#### Supplement to Modal Fictionalism

## Rosen's Incompleteness Worry

The “incompleteness problem” discussed by Rosen (1990, pp. 341-345) can be expressed as follows: there are some modal issues (and corresponding issues about the nature of possible worlds) that a realist may well be silent on — not because they believe there is no answer, but rather because they believe themselves ignorant of the answer. A fictionalist who treats the realist's theory as a fiction, on the other hand, will be silent upon the same issues — but this can lead to a more serious problem. Rosen, who uses as his fiction the theory that David Lewis proposes as fact, takes as an example an issue Lewis 1986 is silent on: the maximum “size” of possible worlds (or in particular, the maximum number of non-overlapping physical objects in a single world). Rosen's worry is this: according to the view he develops, (the numbering is Rosen's, and the details are from his example on p. 342 of 1990):

(10) There might have been κ non-overlapping physical objects.if and only if

(10f) According to PW, there is a [world] containing κ non-overlapping physical objects.

(10f) is not true, since PW is silent on the issue. So (10) is not true. But the same thing happens for the negation of (10):

(11) It is not the case that there might have been κ non-overlapping physical objects.is plausibly true if and only if

(11f) According to PW, no [world] contains κ [non-overlapping] physical objects.

If (11) is really the negation of (10), then classically one of them must be true. If one of them is literally false, then its negation should be true. Rosen is inclined to accept (on the fictionalist's behalf) that they are genuine contradictories, and both lack a truth-value. He points out, however, two difficulties with this: firstly, his proposal makes (10f) and (11f) truth-valueless too, when they seem clearly false (at least if “according to PW…” works like “according to the fiction …” operators standardly do); and secondly, the disjunction of (10) and (11) is true and a logical truth, so we have the truth of a disjunction without the truth of either disjunct. (Not that this is unknown in the treatment of truth-value gaps, as Rosen points out.) Such logical revision might be thought a high price to pay.

In addition, Rosen rightly points out (p. 342), the fictionalist has settled the question of whether it is true that there might have been κ many non-overlapping physical objects: it is not true. Those who were inclined to think that we are in ignorance of this piece of modal information (or any other piece of modal information about which the story is “silent” in a similar way) will not like this result. The fictionalist does not make room for modal ignorance to the same extent the realist does.

Rosen's discussion of this worry is unhappy in several places.
The first is that (11f) is not his only official translation of (11),
assuming “might have been” is to be treated as “possibly” in this
context: controposing his biconditional for possiblity (with the
appropriate substitutions for *P*) yields:

It is not the case that there might have been κ non-overlapping physical objectsif and only if

(11f*) It is not the case that, according to PW, there is a world containing κ non-overlapping physical objects.

(11f*) yields the result that (11) is simply true, if we interpret
“according to PW” in the usual way (and not the way which makes
“According to PW, *Q*” truthvalueless if *Q* is “not determinately
settled as true or false by the theory PW”, whatever that might mean
in this context). Since (11) *is* the contradictory of (10),
and (10) is false by the lights of Rosen's original proposal,
this should not be surprising. This result has unpleasant
consequences of its own, of course, since accepting this theory would
commit one to denying the interdefinability of possibility and
necessity. Normally, “possibly *P*” is taken to be equivalent to
“not-necessarily not-*P*”, and “necessarily *P*” is taken to be
equivalent to “not-possibly not-*P*”. But the second will fail in this
case (and the first will fail in other similar cases). For (11f) is
the appropriate correlate of the claim that “necessarily, there are
not κ non-overlapping
physical objects”, and this claim is standardly taken to be
equivalent to (11). For the reasons Rosen gives, however, the
correlate of (11f) is not true, whereas (11) is, due to the truth of
(11f*).

