Notes to Fundamentality

1. This issue is covered in the separate entry on metaphysical grounding; see section 3 on the logical form of grounding statements.

2. For details of Aristotle’s view, see Corkum 2013. For a contemporary take, see, e.g., Nolan 2011 and Paul 2013. See also the articles in Tahko 2012 and the separate entry on categories. There have been many attempts to define the category of substance in terms of ontological independence. For discussion, see Lowe 1998; Correia 2005; Schnieder 2006, and the separate entry on substance.

3. The discussion regarding the formal properties of grounding has been particularly active. Partly because of this debate, some are doubtful that the notion of grounding (or fundamentality) can be put to good use at all (see, e.g., Daly 2012; Wilson 2014; Koslicki 2015; Kovacs 2017; Miller & Norton 2017; Lipman forthcoming). Some of these more skeptical criticisms apply only to the notion of grounding rather than ontological dependence relations or metaphysical determination relations other than grounding. A different kind of deflationary approach towards fundamentality is the view that fundamentality is merely an expressive device, something we may use to express our commitments about what there is (see Williams 2010; von Solodkoff & Woodward 2013). We will bring these issues up again where relevant, but the interested reader should refer to the extensive literature. In addition to the above, see especially the helpful table in Bliss and Priest (2018b: sec. 2) See also Jenkins 2011; Fine 2012; Litland 2013; Raven 2013; Tahko 2013; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2015; Barnes 2018; Bliss 2018.

4. Even if naturalness on its own would not be able to capture everything that philosophers typically wish to capture with the notion of fundamentality, it could perhaps be supplemented with other notions. For instance, Bricker has suggested that “ontological determination”, a notion that we may associate with fundamentality, could be analyzed in terms of supervenience and naturalness (Bricker 2006: 255, 271) See also Plate (2016) for an alternative account in terms of “logically simple” attributes.

5. Not everyone would agree that all these relations are to be understood as “dependence” relations, given that, e.g., “realization” is a much looser relation than some of the others—think of multiple realizability (see Baysan 2015 for discussion on realization relations). Regardless, we will continue to use the broad, somewhat loose sense of “metaphysical dependence” in what follows.

6. There is a further question about whether this existential dependence is rigid or generic, i.e., whether one quark depends on a specific quark or just there being some quark. The separate entry on ontological dependence defines rigid existential dependence in terms of necessitation as follows: x depends rigidly for its existence upon \(y =_{df}\) Necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

7. Another potentially problematic result concerns emergent entities (see the entry on emergent properties). Emergent entities may be understood, for instance, as entities having causal powers over and above their constituents’ causal powers. More to the point, emergent entities have been traditionally characterized as being both fundamental and dependent (e.g., by the British Emergentists, see McLaughlin 2008). This is also a starting point in contemporary metaphysics (Barnes 2012, Wilson 2015). Clearly, emergent yet independent entities would directly violate (AI). So, according to (AI), no ontologically emergent entity could be fundamental and this is a controversial result (see also Pearson 2018 for a reply to Barnes 2012).

8. Sometimes the notion of fundamentality is defined explicitly in terms of explanation, i.e., a fact is fundamental if and only if it is not explained by any other fact. We might be able to translate (RI) in such a way that it applies to this idea as well. For further discussion on the link between fundamentality, grounding, and explanation, see deRosset 2010, 2013; Jenkins 2013; Litland 2015; Glazier 2016; Jansson 2016; Thompson 2016b, 2018; and Shaheen 2016.

9. One of Schaffer’s arguments in favor of priority monism takes advantage of this, drawing on the incompatibility between the view that mereological dependence runs from the larger to the smaller, and the possibility of gunk, i.e., the view that everything has a proper part (Schaffer 2010a: 61ff.).

10. This challenge emerges for any view that holds that there is a privileged subset of metaphysical dependence relations that are relevant to fundamentality, such as Bennett’s building relations. These include at least the following six relations: composition, constitution, set formation, realization, microbased determination, and grounding. Bennett’s approach is of special interest here, because she attempts to address the unification challenge (Bennett 2017: 18ff.). Her proposed answer is that since there is at least a family resemblance between the various building relations, we need an explanation for this and Bennett’s preferred approach is that the family of building relations is unified via a natural resemblance class. This raises some more general problems for determining what resemblance amounts to (Bennett 2017: Ch. 3). Interested readers are also invited to consult the entry on nominalism in metaphysics, as the notion of resemblance has an important role in this discussion (see also Benovsky 2013).

