdoing, even when they are influenced by cultural norms (306).

Tracy Isaacs assumes that persons are all to some extent influenced by the cultural context in which we live, and agrees with Moody-Adams that there are times when we should not excuse persons, even when they are culturally influenced, for their part in wrongs that fit into a scheme of culturally accepted practices that is not recognized as wrong, including some sexist and racist practices (Isaacs 2011). However, contra Moody-Adams, Isaacs argues that not every case of widespread moral ignorance is a case of affected ignorance, that is, of choosing not to know whether some practice in which one participates might be wrong, and in these cases, one’s ignorance may be truly nonculpable (161). According to Isaacs, persons may be excused for wrongdoings associated with wrongful social practices when they lack equal access to the full range of actual and possible moral knowledge, or when moral discoveries are not immediately known or knowable by everyone because they have not yet become commonplace (163–164). Isaacs compares advances in moral knowledge to those about knowledge of the natural world; in either case, there are some things we can only know given a certain stage in the history of knowledge (163). Isaacs invokes Calhoun’s distinction between moral knowledge in normal moral contexts as opposed to moral knowledge in abnormal moral contexts, where only those moral “experts” such as feminists, and members of disadvantaged groups who may not be moral “experts” but who have special moral insights due to their experiences, acquire new moral knowledge about which outsiders are unaware. Isaacs believes that the root of the issue of responsibility lies with shifting a society from an abnormal moral context to a normal moral context, for it is in the latter where appeals to ignorance are no longer excusable. While Calhoun argues that the best way for this shift to take place is through reproach, e.g., labeling as sexist people who use the term “girl” instead of “woman” to refer to adult females, Isaacs favors dialogue in which traditional views are challenged by moral “experts,” members of disadvantaged groups, and the like. The shift in context is achieved, she notes, when individuals come to see themselves as responsible (174). For example, our society has shifted sufficiently such that no one who writes for a living can legitimately claim to be ignorant about gender neutral pronouns used in place of the male pronoun, and thus no one in this group is excused for being ignorant about this matter.

But there are other, much less lenient views about responsibility for the harms of oppression that some feminists and race theorists advocate. These accounts arguably ground responsibility in features that are independent of cultural influence, by employing the notion of humanity, the view that all persons are equal in some fundamental sense that transcends gender and race. One way to flesh out this view is to invoke Immanuel Kant’s notion of humanity, that all persons are rational, autonomous beings possessing dignity and deserving of respect. In short, they have intrinsic value in virtue of being persons. According to the accounts of responsibility at issue, members of socially dominant groups, or, “the privileged,” are responsible for knowing and acting on these basic facts about humanity that they share with their subordinates (Zack, 1998, 42–43; Superson, 2004). That is, in spite of the fact that oppression is a difficult concept to grasp, and notwithstanding Calhoun’s and Isaacs’s points about feminists having special knowledge that is not shared by the general public, the privileged ought to recognize, acknowledge, and respect their subordinates in virtue of these features common to all persons, even if patriarchal and racist societies muddle these facts about humanity by, for example, stereotyping all members of the subordinate group. Since knowing that all persons are equal in certain basic respects is a simple matter, defenders of this view do not want to absolve from responsibility those who disrespect others’ humanity. At best, responsibility ascriptions might be made on the basis of the degree of difficulty involved in sorting through patriarchal or racist norms and recognizing that a particular behavior does, indeed, violate a person’s humanity.

A further wrinkle in the debate about moral responsibility in the context of oppression is evidenced in subtle cases of sexism in which the agent is unaware of their sexism. An issue that nicely illustrates this phenomenon is that of implicit bias. This topic in moral psychology has recently gained a lot of attention and has showcased one of the ways in which philosophy can be enriched by empirical studies (see the entry on implicit bias; and Brownstein and Saul 2016a and 2016b). Jennifer Saul defines “implicit bias” as unconscious biases that affect the way we perceive, evaluate, or interact with people from the group that our biases ‘target’ (Saul 2013, 40). Saul points to psychological research that shows that most people, including those who profess to have egalitarian views and even those who are members of subordinate groups, harbor implicit biases against women and other minority groups. For example, Implicit Association tests, now taken by millions of people, that ask subjects to pair positive and negative adjectives with pictures of black and white faces, reveal that we are much quicker to pair black faces with negative adjectives than with positive ones (Brownstein and Saul 2016b, 1). Implicit biases are likely to cash out, without the agent’s conscious awareness, in ways that harm members of subordinate groups to which certain stereotypes are applied. Saul links the phenomenon of implicit bias to women’s underrepresentation in philosophy: in a tradition that is steeped in associating reason, objectivity, and philosophical thought with maleness, and emotion, subjectivity, and the non-philosophical with femaleness, it is likely that philosophers will display implicit bias against women when it comes to nonanonymous journal submissions, cvs for hiring, service loads, and classroom incivility (Saul 2013, 41, 43, 45).

Given that implicit biases are largely unconscious and resistant to the agent’s direct efforts to change or control them by force of will or mere intention (Brownstein and Saul 2016b, 2), can the agent be morally responsible for having them? Robin Zheng illustrates the tension between holding and not holding agents morally responsible for their own implicit biases (Zheng 2016). Zheng notes that, on the one hand, because we are often unaware of our implicit biases and so cannot control their influence, we do not seem to be responsible for them. But on the other hand, because implicit biases are the products and the perpetrators of social inequality, it seems right to hold agents responsible for them (62). Zheng’s proposal is to have two accounts of responsibility in cases of implicit bias. One is responsibility as attributability, according to which we are morally responsible when our actions reflect who we are as moral agents because they are manifestations of our ends, commitments, or values (62). Because we are often unaware of our implicit biases, on the attributability account of responsibility, we would be off the hook for behaviors that stem from them. Zheng argues for absolving from attributable responsibility a person who would not upon reflection endorse the influence of implicit bias on their action and who has done what they can reasonably be expected to do to avoid and respond to the implicit bias once they are made aware of it (72). A second kind of responsibility is what Zheng calls “accountability responsibility,” according to which we are responsible for our actions when it is appropriate for others to enforce certain expectations and demands on those actions (63). In the case of implicit biases, Zheng believes that we can be attributively not responsible for our biases while being accountable for them. Zheng is lenient in the ways that Isaacs and Brennan are in that she urges that we not hold others attributively responsible for conditions like implicit bias, at least for the reasons that it is nearly impossible to determine whether they harbor them in particular cases, and that people are more likely to do better without accusations of sexism and the like (78).

