Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of the General Principle of Induction

Assume the antecedent of the principle, eliminating the defined notation for \(\mathit{HerOn}(F,{}^{a}R^{+})\):

\(Pa\amp \forall x,y(R^{+}(a,x)\amp R^{+}(a,y)\amp Rxy\rightarrow (Px\rightarrow Py))\)

We want to show, for an arbitrary object \(b\), that if \(R ^{+}(a,b)\) then \(Pb\). So assume \(R^{+}(a,b)\). To show \(Pb\), we appeal to Fact (7) about \(R^{+}\) (in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4):

\(Fx\amp R^{+}(x,y)\amp \mathit{Her}(F,R)\rightarrow Fy\)

Instantiate the variable \(F\) in this Fact to the property \([\lambda z \, R^{+}(a,z)\amp Pz]\) (that there is such a property is guaranteed by the Comprehension Principle for Relations), and instantiate the variables \(x\) and \(y\) to the objects \(a\) and \(b\), respectively. The result (after applying \(\lambda\)-Conversion) is therefore something that we have established as true:

\(R^{+}(a,a)\amp Pa\amp R^{+}(a,b)\amp \mathit{Her}([\lambda z \, R^{+}(a,z)\amp Pz], R)\rightarrow\)
    \(R^{+}(a,b)\amp Pb\)

So if we can establish the antecedent of this fact, we establish \(Pb\). But we know that the first conjunct is true, by the definition of \(R^{+}\). We know the second conjunct is true, by assumption. We know that the third conjunct is true, by further assumption. So if we can establish:

\(\mathit{Her}([\lambda z \, R^{+}(a,z)\amp Pz], R)\),

we are done. But, by the definition of heredity, this just means:

\(\forall x,y[Rxy\rightarrow ((R^{+}(a,x)\amp Px) \rightarrow (R^{+}(a,y)\amp Py))]\).

To prove this claim, we assume \(Rxy\) and \(R^{+}(a,x)\amp Px\) (to show \(R^{+}(a,y)\amp Py\)). But from the facts that \(R^{+}(a,x)\) and \(Rxy\), it follows from Fact (3) about \(R^{+}\) (in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral) that \(R^{*}(a,y)\). This implies \(R^{+}(a,y)\), by the definition of \(R^{+}\). But since we now have \(R^{+}(a,x), R^{+}(a,y), Rxy\), and \(Px\), it follows from the first assumption in the proof that \(Py\).

Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free