11. Koslicki is generally critical of grounding but argues that we should recognize different dimensions of relative fundamentality (including cases where x is less fundamental than y if we gain only a partial perspective on y by focusing on x (abstraction); x is “constructed” out of y, together with other entities (construction); x is essentially the result of a creative act involving an intentional agent, y (artificiality); and if x exhibits a lower degree of unity than y (disunity); see Koslicki 2015: 336–8).

The possibility of variation in the formal properties of ground has prompted many to doubt that it is strongly unified (Koslicki 2012, 2015; M. Cameron 2014; Wilson 2014). This debate is on-going.

12. Bennett (2017: Ch. 2.4) resists what she calls “generalist monism” about building—a view equivalent to a strongly unified conception of grounding, which takes it to be a singular and univocal notion (Tahko 2015: 118ff.). See also Bertrand 2017 for a defense of building “singularism” and Berker forthcoming for a defense of a unified notion of ground.

13. One further understanding of fundamentality that could be linked to (RI-one) is the idea that the notion of truthmaking could be definitive of fundamentality (see the separate entry on truthmakers, and for the connection to fundamentality, see Sider 2011: Chs. 8.4, 8.5; Fisher 2016). As Sider (2011: 157) puts it, “The only fundamental facts, on this view, are certain singular existential facts, facts of the form “x exists”, where x is a truthmaker”. The nonfundamental truths would then be made true by these truthmakers. Sider himself abandons this alternative partly because it violates purity, the principle according to which fundamental truths involve only fundamental notions (but see Fisher 2016 for a defense of the view). One might also attempt to develop on this idea by invoking the notion of a minimal truthmaker, familiar from Armstrong: “If T is a minimal truthmaker for p, then you cannot subtract anything from T and the remainder still be a truthmaker for p” (Armstrong 2004: 19–20). Giving a complete list of such minimal truthmakers could be understood as one way of describing the fundamental base (on minimal truthmakers, see Schaffer 2010b; Fisher 2015; O’Conaill & Tahko 2016; Tahko 2018; see also Williams 2010).

14. We could also define (CMB) negatively in such a way that the fundamental entities are those that are not determined by anything else. However, this would effectively collapse (CMB) to another version of (RI) since not being determined by anything else is to be determination-independent, for want of a better term.

15. Accordingly, the sense in which the basis is complete is not sufficiently captured in terms of modal completeness, the idea that the complete set of the fundamental entities (metaphysically) necessitates everything else and hence everything else existentially depends on the fundamental entities. We saw already in section 1.1 that modal dependence appears to be too coarse-grained to capture the sense of fundamentality that we are after. Bennett (2017: 108–109) puts forward some further reasons to rule out modal completeness.

16. The complete set is of course a singular entity, but this is simply a convenient way to refer to the plurality captured by the complete set. Moreover, on a monistic view, the commitment to a plural underpinning would have to be dropped, but by using the idea of a complete minimal set, it is straightforward to interpret (CMB) in such a way that monism may be accommodated as well.

In the context of grounding, Dasgupta (2014b) has entertained the idea that ground is irreducibly plural. Recent work on the logic of “many-many” grounding develops this idea (Litland 2016a). The terminology here is still developing though, as Litland (2018) now recommends the notion of bicollectiveness whereby grounding is bicollective if it is left-collective (several truths collectively ground one truth) and right-collective (one truth grounds some plurality of truths taken together but not any individual truth in that plurality). The central idea here is that what is grounded could (irreducibly) be a collection of truths. This contrasts with the usual understanding of grounding being many-one or one-one.

17. Some of the discussion on the notion of a minimal supervenience base is closely related (Sider 1996: 21; Eddon 2013). Sider (2011: 259–260) discusses a similar condition which he labels “nonredundancy”. Relevant examples include relations and their converses, such as “earlier” and “later”, as well as the fact that several subsets of the logical operators are functionally complete (e.g., conjunction and negation, or the Sheffer stroke). One thing we must weigh in these cases is the potential theoretical cost of insisting on uniqueness. Sider seems to think that redundancy may be acceptable in such cases.

18. Some of these issues are helpfully discussed by Bennett, who compares the merits of (her versions) of (CMB) and (RI), ultimately siding with (RI) (Bennett 2017: Chs. 5.4, 5.6).