3.2 Taking Another’s Perspective

Another contribution feminists have made to the issue of responsibility is the notion of taking another’s perspective. Naomi Zack identifies the problem with racists, which, I believe, can be applied to sexists, as being that a racist “lacks basic moral or ethical impulses to identify with other living beings [who are not members of the group with which the racist or sexist identifies],” and that such identification “rests on the ability to seriously imagine oneself in the place of another” (1998, 42–43). Being able to imagine oneself in another’s place allows a person to realize that being the object of racism is a painful experience, and then to take steps to stop racist behavior both in themselves and in others. This bears on the issue of responsibility in the following way: those in the dominant class might claim that they are unable to take the perspective of the non-privileged, and since “‘ought’ implies ‘can’,” they have no obligation to do so (Superson, 2004, 47).

Feminists have made several suggestions about how the privileged might come to take the perspective of the non-privileged. Sandra Bartky and Iris Young have identified the phenomena of “cultural domination,” or “cultural imperialism,” according to which the non-privileged are made to see most things in a culture from the perspective of the dominant group, which serves to erase the importance, if not the identity, of those in the former group (Bartky 1990, 25; Young 1988, 285–286). We might think that if the non-privileged can be made to see things from the perspective of the dominant group, the latter are capable of seeing things from the perspective of the former. The first step to take in seeing things from the perspective of the oppressed might be to disaffiliate oneself from one’s privilege. So argues Marilyn Frye about white women’s disaffiliating themselves from their whiteliness (1995). Frye argues that white women feminists should stop constantly making themselves “whitely,” which she defines as a character of persons similar to masculinity whereby a person does not admit to being prejudiced, biased, and mean, yet at the same time is pretentious, rude, condescending, overbearing, and patronizing. Whiteliness interferes with white women’s ability to form alliances with women of other races, and even though “unbecoming” whitely will not eradicate racism, Frye believes it is a necessary step to doing so.

Maria Lugones takes Frye’s proposal a step further, introducing the notion of “world-traveling,” defined as “traveling” to the world of others who occupy a different position in the social hierarchy (1995). Lugones believes that world-traveling allows the privileged to come to see things from the perspective of the oppressed and even to come to see how the oppressed see the privileged: world-traveling will aid in overcoming cultural imperialism. Lugones notes that white women, for instance, have an obligation out of friendship to abandon their imperialism and come to see things from the perspective of Hispanic women. We might apply Lugones’s idea more generally to the privileged and the oppressed. To understand the notion of world-traveling, Lugones uses the example of whether she is playful or not: in some worlds she finds that she is, but in other worlds, she finds that she is serious. Whether she is playful, or more accurately, seen as playful, is a matter of how the dominant group constructs the concept of playfulness. Lugones believes that in order to world-travel, one needs to give up the arrogant construction of concepts from one’s own perspective. We can apply Lugones’s notion of world-traveling to the idea discussed in Section 3.1 of coming to see the non-privileged as being equal in humanity to the privileged. The privileged would have to see the non-privileged as likes by directing their attention away from themselves and toward the nonprivileged, by appreciating the personhood status of the nonprivileged, and by coming to understand the complex hurts involved in oppression which requires recognizing the interconnections between the systematically related barriers and forces that keep a group oppressed (Superson 2004, 38–49). Further, in Lugones’ words, the privileged would have to understand not as an observer but as a participant in a particular world.

But not all feminists believe that the privileged can ‘world-travel.’ Laurence Thomas, for instance, argues that the privileged cannot come to know the position of their subordinates because they cannot even grasp the latter’s experiences (1999). According to Thomas, heterosexual men cannot imagine how a female rape victim feels, since they cannot imagine the fear of rape that most if not all women feel, and do not have to deal with social attitudes that make them targets of sexual violence. By the same token, a white person does not know what it is for a black person to experience a feeling of being a second-class citizen when attacked by a group of whites, nor can a white person come to know it if attacked by a group of blacks. Thomas believes that in oppressive societies, the privileged are socially constituted differently from the oppressed, and so have different emotional configurations, making them experience things in different ways (186). Being viewed as less than full and equal members of society, and having painful memories of these experiences, are necessary conditions for the privileged person’s being able to take the perspective of the oppressed, which he is simply unable to do given his social condition. Whether this absolves the privileged from responsibility for oppression is not something Thomas addresses in the context of this discussion, but he argues that the privileged have an obligation to engage in “moral deference,” that is, to defer to those who speak in an informed way about experiences specific to their position of subordination to which others do not have access. He asserts that any morally decent, self-respecting person should listen to another’s moral story and acquire sensibility to the way in which that person lives in the world as a member of an oppressed group (189).