Denying the interdefinability of necessity and possibility in the
standard way is perhaps not as big a modification to our logic and
semantics as introducing truth-value gaps. It will still be seen as
very unattractive by many. There is another modification to the basic
theory which might be made to deal with these cases, which is a
different way of implementing the spirit of Rosen's proposed
strategy here. Rosen says the fictionalist can modify his theory by
“declaring that in general when the paraphrase *P** of a modal claim is
not determinately settled as true or false by the theory PW, the
modal claim *P* is to lack a truth-value” (p. 343). What is puzzling
about Rosen's implementation of this proposal is that he takes
it that this implies that the “According to PW, *P**” claim has to be
truthvalueless when PW neither says *P** or its negation. This
has the further unwelcome consequence that “According to PW” will not
function like “according to the fiction…” operators are standardly
thought to. A more natural way of going, surely, is to treat
“According to PW …” in the standard way (i.e. it is just false that
“According to PW, *P**”, when PW is neither committed to *P** or to its
negation), but to provide for truth-value gaps for the modal claims
by restricting the fictionalist biconditional. Instead of the general
scheme:

Piff According to PW,P*,

the fictionalist could instead accept the clumsier:

ifP, then According to PW,P*, and if not-P, then According to PW, not-P*, and if According to PW,P*, thenP, and if According to PW, not-P*, then not-P

and further stipulate that *P* is truthvalueless iff neither according
to PW, *P**, nor according to PW, not-*P**.

When the fiction says something about whether or not *P**, which will
be the usual case, this longer set of conditions will permit the
fictionalist to move back and forth from modal language to talk of
possible worlds in the usual way: it is only when PW is silent about
the relevant issue that the corresponding modal claim suffers a lack
of truth-value. In modifying the central biconditional, it is true
that the fictionalist is sacrificing some of the elegance of the
original theory, though the unpleasant looking list of conditions can
be rewritten so that they have more of the appearance of a minor
alteration of the original:

Piff According to PW,P*, (unless PW is silent aboutP*, in which casePis truth-valueless).

This still has the feature that a disjunction may be true without
either of its disjuncts being true, and other features common to many
treatments of truth-value gaps, and it still has the feature that the
theory delivers definite answers of a sort for certain modal matters
(i.e. that *P* has no truth-value) when it might have seemed
that we imagined we were merely ignorant: it is still an approach with
many of the features of Rosen's amendment. It however lacks the most
objectionable feature possessed by Rosen's proposal of keeping the
biconditional intact and declaring that “According to PW
…” is gappy. Woodward 2012 offers a different treatment
that ensures indeterminacy of truth value in the cases where PW is
apparently silent about P*, a way he argues is more elegant than the
one presented here.

In any case, Rosen's incompleteness worry arises only for those
modal fictionalist theories which do indeed admit that the modal
fiction is silent on some relevant issues. Some are indeed likely to
(and Rosen's is one), but it should be remembered that this does
not seem to be an unavoidable feature of such theories. One could
attempt to specify enough about the content of the modal fiction so
that it settled, at least in principle, all of the relevant
issues. (It may be difficult to tell how they are settled, of course,
if the content of the fiction depends, e.g., on facts about the
arrangement of the actual world, but this is not a problem of
completeness, but only of modal epistemology). In particular, timid
fictionalists can stipulate the content of the modal fiction in terms
of the modal truths (so, e.g. the fiction is to represent that at
some world, *Q**, just in case possibly *Q*). This sort of specification
would only be circular if the status of the modal truths was to be
analysed in terms of the content of the fiction, but the timid
fictionalist has no such pretensions. While the timid
fictionalist's fiction may leave some questions unsettled (how
many indiscernible worlds there are, for example), the timid
fictionalist should be able to make the fiction determinate to the
extent that all of the correlates of modal claims are represented, by
brute stipulation if necessary. It may be harder for a strong modal
fictionalist, but it has not been shown to be impossible.

In summary, then, while Rosen's incompleteness concerns may well not give rise to the problems he alleges, there are difficulties (or at least departures from orthodoxy) which will be faced by fictions which are incomplete in the sorts of ways that, for instance, Rosen's candidate is.