Notes to Gottlob Frege

1. Kreiser 1984 reproduces the record of the books Frege borrowed during these years. There we find that Frege checked out, among other texts, E.K. Dühring, Kritische Geschichte der allgemeinen Prinzipien der Mechanik (Berlin, 1873); O. Schlömilch, Übungsbuch zum Studium der höheren Analysis (Leipzig, 1868), A. Clebsch, Vorlesungen über Geometrie (Leipzig, 1876), A. Clebsch and P. Gordan, Theorie der Abelschen Funktionen (Leipzig, 1868), and A. Enneper, Elliptische Funktionen (Halle, 1876).

It should be mentioned that Kreiser 2001 (in German) is a comprehensive biography, with many fascinating details about Frege’s life.

2. In Kratzsch 1979 (537–543), we find what looks like a complete list of all the lectures Frege advertised at Jena from 1874 to 1918. Kreiser (1984, 21) cites the courses for the years 1874 to 1878 as recorded in the University of Jena Bursar’s Office. He cites Universitätsarchiv Jena, Rechnungs-Manual bei der academischen Quästur zu Jena (1874 bis 1884, G. I. Nr. 210 bis 280).

3. Wilson (1992, footnote 21), characterized Frege’s Habilitation thesis as demonstrating “how a variety of unlikely mathematical domains could be coded into complex numbers in such a way that standard analytic techniques prove sound over the encoded domain.” In the Postscript to the reprint of Wilson 1992 (in Demopoulos 1995, 149–159) Wilson investigates the early interest Frege took in independence from intuition, as this is evidenced by the work in his Habilitationsschrift.

4. Weierstrass (1872) describes the following function:

\( f(x) = \sum\limits_{n\!=\! 0}^{\infty} b^n \cos (a^n\pi x) \)

where \(0 < b < 1\), and \(a\) is a positive odd integer, and \(ab > 1 + (3/2)\pi \).

5. Though Frege’s 1892a essay ‘Über Sinn und Bedeutung’ is often translated as ‘On Sense and Reference’, I have used the word ‘denotation’ instead of ‘reference’ because the latter, not the former, is also used to indicate what a person does with language, e.g., as in “John used the term … to refer to …” or “John referred to …”. But the notion Frege is getting at with the German Bedeutung is only a relation between an expression and an object, and doesn’t involve humans as a relatum.

6. Given our discussion at the end of Section 2.2, in which we pointed out that for Frege, the subject and direct object of a sentence are on a logical par, there is an equally good alternative theoretical description of the denotation of the sentence ‘John loves Mary’. That is, we may equally well suppose \(d[L]\) maps \(d[j]\) to the function ‘John loves ( )’, and refer to this latter function semantically as \(d[jL]\). Then, \(d[jL]\) would map \(d[m]\) to the truth-value that serves as the denotation of the sentence ‘John loves Mary’, namely, \(d[jLm]\). Logically speaking, this analysis is equivalent to the one in the text, and serves to show how the subject and direct object of the sentence are on a logical par, in contrast to Aristotelian logic.

7. A similar point to that made in the previous footnote applies here. We could, alternatively, suppose \(s[L]\) maps \(s[j]\) to \(s[jL]\), and that this latter function maps \(s[m]\) to the sense of the whole sentence, namely, \(s[jLm]\).

Copyright © 2019 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free