Some philosophers invoke more traditional philosophical tools such as analogies to get those in dominant groups to take the perspective of those in subordinate groups. Judith Jarvis Thomson, in her seminal article on abortion (1971), offers science-fiction-like analogies that serve as ways for men and women alike to imagine themselves in the position of women who are considering the moral status of abortion in cases of rape, when the mother’s life is at stake, and when contraception has failed. The analogies require men, who do not experience pregnancy, to imagine what it would be like to have a kidnapped violinist hooked up to them for nine months, or to be trapped in a house with a rapidly growing baby that will crush them to death, or to live in a house with fine mesh screens only to have people seeds drift in and take root in the carpeting and upholstery and grow into full-fledged persons for whom they are responsible. Feminist philosophers who write from a personal perspective attempt to get those in the dominant group to take the perspective of those in the subordinate group by describing in detail their experience of being a victim of a sexist act or practice (see Section 5).

3.3 Collective Responsibility

Some feminists have recently introduced the notion of collective responsibility, which would serve to hold men as a group responsible for aspects of women’s oppression. Writing about rape in particular, which we can take to be a facet of women’s oppression, Larry May and Robert Strikwerda argue that in some societies, men are collectively responsible for rape because most if not all men contribute to its prevalence (1999, 722). According to May and Strikwerda, rape is a crime perpetrated by men as a group, not just by the individual rapist. Acts of rape take place in what is called a “rape culture,” in which individual men are more likely to engage in rape when they are in groups, and men are strongly encouraged to rape by being socialized to be patriarchal men. May and Strikwerda cite data that young men in our society engage in more rape than previously thought, and that rapists are not significantly psychologically different from other males in our society. They agree with research suggesting that all-male groups socialize their members and provide cultural “cues” for violence, which serves as evidence that rape is not best thought of as an isolated act performed by just the rapist. They defend what they call “distributive collective responsibility,” which is the view that men form a group in which there are many features, including attitudes or dispositions to harm others, common to all or most members of the group, making what is true for one man true for all other men (728).

The key to understanding distributive collective responsibility is understanding patriarchy as being based on common interests and benefits extended to all men in a given society, and rendering each at least partially responsible for the harms of patriarchy. All men benefit from the existence of rape because women are made to feel dependent on men for protection from rapists. Significantly, May and Strikwerda argue that some men, in the way they interact with other men, contribute to a climate in which rape is made more prevalent, such as when they participate in the practice of “male bonding” which separates them from women who they deem to be “other.” Moreover, some men would be rapists if given the opportunity, since they share the same attitudes as rapists about rape and about women. Such factors make men collectively responsible for rape, and thus for at least part of women’s oppression. In another article on shared responsibility and racist attitudes, whose arguments apply equally to sexist attitudes, May argues that “insofar as people share in the production of an attitudinal climate, they participate in something like a joint venture that increases the likelihood of harm” (1992, 47). May expands on traditional, individualistic responsibility accounts by assigning at least some responsibility to those who themselves do not commit racist acts, but who harbor racist attitudes in a climate in which others are thereby more likely to act on their racist attitudes and cause harm. Thus a person can share responsibility for harms the person does not directly cause: men who harbor sexist attitudes contribute to a climate in which other men who have sexist attitudes act on them, and are partly responsible for the harmful behavior.

3.4 Responsibility of the Oppressed for Immorality

The issue of whether the oppressed are responsible for immorality can be broken down into two questions: Are the oppressed free from responsibility for immoral acts unrelated to their own oppression on the grounds that their socialization plays some role in their acting immorally? Are the oppressed responsible for contributing to their own oppression by not resisting it? This section takes up the first question; Section 3.5 takes up the second question.

While earlier, non-feminist philosophical treatments of an individual’s responsibility for her or his own behavior have typically focused on the role an individual has played in causing a certain outcome, more recent discussions, particularly by race theorists and to a lesser extent feminists, shift away from causation talk and acknowledge the significance of the influence of social forces on an agent’s actions and the degree to which they might mitigate the agent’s responsibility for her or his actions. It is striking, however, that feminists have had little to say about lessening women’s responsibility for their immoral actions when the reasons women act are largely influenced by their treatment under patriarchy. Some race theorists, though, have discussed this issue. I. A. Menkiti, for instance, explores how social deviants, or, psychopaths come to be (1977–1978). Menkiti defines a psychopath as one who is outside morality in the sense that he does not care about others or accept responsibility, and feels no guilt, regret, shame, or remorse. Menkiti argues that some psychopaths have been made into the beings they are by social injustice that generates economic deprivation for people in their group, which constantly challenges their self-esteem, causing them to go through a series of stages from that of resentment, to that of embitterment, to that of moral death (227–230). Menkiti argues that the community is at least partly responsible for the behavior of psychopaths who riot or gang bang in response both to unbearable poverty brought about by conscious discrimination directed at them in virtue of their group membership, and to institutionalized racial exclusion. This is because the community plays a significant role in their becoming psychopaths. Menkiti believes that it is unfair to blame individuals for primarily institutional failures (236). He muses that philosophers have shied away from this kind of collective responsibility because it traces the causal connection too far, but he urges that it makes just as much sense to consider society a culprit as it does to say that societies are victims of crimes and that there are debts owed to society (237).

The paucity of feminist discussion of this kind of argument as applied to women may be due partly to the view that women’s response to their oppression typically has been to internalize it by acquiring deformed desires (see Section 2) and adopting stereotypical traits and roles such as becoming servile. Such behaviors do not strike many of us as being as immoral as rioting and gang banging, and if they are not immoral, then the question about whether women are unfairly held responsible for them does not even arise. Indeed, feminists have had to make a special case that, for instance, a woman’s adopting stereotypical traits and roles is immoral because it harms women as a group (see Section 3.5), or that servility is immoral because it violates a duty to be self-respecting, as Kant believed. Some feminists even reject these views. Cynthia Stark argues against Kant’s view that any rational being would on reflection see himself as an end in itself. Stark points out that characters like the Deferential Wife have deeply socially (patriarchally) constituted identities that are often incompatible with a conception of themselves as persons (1997, 76–77). She argues that Kant’s view is too harsh in not taking into account the agent’s circumstances, expecting everyone to pull themselves up by their bootstraps and be self-respecting.