19. Note that this line of argument does go against the view that Schaffer (2010b; see also R. Cameron 2008) himself has defended, namely, that there must be a “ground of being” and hence a fundamental level is needed to get the priority ordering started. We will return to this issue when discussing metaphysical foundationalism and metaphysical infinitism in sections 3 and 4.

20. The set-theoretic sense is also what Raven (2016: 614) appears to have in mind, although he remains neutral about the well-foundedness of ground, whereas Bennett (2017: Ch. 5.5) is explicitly neutral about the well-foundedness of her notion of building.

21. The situation is somewhat unfortunate, because philosophers have used the notion “well-foundedness” in slightly different senses. Rabin & Rabern (2016: 369) suspect that it may be too late to change terminology at this point. Instead, they hope that by clarifying the different senses of well-foundedness available we can avoid further confusion. Accordingly, both Dixon and Rabin & Rabern go on to suggest that there is a distinct, ground-theoretic sense of well-foundedness that may capture the foundationalist intuition that many (or at least some) people have had in mind. Bohn (2018: 168) calls this metaphysical well-foundedness. This notion of metaphysical well-foundedness is more fine-grained and weaker than the standard set-theoretic sense. However, it would be best to retain the standard, set-theoretic sense of “well-foundedness” and we will do so in this entry. To capture the weaker constraint, we use the notion of metaphysical foundation.

22. The examples of such metaphysically well-founded yet infinite and unbounded chains discussed by Dixon and Rabin & Rabern (see also Bliss 2013) are quite abstract and require some assumptions that are not entirely uncontroversial. For instance, they rely on a very fine-grained conception of facts, infinitary disjunctions, and the overdetermination of grounds (but see Litland 2016b for an attempt at constructing a less controversial example).

23. For another attempt, see Trogdon (2018b), who examines the idea that grounded entities “inherit” their reality from their grounds (originating in Schaffer 2016b). Raven (2016: 608) puts forward a trilemma whereby (i) necessarily, something is fundamental and (ii) a strong sense of well-foundedness (akin to the set-theoretic sense) is associated with the notion of “foundational”, so something is fundamental only if it is well-founded in the strong, set-theoretic sense. Further, Raven thinks that it’s possible that (iii) nothing is foundational in this strong sense (a view he calls “abyssalism”). So, metaphysical foundationalism defined in terms of Raven’s “foundationalism” seems to lead us to a contradiction. Raven doesn’t want to give up metaphysical foundationalism, so he rejects the idea that foundationalism needs to be defined in terms of the strong sense of well-foundedness and attempts to define a version of metaphysical foundationalism compatible with abyssalism.

24. There is an important connection between this idea and one that we encountered earlier in section 1.4. The earlier idea came up in relation to Wilson (2016: 196ff.), who attempts to find a way to fix the order of priority in the (seeming) absence of a fundamental level. Wilson considers the possibility of something acting as the fundamental level (in terms of convergence to a limit, cf. Wilson 2016: 197; Montero 2006: 179; Morganti 2015: 562). This is in fact very close to Raven’s idea of persistence, which Raven (2016: 613fn6) also associates with Tahko’s (2014) discussion of boring infinite descent, where the same structure repeats infinitely (cf. Schaffer 2003: 505, 510; see also Brown & Ladyman 2009: 30–31).

25. For instance, Heil (2012: 38 ff.) suggests that ruling out infinite complexity is a necessary constraint for scientific theorizing; this leads him to deny actual infinities altogether (see also Schrenk 2009).

26. Morganti’s (2014, 2015) and Wilson’s (2016) discussion of the idea of convergence to a limit, which we encountered in section 1.4, may be relevant here. The difficulty with this idea is to come up with a more concrete example than a sequence of numbers such as 1/2, 1/3, 1/4 … approaching (but never reaching) zero at the limit (Wilson 2016: 197 considers the possibility of a “thermodynamic limit”). Whether the idea of convergence to a limit satisfies (MF) is also debatable. Is it plausible that the regulative role of the limit in this type of scenario is enough to satisfy the intuitive sense of having a foundation that we have tried to capture in previous sections? We will leave this issue open for future research.

27. We omit a more detailed discussion, but see, e.g., Sider 1993; Zimmerman 1996; Williams 2006; Bohn 2009, 2012; Cotnoir 2013, 2014; Shiver 2015; Tallant 2013; Giberman 2015; and the separate entry on mereology.

Copyright © 2018 by
Tuomas E. Tahko <>

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