Notes to Evolutionary Game Theory

1. An earlier, logically equivalent, definition of an evolutionarily stable strategy can be found in the Maynard Smith and Price paper “The Logic of Animal Conflict”, Nature, vol. 246, pp. 15–18 (1973). In the introduction to his 1972 collection of essays entitled On Evolution, Maynard Smith gives credit to George Price for the idea: “I would probably not have had the idea for this essay if I had not seen an unpublished manuscript on the evolution of fighting by Dr George Price […] Unfortunately, Dr Price is better at having ideas than at publishing them. The best I can do therefore is acknowledge that if there is anything in the idea, the credit should go to Dr Price and not to me.”

2. In a mixed strategy, a player assigns a probability to each pure strategy, and chooses which strategy to play using a randomization device. For the Hawk-Dove game, one mixed strategy would assign equal probabilities to playing Hawk or Dove, and decide which to play in a given case by flipping a fair coin.

3. Sandholm's book is specifically entitled that in order to pay homage to Josef Hofbauer's influential book Evolutionary Games and Population Dynamics, first published in 1998. We bring this point to the reader's attention, as it creates the potential for accidental confusion.

4. In Nowak and May’s model, each individual on the lattice plays the prisoner’s dilemma with their eight nearest neighbors. At the end of each game round, an individual compares her score with that of her neighbors. If one of her neighbors earned a higher score, that player will adopt the strategy used by her most successful neighbor (presumably using some kind of randomization process to break ties). If no neighbor earned a higher score, that player will continue using the same strategy for the next round of play. All individuals switch strategies at the same time, and all have the same payoff structure.

5. Of course, Nowak and May were speaking somewhat loosely when they referred to this behavior as “chaotic.” Since there are only finitely many states of the population, it must be the case that this dynamical system will eventually settle into a cycle (although it may not repeat itself for a very long time). However, the point is clear enough: in this particular case we are incapable of predicting the state of the model after \(N\) generations (for a large \(N)\) without running the model for that length of time. In both of the previous cases, it is easy to predict the future state of the population given its current state.

6. Both agents would clearly do better if both agents elected to cooperate, but the point where both individuals choose cooperate is not a Nash equilibrium: if both agents initially cooperate, the first individual can increase her payoff by choosing to defect (and vice versa).

7. This is a problem only when we consider games other than two-person zero sum games, since all Nash equilibria in these sort of games have equivalent payoffs and are interchangable.

8. One “beauty pageant” game is as follows: a group of subjects is told to choose any number in the interval [0,100]. The person whose choice is closest to half of the mean of the group wins the game. Assuming that the rules of the game and the rationality of the players are common knowledge, the predicted outcome of the game is that all members of the group choose 0. Since 50 is the largest possible winning choice (if each subject chose 100, half of the group mean would be 50), no rational individual would choose a number more than 50. However, since no rational individual would choose a number greater than 50, and all subjects know this, no subject will choose a number greater than 25. In the limit, all players will converge upon 0. Tests with real human subjects (other than game theorists or people who have been exposed to this game before) demonstrate that the modal offer is significantly greater than zero. If the game is repeated, though, subjects do approach the game theoretic prediction.

9. The diagrams appearing in Figure 10 illustrate the basins of attraction for evolutionary dynamics when only three strategies are present. They take advantage of the fact that, with only three strategies, the vector \(\mathbf{p} = \langle p_1, p_2, p_3\rangle\) listing the frequencies of strategies 1, 2, and 3 in the population can be interpreted as a point in three-dimensional Euclidean space. Because each of the \(p_i\) are between 0 and 1, the corresponding point is in the first octant and lies on the plane described by the equation \(x + y + z = 1\). The triangle is simply the portion of that plane confined to the first octant, looked at from a vantage point where one is staring straight at it.

Given an initial condition \(\mathbf{p}\), a solution to the replicator dynamics is a trajectory confined to the first octant, lying on the surface of the plane, which starts at the point \(\mathbf{p}\). If the trajectory converges to one of the vertices of the triangle, that means that the population converges to a state where everyone uses the same strategy. (If the trajectory converges to a point on the edge of the triangle, that means the population converged to a state where there is a stable mix of two strategies in the population. This can be seen in Figure 10(a).) Thus, looking at the overall pattern of flows in the triangle shows how often a particular outcome is likely to come about: the greater the area of the triangle occupied by flows which converge to the outcome All Demand 5, the more likely that the outcome All Demand 5 is a product of evolution.

10. It is worth noting that Lewis appreciated that the type of language which could be explained as a product of sender-receiver games was only a “rudimentary language” (Lewis, 1969, pg. 160) for several reasons. The most important of these being: such languages have only a finite number of sentences, there was no possibility of “idle conversation” (ibid.), there were not enough moods, and, finally, there was no ambiguity or indexicality in the resulting signalling systems. It is interesting to note that Lewis thought that the absence of the possibility of idle conversation was a shortcoming worth noting, for some authors have recently argued that the possibility of idle conversation is the real reason evolution endowed us with language. This line of argument is advanced by Jean-Louis Dessalles in his book Why We Talk: The Evolutionary Origins of Language:

If evolution endowed us with language and the cognitive means associated with it, it was not for the purpose of speculating about the world into which we have been brought, of collaborating on the building of bridges or rockets or even devising systems of mathematics. It was so that we could chat. (Dessalles, 2007, pg. 269)

11. However, see Skyrms (forthcoming), for a discussion of sender-receiver games played by multiple senders and multiple receivers.

12. It is important to remember that, in Convention, Lewis assumed that the roles of Sender and Receiver were permanently assigned to individuals, even though he did not explicitly state this. Some of the formal results he established are clearly false in the case where roles are not permanently assigned. For example, on page 133 he writes: “In a signaling problem with \(m\) states of affairs and \(n\) signals, there are \(n! \frasl (n - m)!\) signaling systems.” In the problem considered here, there are two states of the world, so \(m = 2\), and there are two signals, so \(n = 2\). Lewis’s formula, in this case, says that there should be only 2 signaling systems, but as we have seen there are four.

13. The exception occurs when there are exactly equal proportions of the strategies (Sender 2, Receiver 2) and (Sender 3, Receiver 3). These points lie on a plane dividing the state space in half. For initial conditions lying on this plane, the replicator dynamics does not lead the population to converge to a single signaling system.

14. Note that these diagrams are interpreted very differently from the diagrams in Figure 10. Here, there are four possible strategies. Let \(p_i\) denote the proportion of the population following strategy \(i\). Because we know that \(p_1 + p_2 + p_3 + p_4 = 1\), the number of degrees of freedom in selecting a population state is three (since fixing the proportion of the population that follow three strategies determines the proportion of the population following the remaining one). Thus, the set of possible population states corresponds exactly to the set of points in the region which satisfy the inequality \(0 \le p_1 + p_2 + p_3 \le 1\). The vertices of the tetrahedron correspond to states where everyone in the population employs the same strategy. An initial state of the population corresponds to a point in that three-dimensional region, and a solution to the replicator dynamics for the sender-receiver game, using that point as the initial state, is almost always a trajectory leading away from that point. Figure 11 illustrates the trajectories for 125 randomly selected initial conditions.

15. In the Hawk-Dove game discussed in section 2, the quantities in the payoff matrix represent the change in Darwinian fitness of the two individuals.

16. A more appropriate name would be “Hume’s fallacy.” Moore’s “naturalistic fallacy” discussed in Principia Ethica differs significantly from the mistaken inference of an ought-statement from an is-statement. Using the same label for such different fallacies invites confusion.

Copyright © 2021 by
J. McKenzie Alexander <>

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