Paul Benson is one feminist who makes this point about the agent’s circumstances and relates it to women’s responsibility for immoral action (2000, 79–85). Benson argues for imposing a self-worth condition on responsibility. He argues that in order for an agent to be morally responsible, it must be the case that we can hold her responsible for her actions. For this, a person has to be worthy of a social standing, that of an eligible participant in moral exchanges that involve, for example, offering reasons, seeking to be excused, begging forgiveness, and blaming someone. Being a participant in such moral exchanges requires that the person respond to moral treatment such as blame, and that she recognize the legitimacy of this demand. It is appropriate to hold someone responsible just in case it is appropriate to hold the person to the demand for a suitable response, but, significantly for feminist purposes, it requires that the person to whom the response is directed does not regard herself as unworthy of this kind of moral exchange. One factor that can interfere with the agent’s regard for her own worth, according to Benson, is the internalization of oppressive social norms. Not having proper regard for one’s own worth may involve not believing that it is one’s place to take responsibility for one’s actions. In such cases, it is not appropriate to hold these agents fully responsible for their actions. One feature distinguishing Benson’s account from non-feminist accounts of responsibility that determine responsibility on the basis of features like having a capacity for critical reflection, being able to make choices, and knowing what one is doing, is the fact that Benson’s account is sensitive to a person’s sense of her worth as it is affected by internalizing oppressive social norms.

Benson himself believes that his account of responsibility is feminist because it is relational, which means that it reflects our connections to others instead of reflecting a view of persons that many feminists reject, namely, as abstract, individualistic, or atomistic self-governing and self-sufficient agents. Benson cites several ways in which his account is relational. One is that it requires that the agent have a sufficient account of her worth to be accountable to others, and this requires that there be others. More specifically, the account expects a person to speak for her own actions to others, which is necessary for becoming a responsible agent and acquiring the right sense of her worth. One “makes oneself” in an interpersonal context, which many feminists take to be necessary for moral agency. A second reason Benson’s account is relational, and so feminist, is that publicly shareable norms govern the agent’s actions and her own account of them to others. Subordination and domination threaten this account of norms, Benson argues, by making it impossible for persons to understand how they could defend or excuse their own conduct. Third, being responsible is a matter of having the status of being an eligible participant in a community of moral dialogue in which the parties regard themselves as being in a position to speak for their own agency in response to criticism from others, and can hold themselves responsible. If we exempt women from responsibility, Benson worries, we fail at least in some cases to respect their status as equal participants in this dialogue, which is sexist. So if a woman recognizes herself as having intrinsic worth and being able to speak for her own agency, it would be disrespectful and sexist not to hold her responsible.

Benson suggests that mitigating women’s responsibility for immoral action runs the risk of undermining women’s moral agency. This might be another reason for the scarcity of feminist discussion about the role of socialization in women’s responsibility for immoral action. The worry is that if an agent is under the sway of her socialization or circumstances, she seems to be a mere pawn who does not or cannot take control over her actions. Absolving women from responsibility for their behavior not only risks denying their agency, but risks perpetuating sexist stereotypes. This is what worries Wanda Teays about using the excusing model of self-defense for abused women who kill their abusers (1998, 61–64). Under this model, an abused woman is excused from killing her abuser either because she did not realize that she was violating the law, or because she could not prevent herself from breaking it presumably because she was under the sway of her emotions. In either case, the focus is on her, the actor, excusing her because of some characteristic she possesses or her state of mind, implying that she is mentally impaired or not reasonable. Teays favors the justifying model, which acknowledges that the woman is reasonable in the sense that there is nothing wrong with her or her reasoning skills, and that she responds appropriately, given her circumstances. This model neither compromises the woman’s agency nor perpetuates sexist stereotypes about women’s mental states. It describes these women not as being under the sway of their emotions, but as being able to determine in a rational way when self-defense is warranted. Feminists might apply this model more generally to explain the relevance of women’s circumstances to their responsibility or blameworthiness for acting immorally.

One such view, though not put forward as a feminist one, is offered by Sarah Buss in response to Susan Wolf’s case of the Victim of a Deprived Childhood. Wolf argues that such a person, who was given no love and was beaten by his father and neglected by his mother, is not responsible for embezzling money later in life (1986). Although he has features that typically would make him responsible, such as not being coerced, being in control of his behavior, and having a normal faculty of reason, he is absolved from responsibility because he could not have had reason to act morally instead of embezzling. This is because, despite there being reasons for acting morally, the reasons the Victim of a Deprived Childhood has are determined by his circumstances. That is, there are reasons not to embezzle, but this kind of agent, due to his circumstances, fails to see, and cannot reasonably be expected to see, that there are such moral reasons. To overcome his background and see that there are moral reasons not to embezzle, he would have to have a certain kind of sensibility and perception that he lacks. Since we cannot reasonably expect this kind of agent to see that there is reason not to embezzle, and because the reasons he does see are determined by his circumstances, Wolf believes that his actions stemming from these reasons are determined, so he is neither blameworthy nor responsible for embezzling. However, the view that one’s reasons are determined by one’s circumstances threatens a view of moral agency according to which a person can freely choose among available reasons. Were feminists to draw the same conclusion about women who internalize their own oppression such as the Deferential Wife described above (Section 1), they would run into the worry about denying women moral agency.

