Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of Hume's Principle from Basic Law V—Grundgesetze-Style

[Note: We use \(\epsilon F\) to denote the extension of the concept \(F\).]

Let \(P,Q\) be arbitrarily chosen concepts. We want to show:

\(\#P\eqclose \#Q \equiv P\apprxclose Q\)

\((\rightarrow)\) Assume \(\#P = \#Q\) (to show: \(P\approx Q\)). Note that since \(P\approx P\) (Fact 2, subsection on Equinumerosity), we know by the Lemma for Hume's Principle that \(\epsilon P\in \#P\). But then, by identity substitution, \(\epsilon P\in\#Q\). So, again by the Lemma for Hume's Principle, \(P\approx Q\).

\((\leftarrow)\) Assume \(P\approx Q\) (to show: \(\#P = \#Q\)). By definition of \(\#\), we have to show \(\epsilon P^{\approx} = \epsilon Q^{\approx}\). So, by Basic Law V, we have to show \(\forall x(P^{\approx}x\equiv Q^{\approx}x)\). We pick an arbitrary object \(b\) (to show: \(P^{\approx}b \equiv Q^{\approx}b\)).

\((\rightarrow)\) Assume \(P^{\approx}b\). Then, by definition of \(P^{\approx}\) and \(\lambda\)-Conversion, \(\exists H(b\eqclose \epsilon H \amp H \apprxclose P)\). Let \(R\) be an arbitrary such concept; so \(b\eqclose \epsilon R\amp R\apprxclose P\). From the second conjunct and our initial hypothesis, it follows (by the transitivity of equinumerosity) that \(R\apprxclose Q\). So, reassembling what we know, it follows that \(b\eqclose \epsilon R\amp R\apprxclose Q\). By existential generalization, it follows that \(\exists H(b\eqclose \epsilon H \amp H \apprxclose Q)\). So by \(\lambda\)-Conversion,

\([\lambda x \, \exists H(x\eqclose \epsilon H\amp H\apprxclose Q)]b\)

It follows from this, by definition of \(Q^{\approx}\), that \(Q^{\approx}b\).

\((\leftarrow)\) (Exercise)

Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

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