Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of Lemma Concerning Zero

Let \(P\) be an arbitrarily chosen concept. We want to show \(\#P = 0\equiv\neg\exists xPx\).

\((\rightarrow)\) Assume \(\#P = 0\). Then, by definition of \(0, \#P = \#[\lambda z \, z\neq z]\). So by Hume's Principle, \(P\) is equinumerous to \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\). So, by the definition of equinumerosity, there is an R that maps every object falling under \(P\) to a unique object falling under \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\) and vice versa. Suppose, for reductio, that \(\exists xPx\), say \(Pa\). Then there is an object, say \(b\), such that \(Rab\) and \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]b\). But, then, by \(\lambda\)-Conversion, \(b\) is not self-identical, which contradicts the laws of identity.

\((\leftarrow)\) Suppose \(\neg\exists xPx\). Now as we have seen, the laws of identity guarantee that no object falls under the concept \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\). But then any relation you please bears witness to the fact that \(P\) is equinumerous with \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\). For let \(R\) be some arbitrary relation. Then (a) every object falling under P bears R to a unique object falling under \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\) (since there are no objects falling under \(P\) ), and (b) every object falling under \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\) is such that there is a unique object falling under \(P\) that bears \(R\) to it (since there are no objects exemplifying \([\lambda z \, z\neq z])\). Since \(P\) is therefore equinumerous with \([\lambda z \, z\neq z]\), it follows by Hume's Principle, that \(\#[\lambda z \, z\neq z] = \#P\). But, then, by definition, \(0 = \#P\).

Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <zalta@stanford.edu>

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