Sarah Buss argues against Wolf’s view in a way that is not agency-denying, because rather than appealing to the agent’s circumstances as determining his reasons, Buss believes that such circumstances give this kind of agent a justified failure to “tell right from wrong” (1997). Buss embellishes Wolf’s example of the Victim, who as a child came into contact mostly with people who either beat him, supported those who beat him, or ignored his misery. Whenever the victim was beaten, he was first taunted. Years later, when he is taunted with a threatening comment, he hits his taunter. Buss believes that the Victim is responsible for hitting his taunter, since there are moral reasons not to hit one who taunts you: hitting one’s taunter is morally wrong. But Buss believes that the Victim is justified in hitting his taunter because he has excusing reasons to act thusly, which are grounded in his circumstances. Excusing reasons free him and other similar agents from blame, at least in certain circumstances, depending on the nature of the wrongdoing, whether there are alternative actions available, and the details of his background. Generally speaking, he can be absolved from blame because he has a justified failure to tell right from wrong—anyone in his circumstances has reason to act the way he does, even though they also have reason not to act immorally. Buss defends what she calls “the Basic Intuition,” according to which “simply because they have exceptional backgrounds, certain wrongdoers have a different moral status from that of more ‘privileged’ wrongdoers who perform the very same type of acts” (337). A person would have to be truly exceptional not to see things as the Victim sees them and write off his experiences as ones not indicative of human nature. Buss offers this analogy: the Victim no more has good reason for thinking that his taunter is not like the hostile people he grew up around, than does the person who has been bitten repeatedly by dogs has good reason to think that the growling dog in her path will not bite her (350). The Basic Intuition attributes to the victim not an incapacity for making the correct moral distinctions, but a justified failure to “tell right from wrong.” He has excusing reasons for acting as he does. Buss’s non-deterministic argument might be employed by feminists as an agency-protecting way of absolving women from blame for certain immoral acts. They might also use it to absolve women from responsibility, if they can show that the acts in question are in themselves justified, perhaps by showing that they are legitimate responses to threats to a person’s intrinsic value (see Superson 2010).

3.5 Responsibility for Resisting One’s Own Oppression; Victim-blaming

Are the oppressed responsible for contributing to their own oppression by not resisting it?

Not only men, but women contribute to women’s oppression, not by directly causing it, but by sustaining it through their attitudes and behavior. “Right-wing” women are those whose lifestyles largely reflect right-wing values, and for the reason that they believe that women belong in stereotypical roles (Superson 1993). They possess the same attitudes about women as do sexist men. This conception excludes women who on occasion engage in right-wing behavior, for reasons other than because they believe women ought to adopt stereotypical roles. The property of being right-wing can more or less reflect prevalent sexist stereotypes. Many right-wing women have deformed desires (see Section 2). Other women who neither endorse patriarchal values nor have deformed desires choose roles that when enough other women also choose them, perpetuate sexist stereotypes about women and thereby contribute to their own oppression. Are such women responsible and/or blameworthy for contributing to their own oppression? On the one hand, sexist behavior, no matter who causes it, sustains women’s oppression and harms women, so we might want to hold responsible and blame these women for their participation in the system. On the other hand, blaming women for their own oppression seems to blame the victim.

Feminists are divided over whether women are responsible and/or blameworthy for contributing to their own oppression. Some believe that women’s strong indoctrination into patriarchal beliefs and values makes it likely that they would come to have them (Bartky 1999a; Luker 1984; Nussbaum 1999a; Superson 1993). For example, some religious, particularly Christian, right-wing women adopt and act on patriarchal values because they believe this is the way things ought to be as part of God’s plan, while some secular right-wing women adopt patriarchal values because they believe that oppression is unalterable and that conformity is their best option. Some feminists believe that such right-wing women fail completely to understand feminism, and fail to see that their choice of lifestyle limits their choices even further (Superson 1993). Blaming entails judging the one blamed as morally remiss. But if women really do not understand feminism and fail to see that their choice of lifestyle is non-liberating, these feminists find it as inappropriate to blame or hold responsible women for their role in their own oppression as it is to blame or hold responsible rape victims for rape who play no moral role in their own harm.

Yet other feminists might blame or hold responsible women who do not resist their own oppression. Some argue that women have an obligation to resist their own oppression, at least under certain conditions, and so are responsible for resisting. Carol Hay responds to the view that women’s having an obligation to resist their own oppression unfairly restricts their choices and blames the victim (2005). Hay acknowledges that both external and internal forces of patriarchy, including deformed desires, often restrict a woman’s autonomy, but argues that this is not a sufficient reason not to require women to resist their oppression. She believes that women under patriarchy have a fair degree of autonomy, and that autonomy is a necessary condition for the possibility of moral obligation, which in turn is at least partially constitutive of moral agency (105). She accepts as a general principle that we should hold agents responsible only for actions that are undertaken autonomously: if the agent has no autonomy, she has no obligation, and if the agent is fully autonomous, she is fully subject to all possible moral obligations that might exist in a situation (99). Hay also believes that it is unfair to require moral obligations of someone who is incapable of fulfilling them. But she believes that demanding more responsibility of someone who is capable of fulfilling their moral obligations because they have at least some degree of autonomy might end up increasing their autonomy. This is the case, Hay believes, for women under patriarchy. Hay acknowledges that it may be unfair to burden women with an obligation to resist their oppression, but believes that women’s fulfilling this obligation is essential to eliminating patriarchy in addition to increasing their autonomy. Indeed, she believes that this increased burden is yet another reason to eliminate patriarchy (104–105). Hay notes that whether a woman is in fact obligated to resist her oppression in a particular instance of sexism (e.g., confronting a sexual harasser) depends on the danger involved in doing so: when the risk of harm to herself is significant, she is free from the obligation.

