Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof that 0 Falls Under Q

The proof that 0 falls under \(Q\) is relatively straightforward. We want to show:

\([\lambda y \, \mathit{Precedes}(y,\#[\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,y)])]0\)

By \(\lambda\)-Conversion, it suffices to show:

\(\mathit{Precedes}(0, \#[\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)])\)

So, by the definition of Predecessor, we have to show that there is a concept \(F\) and object \(x\) such that:

  1. \(Fx\)
  2. \(\#[\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)] = \#F\)
  3. \(0 = \#[\lambda u \, Fu\amp u\neq x]\)

We can demonstrate that there is an \(F\) and \(x\) for which (1), (2) and (3) hold if we pick \(F\) to be \([\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)]\) and pick \(x\) to be 0. We now establish (1), (2), and (3) for these choices.

To show that (1) holds, we have to show:

\([\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)]0\)

But we know, from the definition of \(\mathit{Precedes}^{+}\), that \(\mathit{Precedes}^{+}(0,0)\), So by \(\lambda\)-abstraction, we are done.

To show that (2) holds, we need do no work, since our choice of \(F\) requires us to show:

\(\#[\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)] = \#[\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)],\)

which we know by the logic of identity.

To show (3) holds, we need to show:

\(0 = [\lambda u \, [\lambda z \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(z,0)]u\amp u\neq 0]\)

But, by applying \(\lambda\)-Conversion, we have to show:

(A)  \(0 = \#[\lambda u \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(u,0)\amp u\neq 0]\)

To show (A), it suffices to show the following, in virtue of the Lemma Concerning Zero (in our subsection on The Concept Natural Number in §4):

\(\neg\exists x ([\lambda u \, \mathit{Precedes}^{+}(u,0) \amp u\neq 0]x)\)

And by \(\lambda\)-Conversion, it suffices to show:

(B)  \(\neg\exists x (\mathit{Precedes}^{+}(x,0)\amp x\neq 0)\)

We establish (B) as follows.

When we established Theorem 2 (i.e., the fact that 0 is not the successor of any number), we proved that nothing precedes 0:

\(\neg\exists x \mathit{Precedes}(x,0)\)

From this, and Fact (4) about \(R^{*}\) (in the subsection on the Ancestral of \(R\), in §4), it follows that nothing ancestrally precedes 0:

\(\neg\exists x \mathit{Precedes}^{*}(x,0)\)

Now suppose (for reductio) the negation of (B); i.e, that there is some object, say a, such that \(\mathit{Precedes}^{+}(a,0)\) and \(a\neq 0\). Then, by definition of \(\mathit{Precedes}^{+}\), it follows that either \(\mathit{Precedes}^{*}(a,0)\) or \(a = 0\). But since our reductio hypthesis includes that \(a\neq 0\), it must be that \(\mathit{Precedes}^{*}(a,0)\), which contradicts the fact displayed immediately above.

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Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

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