Ann Cudd also argues that women have an obligation to resist their own oppression. She takes up the case where women understand their oppression and are not under the sway of deformed desires, and where oppression is not so pervasive that it is impossible or seriously risky to resist it (2006). She offers the case of Larry and Lisa, a couple who agrees that it is best if one of them assumes most of the childrearing duties. Given the existing gender wage gap, the couple reasons that it is rational for them to choose that Lisa opt out of the paid labor force and raise the children. But her doing so, when enough other women do so as well, lends strength and stability to women’s oppression because it makes employers perceive women as unreliable wage workers, which feeds the very stereotypical image that creates the gender wage gap in the first place (199). Further, Lisa’s participating in a sexist division of labor increases the expectation that other women will do the same. Cudd argues that Lisa needs to weigh the benefit of the economic gain her family can expect if Larry is the wage worker against the harm caused by perpetuation of the stereotype of women as primarily domestic workers and unreliable wage workers, and then do the least undeserved harm. Women like Lisa have an obligation to sacrifice their immediate wants for a long-term vision of a better future (188). Cudd argues further that requiring the oppressed to resist their oppression is not a case of wrongful blaming of the victim; rather, it is like the case of a person who suffers a superficial cut by someone’s careless use of sharp scissors, but who is to blame for some of the harm if he loses his hand to gangrene because he refuses to wash and care for the cut. Both victims participate in some way in the harm they suffer, even though neither is the initial cause of the harm.

In contrast to feminists who defend an obligation to resist oppression, Daniel Silvermint examines the phenomenon of “passing as privileged” as a way to navigate one’s oppression so as to promote one’s well-being. Silvermint describes “passing as privileged” as occurring “when a member of an oppressed, stigmatized, or otherwise discriminated-against group x is passively or actively perceived to be a member of a privileged group y, thereby escaping the unjust barriers and burdens that come with being identified as an x and/or accessing the advantages that come with being (mis)identified as a y” (Silvermint 2018, 6). He is concerned mainly with “active passing,” which is a strategy used to create or avoid the perception of a certain kind of person, such as when an immigrant family Anglicizes their last name in order to hide their naturalized status (3). His concern is whether a victim of oppression ought to pass as a non-victim when they can successfully do so.

According to Silvermint, passing and resisting one’s oppression share the aim that they are both ways to improve one’s life or circumstances in the face of oppression (38). The main difference he sees between them is that persons who resist in various ways attempt to improve their well-being by undermining, changing, or escaping the oppressive system that constrains their well-being, while persons who engage in passing as a member of a privileged group act in ways that sustain those constraints while attempting to exploit the way in which they are distributed so as to avoid being constrained by them. Essentially, the latter make a trade-off between two valuable constituents of their well-being, both of which cannot simultaneously be promoted under oppression. For example, a trans woman might pass as a cis-gender woman in order to avoid physical violence; a victim of stereotype threat might pass as a confident professional in order to succeed (31); and a queer femme might pass as a cis-gender woman by avoiding holding hands with her girlfriend in order to ward off an insensitive co-worker (11). But unlike classic resisters, persons who engage in passing leave intact rather than challenge the very system that harms them. Silvermint likens them to the teenager who is bullied and comes to school dressed like his bullies and engages in behavior similar to them and eventually gets accepted by them. Silvermint takes issue with three main arguments that passing is morally wrong, namely, that it compromises the agent’s authenticity, that it involves deception, and that it harms fellow victims by reinforcing stereotypes. He instead defends the view that passing is a permissible form of self-regarding complicity on the grounds that persons who engage in passing are not responsible for being victims of oppression and are navigating their circumstances in the best way they can in order to promote their well-being (40).

4. The Psychology of the Oppressor

While there has been some feminist writing to date on the psychology of the oppressor, Robin Dillon calls for much more work in this area (Dillon 2012). In particular, Dillon urges that feminists develop what she calls “critical character theory,” a way of theorizing character from a feminist perspective (85). Such a theory recognizes that domination and subordination operate not just at the political and social levels, but through character. Among the things it asks is whether certain traits might contribute to or undermine oppression. It is particularly concerned to speak to vice, which Dillon believes is for the most part left out of moral theories. Knowing about vice is not only intrinsically important, but it is important for how we raise our children and develop their moral characters, especially in regard to enabling them to combat oppression (91–92). A feminist moral theory should examine how systematic oppression reflects and reinforces domination values, and how it normalizes and buttresses vice in members of dominant groups (94). It should also suggest how we might repair character damage, not just externally, by making systematic changes, but internally too. Dillon suggests that it might be the case that repairing character is a necessary condition or at least an effective way of transforming unjust social conditions like oppression.

Dillon agrees with Lisa Tessman that oppression fosters certain vices in the privileged, including arrogance, self-centeredness, callousness, indifference, and social irresponsibility, and adds that it damages the characters of those who perpetrate or are complicit in oppression, and it does so in ways that the benefits of privilege do not outweigh (96). Tessman argues that under oppression, the self can be damaged in such a way that it cannot flourish (Tessman 2005, 4). She develops the notion of “burdened virtues,” virtues one has that are cultivated in an oppressive context. The privileged, particularly ones who culpably passively accept their privilege, if not positively endorse it, exhibit the “ordinary vices of domination” which prevent them from flourishing in spite of benefiting. Aside from the vices already mentioned, the privileged often exhibit a lack of certain moral virtues, including compassion for others not in their group, generosity, cooperativeness, and openness to appreciating others (55). While the privileged can flourish among the privileged, and in this way meet Aristotle’s criteria for eudaimonia, they cannot flourish on a conception of eudaimonia that reflects the fact of social inequality. Tessman argues that moral goodness requires not only a pursuit of one’s own well-being and the well-being of others on whom one depends, as Aristotle believes, but also the well-being of others whose lack of well-being may have been a condition of one’s privilege (76). Tessman’s attention to vice in the context of oppression is exactly the kind of work that Dillon believes might be essential in ending oppression, and Dillon’s own work on arrogance is likely to be followed by feminist progress in this area (Dillon 2004).

Both Dillon and Tessman are rejecting ideal theory as an approach to theorizing character. According to Charles Mills, who also rejects it, ideal theory represents the actual as a simple deviation from the ideal that is not worth theorizing in its own right, or it falsely states that starting from the ideal is the best way of realizing the ideal (Mills 2005, 168). The problem is that ideal models abstract away in a problematic way from realities that are crucial to understanding injustice, such as structural domination, exploitation, coercion, and oppression (170). In so doing, ideal theory represents the experiences of the dominant group only, and thus serves their interests (172). But since ethics is supposed to be about how actual people act, and since ideal theory does not reflect the experiences of subordinate groups, it is not the best way of doing ethics. Tessman’s work on “impossible cases” critiques ideal moral theory on the grounds that it fails to capture moral dilemmas which involve non-negotiable moral requirements which are grounded in innate values such as love and life that cannot be unproblematically compromised (e.g., killing your crying baby in order to protect a group from the Nazis) (Tessman 2017). We can imagine feminist cases of this phenomenon, such as killing a rapist in order to protect your dignity.

Dillon’s call for more work in critical character theory notwithstanding, there is some earlier literature that is either explicitly feminist or that can be used by feminists that speaks to the psychology of members of the dominant group, men, who act in sexist ways, thereby contributing to women’s oppression. Feminists and their supporters have offered explanations for how a sexist comes to be, examining in particular the role that a bad society, corrupt socialization, and the adoption of patriarchal values and beliefs play in his development. They have also attempted to explain the underlying motivation in a person who engages in sexist or racist behavior that contributes to the oppression of a group.

Laurence Thomas offers an account of how a society in which there is a general lack of trust that others will not harm a person can make a person come to cultivate indifference to harming others, if not worse (1996). Thomas’s account can be applied to sexist forms of evil, or, immorality. He believes that society is adversely affected by the wide-scale absence of goodwill among its members, and that game-theoretic models for social cooperation as offered by contemporary moral and political theorists that do not acknowledge motivation cannot accommodate this shortcoming (272). Thomas considers the Golden Rule, which dictates that you “Do unto others as you would have them do unto you.” He claims that rather than comply with this rule out of fear, which shows a lack of respect for others, we should comply in ways the rule was intended, out of the other-regarding motive of not wanting to cause another harm or suffering, a feeling that is generated both by our own experience of being harmed and from the nature of human beings in general. For instance, those who have this other-regarding motive will know what it is like to experience the moral pain of being a victim of a racial epithet, which should suffice to prevent him or her from using a racial epithet against others. In a moral climate, a person is more likely to have this other-regarding sentiment, but in a society where trust that others will not harm us is lacking, we are likely to lose it and develop virtue-derailing sentiments, first becoming indifferent to harming others, then morally numb, then eventually evil beings.

Thomas suggests that there is a parallel between the family structure and society with respect to the failure to develop the moral sensibilities that the Golden Rule calls for (273). It is only through parental love (or the love of parental surrogates), Thomas believes, that self-love is securely underwritten (279). The child who is loved by his parents can first come to see himself as having intrinsic value, which is the basis for self-love. Self-love, in turn, underwrites the other-regarding sentiments. Thomas is not suggesting that all children who come from abusive homes will lack other-regarding sentiments and become evil persons, but instead is saying that other-regarding sentiments have a more difficult time gaining a secure foothold in children in abusive homes than in loving ones (281). This is because the abused child is typically consumed with when and how he will be abused and how he will cope, his own well-being and survival, and developing virtue-derailing motives, such as bitterness, rancor, and a desire for vengeance, which are at odds with other-regarding sentiments. Thomas believes that in a similar way, a society where trust (that others who can harm us will not) is lacking impedes a person’s having other-regarding sentiments toward strangers that is called for by the Golden Rule. If we live in a society in which we lack trust in others that they will not harm us, our concern with whether our own actions will not harm others will be substantially weakened, leading to indifference toward harming others, or, moral numbness. If the moral climate in society becomes bad enough, it will give rise to bitterness, rancor, and a desire for vengeance (285). Thomas believes that when we are the object of systematic hostility, presumably the kind associated with systematic racism and sexism, a natural reaction on our part is to develop hostility, bitterness, and rancor. Although Thomas does not link his discussion to the cultivation of sexists per se, other philosophers writing about evil, including feminists writing especially about the evil of oppression, explain the immoral character of members of the dominant group who act in sexist or racist ways toward those in subordinate groups, by displaying indifference to their humanity, or, the intrinsic value they have in virtue of being persons, as will be discussed later in this section (see also Section 3.1).

Larry May is a feminist who has written specifically about the role of male socialization in the cultivation of sexist attitudes and behaviors in men. In one of his articles, May examines the socialization practiced by formerly all-male military institutions such as the Citadel and the Virginia Military Institute (1998b). These institutions practice separatism in order to establish a male culture and instill traditional male values without pressure from the outside, particularly from women. They are formed as places for boys to become men or to prove they are men, perpetuating a form of masculinity supported by other all-male sports settings, all-male clubs, and so on (117). In these military institutional settings, the conditions are stark, the quarters are tight and lack privacy, and the cadets are considered to be mere “rats,” not unique persons deserving of respect, and are forced to suffer mental stress, punishment, even beatings. The point of such treatment is for the cadets to develop self-discipline and spirit thought necessary for leadership skills and character, to form a sense of bonding with fellow sufferers and former tormenters, and to channel young male aggression (118).

The problem, though, according to May, is that this training backfires, and male aggression gets re-directed especially toward women: when the cadets think of themselves as “rats,” rather than as persons deserving of respect, it is only a small step to thinking that women, who are generally portrayed as even less deserving than themselves, are less than rats and beneath contempt (129). Men who go through this military training have trouble containing their aggression in simulated combat situations at least partly because when aggression is deemed acceptable, this sometimes makes it more likely that a man will display more and stronger aggression than would otherwise be the case (132). And sometimes the fact that this training forbids the cadets to show any aggression toward the upperclassmen who verbally or physically assault them can backfire, and they display heightened aggression to their peers or to women in the context of civilian life (132). May argues that the male values protected by these military institutions are ones that have historically produced hatred and abuse toward women (121). Not only in the military, but in civilian life, male aggression is channeled in ways that are not necessarily respectful of women, such as intense pursuit of protection and support for family. This “breadwinner” role is often linked with a view of men as dominant over women in family life (133). In another article, May argues that practices like sexual harassment promote male solidarity that keeps women in an inferior position and excludes them from full and equal participation (1998a, 105). Posting a Playboy centerfold in a common area of a workplace contributes to a form of male bonding that makes females feel unwelcome; it is a signal to any woman who enters the room that women are to be viewed as comparable to the woman in the picture, not welcome in this location as an equal to men. She is excluded for the reason that she is a woman, not for any idiosyncratic reason (1998a, 106). Women’s exclusion builds male solidarity. The same kind of bonding and exclusion may go on in the professions, especially ones where women are currently significantly underrepresented (see Kaufman 1999, 199–201; Valian,1999; Superson 2002). These forms of socialization and practices at least partly explain why some members of the dominant group men develop sexist characters or act in sexist ways.

Feminists have also attempted to explain what it is about a person’s motivations or attitudes that prompt him to engage in sexist behavior. Several feminists writing about various explicitly sexist behaviors attribute the behaviors to the person’s endorsing sexist stereotypes. Kathleen Waits describes the woman-batterer as endorsing traditional sex roles, believing that the man should be “the master” of the house and that it is the woman’s job to satisfy all his needs and wants (1993, 193). The batterer often projects a macho exterior, has a tremendous need to dominate and control his wife, and believes that he has the right to use violence against her in order to enforce his will (193). Susan Griffin cites studies and social data describing the convicted rapist as having, on a statistical average, a normal sexual personality, differing from the normal, well-adjusted male only in having a greater tendency to express violence and rage (1981, 318). The rapist endorses stereotypical views about male dominance and female submission, which Griffin notes are the same views erotically expressed in the practice of heterosexual love in our culture. According to our culture’s heterosexual norms, male eroticism is wedded to power, and the man must demonstrate his superior strength with gestures of dominance which are perceived as amorous (317–318). One reason the courts have had a hard time distinguishing consensual sex from rape is that the same gender stereotypes that are present in “normal” heterosexual sex are present in rape, though in rape they are carried to more violent extremes. The practice of female genital mutilation, or FGM, also reflects the acceptance of sexist stereotypes about male dominance and female submission. Although FGM is typically carried out by female relatives or a midwife, the whole society, particularly its male leaders, are the ones who set the social norms. We might think of the women who perform the procedure as vessels through which the real proponents of the practice act. Semra Asefa argues that FGM has long been justified by the belief that women are unable to control their own sexuality in the face of their strong desire for sex (1994 and 1998, 98). The practice of FGM aims to diminish or destroy the woman’s capacity for sexual enjoyment, making her into a breeding machine to perpetuate her husband’s line. Cultures that practice FGM often also require domestic confinement as another element of the husband’s control, and include severe punishment of women for adultery, while encouraging males to be polygamous because it is believed that a man’s virility increases proportionately with the number of children he has (99). The practice of FGM reflects the view that men are dominant in that they control a woman’s capacity to have sex for pleasure and whether she has a choice to have sex with men other than her husband (see Nussbaum 1999b).

Central to the stereotypes of male dominance and female submission is the notion that men are superior in worth, and women, inferior. Jean Hampton offers a feminist analysis of what goes on with the sexist immoralist who targets a person in virtue of her group membership (1999). Hampton defines a wrongful action as one that is disrespectful of a person’s value, conveying the view that the wrongdoer is superior in value to his victim. A wife abuser sends the message that his wife has the value of chattel; a rapist conveys the attitude that women are even lower than chattel, as mere objects to be used whenever the male feels the need to do so (134–135). Indeed, Hampton argues, rape harms all women, not just its direct victim, by aiming to establish men’s mastery over women: “As a woman, you are the kind of human being who is subject to the mastery of people of my kind,” and that “Your kind isn’t the equal in worth of my kind” (135). Rape, on the Kantian view Hampton favors, attempts to lower, or “diminishes,” the intrinsic value all humans have in virtue of being rational and autonomous beings, though Hampton agrees with Kant that a person’s intrinsic value can never actually be lowered. Thus, the motivation of the rapist and other sexists who commit wrongful actions against their victims is that they lack respect for women as persons having intrinsic value.

5. Conclusion

The topics in feminist moral psychology are motivated by the feminist aim to end women’s oppression. Although what unites all feminists is that they share this aim, as we have seen, feminists differ in their views on how best to accomplish this aim. Specifically, regarding topics in moral psychology, feminists differ in their views on the following: the role of emotion in moral theory; whether women have deformed desires and to what extent deformed desires interfere with women’s autonomy; the degree to which members of the dominant group men are responsible for their participation in women’s oppression; whether members of the dominant group are able to take the perspective of the non-privileged; whether the socialization or background circumstances of members of the subordinate group mitigates their responsibility or blameworthiness for immoral action unrelated to oppression; and whether women are responsible for resisting their own oppression. We should not conclude that these differences suggest that feminist philosophical scholarship is so divisive as to not be useful. Rather, we should conclude the opposite, that feminist insights have greatly enriched the field of moral psychology by bringing philosophers’ attention to issues that have been previously ignored or not sufficiently examined. The progress feminists have made, and continue to make, on these issues is essential to eliminating women’s oppression.


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